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Notes to Time Travel and Modern Physics

[1.] Multiple collisions are handled in the obvious way by continuity considerations: just continue straight lines through the collision point and identify which particle is which by their ordering in space.

[2.] The dynamics here is radically non-time-reversible. Indeed, the dynamics is deterministic in the future direction but not in the past direction.

[3.] One might hope that
fixed point theorems can be used to prove the existence of solutions
in this type of cases too. Consider, for instance, a fixed initial
state of motion I of the ball. Then consider all the possible
velocities and locations and times
<*v*,*x*,*t*> at which such a ball could
enter mouth 1 of the wormhole. Each such triple
<*v*,*x*,*t*> will determine the
trajectory of that ball out of mouth 2. One can then look at the
continuation of the trajectory from state I and that from state s,
and see whether these trajectories collide. Then one can see for each
possible triple
<*v*,*x*,*t*> whether the ball that
starts in state I will be collided into mouth 1, and if it is, with
which speed at what location and at which time this will occur. Thus
given state I, each triple
<*v*,*x*,*t*> maps onto another triple
<*v*,*x*,*t*>.
One might then suggest appealing to a fixed point theorem to argue
that there must be a solution for each initial state I. However, in
the first place the set of possible speeds and times are open
sets. And in the second place there can be multiple wormhole
traversals. Thus the relevant total state-space of wormhole mouth
crossings consists of discretely many completely disconnected
state-spaces (with increasing numbers of dimensions). So standard
fixed point theorems do not apply directly. It should be noted that
the results that have been achieved regarding this case do make use
of fixed points theorems quite extensively. But their application is
limited to certain sub-problems, and do not yield a fully general
proof of the lack of constraints for arbitrary I.

[4.]
This argument, especially the second illustration of it, is similar
to the one in Horwich 1987, p 124-128. However, we do not share
Horwich's view that it only tells against time travel of humans into
their local past.

Frank Arntzeniusarntzeni@rci.rutgers.edu |
Tim Maudlinmaudlin@rci.rutgers.edu |

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy