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Sorites Paradox

The sorites paradox is the name given to a class of paradoxical arguments, also known as little-by-little arguments, which arise as a result of the indeterminacy surrounding limits of application of the predicates involved. For example the concept of a heap appears to lack sharp boundaries and, as a consequence of the subsequent indeterminacy surrounding the extension of the predicate ‘is a heap’, no one grain of wheat can be identified as making the difference between being a heap and not being a heap. Given then that one grain of wheat does not make a heap, it would seem to follow that two do not, thus three do not, and so on. In the end it would appear that no amount of wheat can make a heap. We are faced with paradox since from apparently true premises by seemingly uncontroversial reasoning we arrive at an apparently false conclusion.

This phenomenon at the heart of the paradoxes is now recognised as the phenomenon of vagueness. Once identified, vagueness can be seen to be a feature of syntactic categories other than predicates, nonetheless one speaks primarily of the soriticality of predicates. Names, adjectives, adverbs and so on are only susceptible to paradoxical sorites reasoning in a derivative sense.

Sorites arguments of the paradoxical form are to be distinguished from multi-premise syllogisms (polysyllogisms) which are sometimes also referred to as sorites arguments. Whilst both polysyllogisms and sorites paradoxes are chain-arguments, the former need not be paradoxical in nature and the latter need not be syllogistic in form.

1. The Sorites In History

The name ‘sorites’ derives from the Greek word soros (meaning ‘heap’) and originally referred, not to a paradox, but rather to a puzzle known as The Heap: Would you describe a single grain of wheat as a heap? No. Would you describe two grains of wheat as a heap? No. … You must admit the presence of a heap sooner or later, so where do you draw the line?

It was one of a series of puzzles attributed to the Megarian logician Eubulides of Miletus. Also included were:

The Liar: A man says that he is lying. Is what he says true or false?

The Hooded Man: You say that you know your brother. Yet that man who just came in with his head covered is your brother and you did not know him.

The Bald Man: Would you describe a man with one hair on his head as bald? Yes. Would you describe a man with two hairs on his head as bald? Yes. … You must refrain from describing a man with ten thousand hairs on his head as bald, so where do you draw the line?

This last puzzle, presented as a series of questions about the application of the predicate ‘is bald’, was originally known as the falakros puzzle. It was seen to have the same form as the Heap and all such puzzles became collectively known as sorites puzzles.

It is not known whether Eubulides actually invented the sorites puzzles. Some scholars have attempted to trace its origins back to Zeno of Elea however the evidence seems to point to Eubulides as the first to employ the sorites. Nor is it known just what motives Eubulides may have had for presenting this puzzle. It was, however, employed by later Greek philosophers to attack various positions. Most notably by the Sceptics against the Stoics' claims to knowledge.

These puzzles of antiquity are now more usually described as paradoxes. Though the conundrum can be presented informally as a series of questions whose puzzling nature gives it dialectical force it can be, and was, presented as a formal argument having logical structure. The following argument form of the sorites was common:

1 grain of wheat does not make a heap.
If 1 grain of wheat does not make a heap then 2 grains of wheat do not.
If 2 grains of wheat do not make a heap then 3 grains do not.

If 9,999 grains of wheat do not make a heap then 10,000 do not.
10,000 grains of wheat do not make a heap.
The argument certainly seems to be valid, employing only modus ponens and cut (enabling the chaining together of each sub-argument which results from a single application of modus ponens). These rules of inference are endorsed by both Stoic logic and modern classical logic.

Moreover its premises appear true. Some Stoic presentations of the argument recast it in a form which replaced all the conditionals, ‘If A then B’, with ‘Not(A and not-B)’ to stress that the conditional should not be thought of as being a strong one, but rather the weak Philonian conditional (the modern material conditional) according to which ‘If A then B’ was equivalent to ‘Not(A and not-B)’. Such emphasis was deemed necessary since there was a great deal of debate in Stoic logic regarding the correct analysis for the conditional. In thus judging that a connective as weak as the Philonian conditional underpinned this form of the paradox they were forestalling resolutions of the paradox that denied the truth of the conditionals based on a strong reading of them. This interpretation then presents the argument in its strongest form since the validity of modus ponens seems assured whilst the premises are construed so weakly as to be difficult to deny. The difference of one grain would seem to be too small to make any difference in the application of the predicate; it is a difference so negligible as to make no apparent difference in the truth values of the respective antecedents and consequents.

Yet the conclusion seems false. Thus paradox confronted the Stoics just as it does the modern classical logician. Nor are such paradoxes isolated conundrums. Innumerable sorites paradoxes can be expressed in this way. For example, one can present the puzzle of the Bald Man in this manner. Since a man with one hair on his head is bald and if a man with one is then a man with two is, so a man with two hairs on his head is bald. Again, if a man with two is then a man with three is, so a man with three hairs on his head is bald, and so on. So a man with ten thousand hairs on his head is bald yet we rightly feel that such men are hirsute, i.e. not bald. Indeed, it seems that almost any vague predicate admits of such a sorites paradox and vague predicates are ubiquitous.

As presented, the paradox of the Heap and the Bald Man proceed by addition (of grains of wheat and hairs on the head respectively). Alternatively though, one might proceed in reverse, by subtraction. If one is prepared to admit that ten thousand grains of sand do make a heap then would can argue that one grain of sand does since the removal of any one grain of sand cannot make the difference. Similarly, if one is prepared to admit a man with ten thousand hairs on his head is not bald, then one could prove that even with one hair on his head he is not bald since the removal of any one hair from the originally hirsute scalp cannot make the relevant difference. It was thus recognised even in antiquity that sorites arguments come in pairs: non-heap and heap; bald and hirsute; poor and rich; few and many; small and large; and so on. For every argument which proceeds by addition there is another reverse argument which proceeds by subtraction.

The paradox attracted little subsequent interest until the late nineteenth century when formal logic once again assumed a central role in philosophy. With the demise of ideal language doctrines in the latter half of the twentieth century interest in the vagaries of natural language and the sorites paradox in particular has greatly increased.

2. Its Paradoxical Forms

The common form of the sorites paradox presented for discussion in the literature is the form discussed above. Let ‘F’ represent the soritical predicate (e.g., ‘is bald’, or ‘does not make a heap’) and let the expression ‘ai’ (where i is a natural number) represent a subject expression in the series with regard to which ‘F’ is soritical (e.g., ‘a man with i hair(s) on his head’ or ‘i grain(s) of wheat’, depending on F). Then the sorites proceeds by way of a series of conditionals and can be schematically represented as follows:
Conditional Sorites

If Fa1 then Fa2
If Fa2 then Fa3

If Fai-1 then Fai
Fai                 (where i can be arbitrarily large)

Whether the argument is taken to proceed by addition or subtraction will depend on how one views the series.

Barnes (1982) states conditions under which any argument of this form is soritical. Initially, the series <a1,…,ai> must be ordered; for example, scalps ordered according to number of hairs, heaps ordered according to number of grains of wheat, and so on. Secondly, the predicate ‘F’ must satisfy the following three constraints: (i) it must appear true of a1, the first item in the series; (ii) it must appear false of ai, the last item in the series; and (iii) each adjacent pair in the series, an and an+1, must be sufficiently similar as to appear indiscriminable in respect of ‘F’ -- that is, both an and an+1 appear to satisfy ‘F’ or neither do. Under these conditions ‘F’ will be soritical relative to the series <a1,…,ai> and any argument of the above form using ‘F’ and <a1,…,ai> will be soritical.

In recent times the explanation of the fact that sorites arguments come in pairs has shifted from consideration of the sorites series itself to the predicate involved. It is now common to focus on the presence or absence of a negation in the predicate, noting the existence of both a positive form which bloats the predicate's extension and negative form which shrinks the predicate's extension. With the foregoing analysis of the conditions for sorites susceptibility it is easy to verify that ‘F’ will be soritical relative to <a1,…,ai> if and only if ‘not-F’ is soritical relative to <ai,…,a1>. Thus verifying that for every positive sorites there is an analogous negative variant.

The key feature of soritical predicates which drives the paradoxes, constraint (iii), is described in Wright (1975) as "tolerance" and is thought to arise as a result of the vagueness of the predicate involved. Predicates such as ‘is a heap’ or ‘is bald’ appear tolerant of sufficiently small changes in the relevant respects -- namely number of grains or number of hairs. The degree of change between adjacent members of that series relative to which ‘F’ is soritical would seem too small to make any difference to the application of the predicate ‘F’. Yet large changes in the relevant respects will make a difference, even though large changes are the accumulation of small ones which don't seem to make a difference. This is the very heart of the conundrum which has delighted and perplexed so many for so long.

Any resolution of the paradoxes is further complicated by the fact that they can be presented in a variety of forms and the problem they present can only be considered solved when all forms have been defused.

One variant replaces the set of conditional premises with a universally quantified premises. Let ‘n’ be a variable ranging over the natural numbers and let ‘foralln(…n…)’ assert that every number n satisfies the condition …n… . Further, let us represent the claim of the form "for all n, if Fan then Fan+1" as follows:

Then the sorites is now seen as proceeding by the inference pattern known as mathematical induction:
Mathematical Induction Sorites


So, for example, it is argued that since a man with 1 hair on his head is bald and since the addition of one hair cannot make the difference between being bald and not bald (for any number n, if a man with n hairs is bald then so is a man with n+1 hairs), then no matter what number n you choose, a man with n hairs on his head is bald.

Yet another form is a variant of this inductive form. Assume that it is not the case that for every n, a man with n hairs on his head is not bald, i.e., that for some number n, it is not the case that a man with n hairs on his head is bald. Then by the least number principle (equivalent to the principle of mathematical induction) there must be a least such number, say i+1, such that it is not the case that a man with i+1 hairs on his head is bald. Since a man with 1 hair on his head is bald it follows that i+1 must be greater than 1. So, there must be some number n (= i) such that a man with n hairs counts as bald whilst a man with n+1 does not. Thus it is argued that though a1 is bald, not every number n is such that an is bald, so there must be some point at which baldness ceases. Let ‘existsn(…n…)’ assert that some number n satisfies the condition …n… . Then we can represent the chain of reasoning just described as follows:

Line-drawing Sorites

existsn≥1(Fan & ~Fan+1)

Now obviously, given that sorites arguments have been presented in these three forms, "the sorites paradox" will not be solved by merely claiming, say, mathematical induction to be invalid for soritical predicates. All forms need to be addressed one way or another. One would hope to solve it, if at all, by revealing some general underlying fault common to all forms of the paradox. No such general solution could depend on the diagnosis of a fault peculiar to any one form. On the other hand, were no general solution available then "the sorites paradox" will only be solved when each of its forms separately have been rendered toothless. This piecemeal approach holds little attraction though. It is less economical than a unified approach, arguably less elegant, and would fail to come to grips with the underlying unifying phenomenon which is considered to give rise to the paradoxes, namely vagueness. A logic of vagueness, be it classical or otherwise, ought to be able to defuse all those paradoxes that have their source in this phenomenon.

3. Responses

The various responses to soritical reasoning can be most easily catalogued by focussing on that form most commonly discussed in the literature -- the conditional form. As with any paradox, four responses appear to be available. One might:
(1) deny that logic applies to soritical expressions.
According to this response the problem cannot legitimately be set up in the first place. On the other hand one might accept that the sorites paradox constitutes a legitimate argument to which logic applies and deny its soundness by:
(2) denying some premise(s),
(3) denying its validity.
Finally, seemingly as a last resort, one might embrace the paradox and
(4) accept it as sound.

3.1 Ideal Language Approaches

Committed as Frege and Russell were to ideal language doctrines, it is not surprising to find them pursuing response (1). A key attribute of the ideal language is its precision; the vagueness of natural language is a defect to be eliminated. Since soritical terms are vague, the elimination of vagueness will entail the elimination of soritical terms. They cannot then, as some theorists propose, be marshalled as a challenge to classical logic.

A modern variation on this response, promoted most notably by Quine, sees vagueness as an eliminable feature of natural language. The class of vague terms, including soritical predicates, can as a matter of fact be dispensed with. There is, perhaps, some cost to ordinary ways of talking, but a cost that is nonetheless worth paying for the simplicity it affords -- namely, our thereby being able to defend classical logic with what Quine describes as its "sweet simplicity".

However, with the demise of ideal language doctrines and subsequent restoration of respect for ordinary language, vagueness is increasingly considered less superficial than response (1) suggests. If logic is to have teeth it must be applicable to natural language as it stands. Soritical expressions are unavoidable and the paradox must be squarely faced.

Responses of type (2) do just this. Logic is seen as applicable to natural language, in particular the sorites paradox, but the conditional form of the argument is seen as proceeding from a faulty premise.

3.2 The Epistemic Theory

According to Williamson (1994) Stoic logicians pursued just such a route. Given their acceptance of the principle of bivalence and their presentation of the argument as invoking a material conditional, they blocked the sorites by claiming some one conditional to be false (since not true) and that there comes a point in any sorites series where the relevant predicate ceases to apply and its negation does. For example vague terms like ‘heap’ or ‘knowledge’, though soritical relative to an appropriately chosen series, are semantically determinate so, in spite of appearances to the contrary, there is a sharp cut-off point to their application. The inclination to validate all the premises of a sorites argument (along with the inference pattern employed, which the Stoics accepted) was to be explained via ignorance -- more exactly, the unknowable nature of the relevant sharp semantic boundary.

In this way the threat of wholesale scepticism urged by the Sceptics was met by the limited scepticism arising from our inability to know the precise boundaries to knowledge. "Nothing can be known" was rejected in favour of "The precise boundaries to knowledge itself cannot be known". This epistemological response has been elaborated on in Sorensen (1988) and Williamson (1994). Though soritical predicates are admittedly indeterminate in their extension the indeterminacy is not semantic. The conundrum presented by the sorites paradox is an epistemological one which in no way challenges classical semantics or logic.

Until recently such a solution was ruled out by definition. Vagueness was characterised as a semantic phenomenon whereby the apparent semantic indeterminacy surrounding a soritical term's extension was considered real. In the absence of any apparent barrier to knowledge of a soritical predicate's precise extension it was assumed that there was simply no precise extension to be known. The philosophical landscape has now changed. Williamson (1994) contains an impressive array of arguments defending an epistemological account of vagueness which, if successful, would make possible an epistemological solution to the sorites.

The key concern with the epistemological approach however is its counter intuitive nature. Even if such an analysis is possible, the indeterminacy surrounding the application of soritical terms is generally considered to be a semantic phenomenon. Once seen in this way, classical semantics appears in need of revision, and with it classical logic. In the second half of this century there have been a number of attempts to develop non-classical logics of vagueness, a major constraint being the provision of a solution to the sorites paradox. The extent of the proposed logical innovation varies.

3.3 Supervaluationism

In accord with a principle of least mutilation, Dummett (1975) and Fine (1975) adapt Van Fraassen's supervaluation semantics to the sorites paradox, and vagueness more generally, resulting in a non-bivalent logic which, initially at least, retains the classical consequence relation and classical laws whilst admitting truth value gaps. The challenge posed by the sorites paradox can, on this view, to be met by logical revision in the metatheory alone.

According to the semantic conception of vagueness, a vague predicate is characterised by the existence of border cases; that is, cases to which the predicate neither definitely applies nor definitely doesn't apply. If we define the positive extension as those objects to which the predicate definitely applies, the negative extension as those to which the predicate definitely does not apply, and any remaining border cases as the penumbra, then vague predicates are characterised by their having a penumbra.

Given a vague predicate, for example ‘heap’, we can then stipulate a sharpening thereof, ‘heap*’ which resolves any border cases by placing them either in the positive or negative extension of ‘heap*’. Intuitively, for a sharpening to be admissible as a sharpening of the original vague predicate it ought to also be constrained by its only resolving vague semantic aspects of the predicate's meaning. For example if a pile of i grains of wheat definitely counts as a heap then it ought to be definitely counted a heap*; positive cases ought remain unchanged, as should negative cases. Additionally it should not draw a line between positive and negative cases in such a way as to alter definite ordering relations. Since it is definitely the case that i+1 grains counts as a heap if i does, i+1 will count as a heap* if i does. An admissible sharpening of any soritical predicate will simply extend the positive and negative extensions to form a sharp boundary somewhere in the predicate's penumbra.

It is easy to see that vague predicates in general have no unique admissible sharpening; there will be a number of possibilities depending on where the cut-off point between the positive and negative extension of the now precise predicate is drawn. Nonetheless, to predicate ‘heap’ of something in the positive extension will be true for all admissible sharpenings of the predicate and to predicate ‘heap’ of something in the negative extension will be false for all admissible sharpenings. Defining "truth" simpliciter (or, as it is sometimes called, "supertruth") as "truth on all admissible sharpenings", the former predications will be, quite simply, true and the latter false. To predicate ‘heap’ of a border case will be true on some admissible sharpenings and false on others and so is considered neither true nor false but indeterminate in truth value.

Validity can now be defined so that an argument is supervaluationally valid just in case every model in which the premises are true is one in which the conclusion is also true. Validity thus defined coincides with classical validity, reflecting the fact that the basic underlying notion of ‘truth on an admissible sharpening’ is a classical two-valued valuation function. In particular, treating laws as zero-premise arguments, such supervaluationism preserves all classical laws. In spite of its being non-bivalent then it validates the law of excluded middle. For example, it is true in every model that i grains of wheat either does or does not make a heap since in any model the corresponding disjunction with ‘heap*’ in place of ‘heap’ will be true regardless of which admissible sharpening ‘heap*’ is considered.

Supervaluation semantics then is no longer truth-functional. Consider disjunction for example. Some disjunctions with indeterminate disjuncts will count as indeterminate, for example ‘(Border case) ai makes a heap or it makes a heap’; whereas some will count as true, for example ‘(Border case) ai makes a heap or it does not make a heap’. Moreover the semantics countenances instances of true disjunctions neither of whose disjuncts is true. Conjunction and the conditional exhibit analogous non-classical features.

Since all the forms taken by the sorites are classically valid, they are also supervaluationally valid. The conclusion of the conditional form is resisted by noticing that some conditional premise fails to be true. For example, the premise ‘If (border case) ai makes a heap then (border case) ai+1 makes a heap’ will admit of a sharpening which draws the line between ai and ai+1 thus making the conditional false on that sharpening, and one which does not so draw the line, making the conditional true on that sharpening. It is therefore neither true nor false but indeterminate. The conditional sorites is valid but unsound.

More revealing is the diagnosis with regard to the mathematical induction form. It is also deemed unsound due to the failure of one of the premises -- the universal premise. The universally quantified conditional is not true; in fact it's false. While there is no one conditional premise of the conditional form which is false, it is nonetheless true according to supervaluation theory that some conditional is. That is to say, it is false that for all n, if Fan then Fan+1 (where ‘F’ is soritical relative to the subjects of the form ai). For any sharpening of the vague predicate ‘F’ there will always be some ai which counts as the cut-off point relative to that sharpening and thus falsifies the relevant conditional ‘if Fai then Fai+1’. Every sharpening produces a cut-off point even though no single cut-off point is produced by every sharpening. Hence "For all n, if Fan then Fan+1" is false on every sharpening and so false simpliciter.

Given that supervaluation semantics admits that the falsity of "For all n, if Fan then Fan+1" is logically equivalent to the truth of "For some n, Fan & ~Fan+1", the line-drawing form of the sorites is also solved. The argument is supervaluationally valid since classically valid and its premises are uncontestably true. What supervaluation semantics provides is an account of how it is that such a conclusion could be true; it is true since true no matter how one admissibly sharpens the soritical predicate involved.

In this way then the sorites paradoxes are said to be defused. Classical logic is no longer appropriate to reasoning in vague contexts and supervaluation semantics is proposed in its place. One immediate concern facing this solution however is the fact that it ultimately treats the mathematical induction and line-drawing forms of the sorites in just the same way as the logically conservative epistemic theory. We are forced to accept the avowedly counter intuitive truth of "For some n, Fan & ~Fan+1" which seems to postulate the existence of a sharp boundary yet the existence of just such a boundary is what the semantic theory of vagueness is supposed to deny.

Supervaluationists respond by denying that the conclusion of the line-drawing sorites expresses the existence of a sharp boundary. Though committed to the claim

(a)       T ‘existsn (Fan & ~Fan+1)’,
semantic precision is only properly captured by the claim that
(b)       existsn T ‘(Fan & ~Fan+1)’
and this is clearly denied by supervaluation theory. Whilst it is true that there is some cut-off point, there is no particular point of which it is true that it is the cut-off point. Since it is only this latter claim which is taken to commit one to the existence of a sharp boundary there is no commitment to there being such a boundary of which we are ignorant (contra the epistemic theorist).

With this explanation however, doubts arise as to the adequacy of the logic. Not only must (b) be properly taken to represent the semantic precision of ‘F’ but we must also be prepared to admit that some existential statements can be true without having any true instance, thus blocking any inference from (a) to (b). Just as the failure of the metatheoretic principle of bivalence in conjunction with the retention of the law of excluded middle leads to the presence of true disjunctions lacking true disjuncts, so too must we countenance analogous non-standard behaviour in the logic's quantification theory. In effect, the counter intuitive aspects of the epistemic theory are avoided only at a cost to other intuitions.

At this point the supervaluationist might seek to explain the non-standard behaviour of the quantifiers, and for that matter the non-truth-functional two-place connectives, by showing how such behaviour follows from a proper understanding of the underlying phenomenon of vagueness. More exactly, the suggestion is that a view of vagueness as merely semantic and in no way a reflection of any underlying phenomenon of ontological vagueness might underpin a supervaluationist approach to vagueness. Fine (1975) promotes this representational view of vagueness when defending the law of excluded middle for example. The suggestion would not only prescribe the counter intuitive aspects of supervaluation semantics but would also provide a principled justification of the common de facto linkage of supervaluation theory and a representational view of vagueness.

If this explanation is to be pursued then the formal machinery of supervaluation semantics dissolves the paradox only in conjunction with the metaphysical assumption of the impossibility of ontological vagueness. The metaphysical debate is ongoing.

The supervaluation approach has also come under fire for its semantic ascent into the metatheory when defusing the sorites. The problem with accepting the major premise of the mathematical induction sorites as false is simply that it runs counter to our conviction that a grain of wheat can make the difference between a heap and a non-heap; but this conviction can be expressed in the object-language, so why should the elaborate metalinguistic theory be relevant here?

As it happens, such assent is not essential to the account. The object language can be extended to include an operator ‘It is determinate (or definite) that …’ (‘Det’) appropriate to the expression of vagueness in the object language. The vagueness of expressions like ‘heap’ is characterised by their possessing border cases; this can now be expressed as the existence of cases which are neither determinately heaps nor determinately non-heaps.

By means of the extended language, (a) and (b) are now recast as claims within the object language:

(a′)       Det existsn (Fan & ~Fan+1)

(b′)       existsn Det (Fan & ~Fan+1).

The first is again affirmed and the latter denied. Any inference from (a′) to (b′) is analogous to the modal inference from ‘Nec existsx Fx’ to ‘existsx Nec Fx’ and is seen as fallacious, just as the modal inference is commonly said to be. Vagueness, like modality, is viewed as de dicto, and, as in many modal logics, the resulting quantification theory reflects important scope distinctions.

Williamson (1994) points to two further problems which now beset the account. If the definition of validity as necessary truth-preservation is retained then classical inferences like conditional proof, dilemma and reductio ad absurdum are no longer valid. Moreover problems arise with regard to the phenomenon of higher order vagueness.

3.4 Many-Valued Logic

As alternatives to the non-truth-functional supervaluation semantics, non-classical logics have been proposed, and in particular, ‘many-valued logics’. Again vagueness is seen as grounds for rejecting the principle of bivalence, however truth-functionality is preserved. The approaches vary as regards the number of non-classical truth values deemed appropriate to model vagueness and defuse the sorites paradox.

An initial proposal, first developed in Halldén (1949) and Körner (1960) and recently revamped in Tye (1994), uses a three-valued logic. The motivation for such a logic is similar to the supervaluationist's. Just as a vague predicate divides objects into the positive extension, negative extension and the penumbra, vague sentences can be divided into the true, the false and the indeterminate. The truth-set is then {1 (true), 1/2 (indeterminate), 0 (false)}. Unlike supervaluation semantics, however, the connectives can then be defined by means of truth tables. There are a range of proposals with Kleene's strong three-valued tables as the preferred choice. (See Haack (1974), Appendix.)

The particular response to the sorites paradox then depends on the definition of validity adopted. A common generalisation of the concept of validity to many-valued logic involves the designation of certain values. A sentence holds (or is assertible) in a many-valued interpretation just if it takes a designated value. Validity is then defined as the necessary preservation of designated value. (In classical logic, of course, only truth is designated and thus the generalised concept reduces to the classical concept of necessary truth preservation.) There are then two non-trivial choices: let the set of designated values be {1} or {1, 1/2}. The former proposal results in a type (2) response, the latter a type (3) response.

If validity is defined as necessary preservation of truth-only then modus ponens and cut are valid and so, subsequently, is the conditional sorites. Yet not all its premises hold since they are not all true. Some conditional premise is considered to have a true antecedent and indeterminate consequent and so counts as indeterminate. Like supervaluationism such a logic may be said to be paracomplete, admitting non-trivial incomplete theories. (That is, a vague sentence ‘A’ and its negation ‘~A’ can both fail to be designated in an interpretation which nonetheless designates some sentences.)

If, on the other hand, validity is defined so that the conclusion of an argument is either true or indeterminate whenever the premises are either true or indeterminate then a paraconsistent logic results, admitting non-trivial inconsistent theories. (A vague sentence ‘A’ and its negation ‘~A’ might both be designated in an interpretation which nonetheless fails to designate every sentence.) Such an approach solves the sorites paradox by declaring it invalid. The premises hold since they are at worst indeterminate in truth-value, yet modus ponens is no longer valid. In an interpretation where ‘Fai’ is indeterminate and ‘Fai+1’ is false both ‘Fai’ and ‘If Fai then Fai+1’ are designated yet ‘Fai+1’ is not.

A general concern with three-valued approaches is that their tripartite division of sentences faces similar objections to those which led to the abandonment of the bipartite division effected by two-valued classical logic. Due to the phenomenon of higher order vagueness (in particular second order vagueness) there would seem to be no more grounds for supposing there to exist a sharp boundary between the true sentences and indeterminate ones or the indeterminate sentences and false sentences than there was for supposing a sharp boundary to exist between the true sentences and the false ones. The phenomenon of vagueness which drives the sorites paradox no more suggests two sharp boundaries than it did one. Vague concepts appear to be concepts without boundaries at all. No finite number of divisions seems adequate. Tye (1994) seeks to avoid such difficulties by employing a vague metalanguage.

Goguen (1969) and Zadeh (1975) suggest replacing classical two-valued logic with an infinite-valued one. Infinite-valued or fuzzy logics have also been promoted for their recognition of degrees of truth. Just as baldness comes in degrees so too it is argued does the truth of sentences predicating baldness of things. The fact that John is more bald than Jo is reflected in the sentence ‘John is bald’ having a higher degree of truth than ‘Jo is bald’. With this logical innovation infinite-valued logics are then offered as a means to solve the sorites paradox.

The classical two-valued truth set {0, 1} is replaced by set of real numbers in the interval [0, 1]. Sentences which are neither definitely true nor definitely false take values other than 0 or 1, but some number in between. As with all many-valued logics, the connectives can be defined in a number of ways, giving rise to a number of distinct logics. A standard proposal proceeds by way of the continuum-valued truth-functional semantics devised by Łukasiewicz. (See Haack (1974), Appendix.) As with the three-valued case, the type of response offered to the paradox depends on the definition of validity. If only the maximum value 1 is designated then the conditional form of the argument is valid, however the conditional premises are not completely true (that is, they do not take the value 1) and do not hold. The diagnosis of the paradox is that we mistake nearly true sentences for completely true ones and the error compounds each time a new conditional premise is invoked in the chain of reasoning. Beginning with a completely true categorical premise we thus proceed to heap neglected difference on neglected difference until finally complete falsity is reached. This type (2) response contrasts with another approach sometimes advocated.

In the foregoing account the laws of excluded middle and non-contradiction fail. Consider some sentence ‘A’ with truth-value 1/2. By the definition of negation ‘~A’ has value 1/2 and so their disjunction also has value 1/2, which is not designated. Thus the law of excluded middle fails. Similarly for the law of non-contradiction. To reinstate these classical laws one can consider all values in the interval [1, 1/2] as designated. In this case all premises of the paradox hold yet modus ponens fails and a type (3) response results. In an interpretation where ‘Fai’ takes the value 1/2 and ‘Fai+1’ takes the value 0 both ‘Fai’ and ‘If Fai then Fai+1’ take the value 1/2 and so are designated yet ‘Fai+1’ is not. Such a proposal is paraconsistent, admitting contradictions as sometimes taking a designated value; namely when a sentence and its negation both take the value 1/2. Other type (3) responses can be developed by taking the set of designated values to be the interval [1, n] where 1/2 < n < 1.

There are, however, a number of problems which beset any infinite-valued approach to vagueness. Firstly, the very idea of a degree of truth needs explanation. Secondly, if numerical truth-values are to used some justification seems required for the particular truth-value assignments. Thirdly, the full implications of abandoning the well-understood classical theory in favour of degree theory need spelling out before a proper evaluation of its worth can be made. (On these points see Sainsbury (1995) Ch 2, sec. 6.) Furthermore, it is far from clear whether such an approach successfully avoids problems of higher order vagueness. And the assumption of a totally ordered truth-set is overly simple. Not all natural language sentences are comparable as regards their truth. Due to the multi-dimensional nature of a concept such as redness we may be unable to say of two reddish patches which differ in hue or brightness or colour-saturation whether one is redder than the other. (On these latter points see Williamson (1994) Ch 4, sec. 12-13.)

3.5 Embracing the Paradox

A final option is to simply embrace the paradox. (See Dummett (1975), Wright (1975).) Conditional sorites paradoxes are, contrary to appearances, sound. For example, no amount of grains of wheat makes a heap. This initial claim in favour of a universal type (4) response immediately runs into difficulty however with the realisation that, as noted above, such paradoxes come in pairs. There are negative and positive versions depending on whether the soritical predicate is negated or not. To accept all sorites as sound requires assent to the additional claim that, since one grain of wheat makes a heap, any number do. A radical incoherence follows since there is a commitment to all and any number both making a heap and not making a heap. Similarly, everyone is bald and no-one is; everyone is rich and no-one is, and so on.

The problem is that the soundness of any positive conditional sorites undercuts the truth of the unconditional premise of the corresponding negative version, and vice versa. Unless one is prepared to countenance the almost total pervasiveness of contradictions in natural language, it seems that not all sorites can be sound. Unger (1979) and Wheeler (1979) propose a more restricted embrace. Following dissatisfaction with responses of type (1) and (3) one accepts the applicability and validity of classical norms of reasoning. Nonetheless, dissatisfaction with responses of type (2) considered so far -- rejecting some conditional premise -- leaves open the possibility of either rejecting the unconditional premise or accepting it and, with it, the soundness of the paradox. What is advocated is the soundness of those sorites which deny heapness, baldness, hirsuteness, richness, poverty, etc. of everything -- a type (4) response -- and the corresponding falsity of the unconditional premise of all respective positive variants of the argument -- a type (2) response. Terms like ‘heap’, ‘bald’, ‘hirsute’, ‘rich’ and ‘poor’ apply to nothing. It is admitted that they apply to everything if they apply to anything, but the all-or-nothing choice is resolved in favour of the latter option. (See Williamson (1994) Ch 6.)



Sorites in History

Its Paradoxical Forms


The Epistemic Response


Many-Valued Approaches

Embracing the Paradox

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

logic: non-classical | logic: paraconsistent | vagueness

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Dominic Hyde

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