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In contrast to the meaning the word ‘sophism’ had in
ancient philosophy, ‘sophisma’ in medieval
philosophy is a technical term with no pejorative connotation: a
sophisma is an ambiguous, puzzling or simply difficult
sentence that has to be solved. As an important element of scholarly
training in universities, closely related to different kinds of
disputations, the sophismata not only served to illustrate a
theory but, from a more theoretical point of view, were also used to
test the limits of a theory. The so-called
sophismata-literature assumed more and more importance during
the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, and it is not an
exaggeration to claim that many important developments in philosophy
(mainly in logic and natural philosophy) appeared in texts of this
kind, where masters could feel free to investigate problems and
develop their own views, much more than they could in more academic
and strictly codified literary genres.
Although some medieval theologians -- and Humanists even more, of
course, like Vivès or Rabelais -- used the words
‘sophism’ or ‘sophist’ as a derogatory
designation for quibbling philosophers, ‘sophisma’
in medieval philosophical literature has a very precise and technical
signification. Hence, to avoid any confusion with fallacies and
badly-constructed arguments, we shall here use the original term
‘sophisma’ rather than the word ‘sophism’
that even nowadays still has a pejorative connotation.
There are several important characteristics of sophismata.
First of all, a sophisma is a sentence rather than an
argument. In particular, a sophisma is a sentence that either:
Here are some some examples of kind (1), sentences that are odd or
have odd consequences:
- is odd or has odd consequences,
- is ambiguous, and can be true or false according to
the interpretation we give it, or
- has nothing special about it in itself, but becomes
puzzling when it occurs in a definite context (or "case,"
This donkey is your father.
As examples of kind (2), ambiguous sentences that can be
true or false according to the interpretation given to to them,
A chimaera is a chimaera.
All the apostles are twelve.
As an example of kind (3), sentences that have nothing special about
them in themselves, but
that become puzzling when they occur in a definite context
("case," casus), consider:
The infinite are finite.
Every man is of necessity an animal.
The sentence ‘Socrates says something false’, in
the case where Socrates says nothing other than
‘Socrates says something false’.
(This is paradoxical, and is one of the forms the Liar paradox can
2.2 The Aim of the Discussion
Once the odd, ambiguous or puzzling sophisma-sentence is set
out, one should try to understand what it means, what implications it
has, and how it fits into or contradicts a particular theory under
consideration. This is called "solving the sophisma," and is
the aim of the entire discussion. The way solutions are searched for
and established is very similar to the highly formalized scholastic
method for determining a "question":
- First, one has to examine the arguments pro and
- Second, one has to present his own solution to the problem.
(Sometimes this part of the discussion is preceded by certain
theoretical remarks or clarifications that make the terminology more
- Third, one has to refute the arguments supporting the opposite
Let us take a very simple example, from Albert of Saxony,
Sophismata, sophisma xi. The sophisma is:
Omnes homines sunt asini vel homines et asini sunt asini.
In accordance with step (1), here are the pro and contra
(All men are donkeys or men and donkeys are donkeys.)
Proof: The sophisma is a copulative sentence (in modern
logical terminology, a conjunction) each part of which is true;
therefore the sophisma is true, since its analysis becomes:
[All men are donkeys or men] and [donkeys are donkeys].
This is a sophisma of the second kind above, one that rests on
an ambiguity and can be read with a true interpretation or with a
false interpretation. Many such sophismata, although not this
one, resist being translated from Latin into another language without
losing the ambiguity. For example, the sentence ‘aliquem asinum
omnis homo videt’ can be translated by ‘Every man sees a
donkey’ as well as by ‘There is a donkey that every man
sees’. Similarly, in solving sophismata, sometimes Latin
word-order is used as an arbitrary code for interpreting the
sentence. For example, according to William Heytesbury, when the word
‘infinite’ is placed at the beginning of a sentence and
belongs to the subject, it has to be interpreted as a
syncategorematic term; in any other case, it is usually interpreted
as a categorematic term (Heytesbury, Sophismata,
sophisma xviii, fol.130va). Such word-order codes might seem
like reasonable regimentations of language to a Latin-speaker, but in
translation they often seem quite implausible and forced. No such
problems arise with this example. (For clarity, square brackets have
been inserted into the proof and disproof above, in order to indicate
the ambiguity of the sophisma.)
Disproof: The sophisma is a disjunctive sentence each part of
which is false; therefore the sophisma is false, since its
analysis becomes: [All men are donkeys] or [men and donkeys are
In accordance with step (2) above, Albert of Saxony, who discusses
this sophisma, solves it by just saying that it is either true
or false depending on which interpretation we choose. He then takes
the opportunity to review the basic principles governing the
truth-value of copulative and disjunctive sentences.
In accordance with step (3), we would normally be required to refute
the opposite answer. In this case, however, there is nothing to
refute, since Albert's solution accepts both the pro and
the contra arguments (for different readings of the
In general, a sophisma was a good occasion to discuss all the
problems related to a specific issue. For example, the
sophisma ‘Album fuit disputaturum’ (‘The
white [thing] was going to be disputed’) in thirteenth-century
Parisian literature was the occasion to discuss all the problems
related to the theory of reference in tensed contexts, as well as to
refute the positions others held on this very controversial
subject. This is why Pinborg 1977 (p. xv) says that at Paris in the
thirteenth century "the sophismata seems -- within the faculty
of arts -- to play a role analoguous to the Quaestiones
quodlibetales [quodlibetal questions] in the faculty of
theology." Note that this use is quite common. (Note also that
Pinborg here uses the word ‘sophismata’ to signify
not only sophisma-sentences but the whole literature that
discussed them as well.)
Syncategorematic Terms, Exponible Sentences
It is important to recognize that many sophismata involve
syncategorematic terms that are responsible for their odd, ambiguous
or puzzling character. The preceding sophisma can be
considered quite characteristic of the genre insofar as we see that
the syncategorematic terms ‘or’ and ‘and’ occur
in it and are responsible for the ambiguity of the sentence.
The expression ‘syncategorematic term’ should be taken in
a broad sense here, so that it not only includes classical
syncategorematic terms like ‘and’, ‘if’,
‘every’, etc., but also categorematic terms like
‘infinite’ or ‘whole’ that can be used both
categorematically and syncategorematically. Thus the sentence
"Infinita sunt finita" ("The infinite are finite" -- here,
incidentally is another good example of a sophisma that cannot be
translated into English without disambiguating it) is false if
‘infinite’ is used categorematically, for in that case its
signification is "Things that are infinite are finite." But it is
true if ‘infinite’ is used syncategorematically, for in
that case its signification is "Finite things are infinite in number"
or "There are infinitely many finite things." (See Heytesbury,
Sophismata, sophisma xviii, fol.130va.)
Many sophismata too are what medieval logicians called
"exponible sentences", sentences that seem to be simple but actually
imply several other sentences into which they can be decomposed. For
example, the sentence "A differs from B" was said to be
equivalent to "A exists and B exists and A is
not B"; the sentence "A ceases to be white" was said to
be equivalent either to "Now A is white and immediately after
this A will not be white" or to "Now A is not white and
immediately before this A was white", depending on the theory.
2.3 The Main Fields in Which Sophismata Are Discussed
Just as the scholastic method can be applied to any subject, the use
of sophismata is to be found in logic, grammar and physics as
well as in theology. Let us concentrate here on the first three.
As seen above, logical sophismata are closely linked to the
discussions of syncategoremata. The aim is either to determine the
truth-value of a sentence (including sentences involving
self-reference) or to discuss subjects such as:
We could compare these discussions to contemporary discussions of
sentences like "The morning star is the evening star."
- The syntactic and semantic properties of terms (including the
difference between meaning and reference) in sentences like "Every
man sees every man," "You are a donkey," and "I promise you a horse."
- Quantification and existential import, as in the sentence
"Every phoenix is."
- The theory of negation and "infinite" words, as in the sentence
"Nothing and a chimaera are brothers."
- The problem of universals, as in "Man is a species."
- The composite and divided senses of a sentence and the scope of
modal operators, as in "The white can be black," "Every man is of
necessity an animal," etc.
The aim here is to discuss physical concepts (motion, change,
velocity, intension and remission of forms, maxima and minima, etc.).
But, as seen above with the sophisma "The infinite are
finite," physical problems are treated as logical and conceptual
problems. This logico-semantical approach to physical problems is
quite characteristic of medieval physics and should be kept in mind
when we wonder the extent to which medieval physics can be considered
a precursor to modern physics.
With respect to so-called physical sophismata, special
attention should to be paid to certain fourteenth century English
authors known as the "Oxford Calculators," authors like Richard
Kilvington, William Heytesbury, Thomas Bradwardine, Richard and Roger
Swineshead. These people developed a peculiarly "English-style" of
sophismata. Based on the theological dogma of the absolute
power of God, the distinction between what is physically possible and
what is logically possible (where non-contradiction is the only
limit) allowed these authors to make use of imaginary thought
experiments. For example, "Suppose that A is a distance to be
traversed which Socrates cannot traverse, and that his power is
increased until Socrates can traverse distance A completely,
and that Socrates' power is not increased further." Is the
sophisma "Socrates will begin to be able to traverse distance
A" true or false? (Richard Kilvington, Sophismata,
sophisma 27, in Kretzmann 1990, p.60.) Thought experiments
like these led these authors to, among other things, a theorem for
uniformly accelerated motion (Thomas Bradwardine's "Mean Speeed
Sophismata like "Love is a verb," "O Master," "It rueth me" or
"I run" gave rise to very sharp discussions of grammatical categories
and theories. For example, does a change of word order change the
meaning of a proposition? Can a participle be a subject? How should
we interpret interjections? Can ‘est’ ("is") be used
The first and most evident role of sophismata is
pedagogical. In theoretical treatises, sophismata can play
various roles. They can be used to explain a given statement or rule,
illustrate a distinction or an ambiguity, show what would follow if a
rule were violated, or test the limits of a theory.
In addition, although some differences can be identified between the
Paris and the Oxford traditions, sophismata are important as
oral exercises (disputations) in a student's training in
philosophy, especially in the first years of universitary education
in the Faculty of Arts. Nevertheless, it is clear that, while
Heytesbury's Rules for Solving Sophismata is written for
undergraduate students -- at Oxford ‘sophista’ was
the official name given to students who had disputed "on
sophismata" ("de sophismatibus") for about two years --
this is probably not the case for his Sophismata, the
discussions in which are much more complicated.
I think it is no exaggeration to say that sophismata in the
Faculty of Arts were as important as Biblical exegesis in the Faculty
If we look at the evolution of literary genres, we note that the
twelfth- and early-thirteenth century
syncategoremata-literature came to be absorbed in the
sophisma-literature. In thirteenth and fourteenth century
philosophical literature, sophismata can appear within many
kinds of treatises. There are collections of sophismata named
simply Sophismata or On Sophismata, but
sophismata are also important in works -- often by the same
authors, or by different authors coming from the same milieu as the
former collections -- with titles like Abstractions,
Distinctions, On Exponibles, On Consequences,
Even if there are technical distinctions among these types of
tracts, all of them play the same roles mentioned just above -- in
short: to acquire logical abilities that can be applied to any
The medieval sophismata-literature is a vast and complex
subject of research. Many questions are still unsolved, especially
about its historical origins and development. It is of central
interest for people interested in medieval logic, grammar and
physics, but also for those interested in the history of
The study of "sophismatic works" began around 1940 with
Grabmann's Die Sophismatalitteratur des 12. und
13. Jahrhunderts, and much work has been done in the last two decades.
But there are still a lot of texts to read, edit and analyze.
The bibliography is organized as follows:
Most of the logical and grammatical texts on sophismata have
been edited by S. Ebbesen and his collaborators in the review
Cahiers de l'Institut du Moyen Age Grec et Latin,
University of Copenhagen. We will here mention only books.
- de Libera, A. César et le Phénix. Distinctiones
et sophismata parisiens du XIIIe siècle. Centro di
cultura medievale, 4; Pisa: Scuola Normale Superiore, 1991.
- De Rijk, L. M. Some Earlier Parisian Tracts on Distinctiones
sophismatum. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 1988.
- Scott, T. K. Johannes
Buridanus. ‘Sophismata’. Critical Edition with an
Introduction. Grammatica Speculativa, 1; Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt:
- Pironet, Fabienne. Iohanni Buridani Summularum Tractatus
nonus: De practica sophismatum (Sophismata). Critical Edition and
Introduction. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers,
- Kretzmann, N., and Kretzmann, B. E. The ‘Sophismata’
of Richard Kilvington. Oxford: University Press for The
British Academy, 1990. (Critical edition.)
- Pinborg, J. Sigerus de Cortraco, ‘Summa modorum
significandi sophismata’; New Edition, on the Basis of
G. Wallerand's editio prima, with Additions, Critical Notes, an
Index of Terms and an Introduction. Amsterdam: J. Benjamins,
- Longeway, J. William Heytesbury: On Maxima and
Minima. Chapter 5 of ‘Rules for Solving Sophismata’, with
an Anonymous Fourteenth Century Discussion, a Translation with an
Introduction and Study. Synthese Historical Library, 26;
Dordrecht: Reidel, 1984.
- Pironet, Fabienne, Guillaume Heytesbury, Sophismata
asinina. Une introduction aux disputes
médiévales. Présentation, édition
critique et analyse. Collection Sic et Non; Paris: Vrin,
1994. (With texts from the Libelli sophistarum ad usum
Many important studies are to be found in the following collective
work: Read, S., (ed.) Sophisms in Medieval Logic and Grammar. Acts
of the Ninth European Symposium for Medieval Logic and Semantics,
St. Andrews, June 1990. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers,
- Scott, T. K. Sophisms on Meaning and Truth. New York:
Appleton Century Crofts, 1966. (Translation of John Buridan's
- Biard, J. Jean Buridan, Sophismes. Collection Sic et Non;
Paris: Vrin, 1993.
- Hughes, G. E. John Buridan on Self-Reference. Chapter Eight of
Buridan's ‘Sophismata’. An Edition and a Translation
with an Introduction and a Philosophical Commentary. Cambridge:
Cambridge University Press, 1982. (The paperbound edition omits the
- Kretzmann, N., and Kretzmann, B.E. The ‘Sophismata’
of Richard Kilvington. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press,
1990. (English translation, historical introduction and philosophical
Buridan, John [Jean] |
Burley [Burleigh], Walter |
Heytesbury, William |
insolubles [= insolubilia] |
Kilvington, Richard |
Richard the Sophister [Ricardus Sophista, Magister abstractionum] |
terms, properties of: medieval theories of
- Biard, J. "Les sophismes du savoir: Albert de Saxe entre Jean
Buridan et Guillaume Heytesbury." Vivarium 27 (1989), 36-50.
- Biard, J. "Verbes cognitifs et appellation de la forme selon
Albert de Saxe." In S. Knuuttila, R. Työrinoja, and S. Ebbesen,
ed. Knowledge and the Sciences in Medieval Philosophy. Proceedings
of the Eighth International Congress of Medieval Philosophy
(S.I.E.P.M.). Helsinki, 24-29 August 1987. Helsinki:
Yliopistopaino, 1990, Vol.II, pp.427-35.
- Ebbesen, S. "The Dead Man is Alive." Synthese 40 (1979),
- Grabmann, M. Die Sophismatenliteratur des 12. und
13. Jahrhunderts mit Textausgabe eines Sophisma des Boetius von
Dacien. Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie une
Theologie des Mittelalters. Texte und Untersuchungen. Band 36,
Heft 1; Münster i. W.: Aschendorff, 1940.
- Knuuttila, S. and Lehtinen, A. I. "Plato in infinitum remisse
incipit esse albus. New Texts on the Late Medieval Discussion on the
Concept of Infinity in Sophismata Literature." In E. Saarinen,
R. Hilpinen, I. Niiniluoto, M. P. Hintikka, ed. Essays in Honour
of J. Hintikka. Synthese Library, 124; Dordrecht: D. Reidel
Pub. Co., 1979, 309-29.
- Kretzmann, N. "Syncategoremata, exponibilia, sophismata." In
N. Kretzmann, et al, ed. The Cambridge History of Later
Medieval Philosophy from the Rediscovery of Aristotle to the
Disintegration of Scholasticism, 1100-1600. Cambridge: Cambridge
University Press, 1982, 211-45.
- Kretzmann, N. "Continuity, Contrariety, Contradiction and
Change." In N. Kretzmann, ed. Infinity and Continuity in Ancient
and Medieval Thought. Papers Presented at a Conference held at
Cornell University on April 20 and 21 1979, under the Title
‘Infinity, Continuity and Indivisibility in Antiquity and the
Middle Ages’. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1982,
322-40. (With an appendix: "Text of Walter Burleigh and the Sophisms
8 and 16 of Richard Kilvington.")
- Kretzmann, N. "Tu scis hoc esse omne quod est hoc: Richard
Kilvington and the Logic of Knowledge." In N. Kretzmann, ed.
Meaning and Inference in Medieval Philosophy. Studies in Memory of
Jan Pinborg. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1988, 225-45.
- de Libera, A. "La littérature des Sophismata dans
la tradition terministe parisienne de la seconde moitié du
XIIIe s." In M. Asztalos, ed. The Editing of Theological and
Philosophical Texts from the Middle Ages. Acts of the Conference
Arranged by the Department of Classical Languages, University of
Stockholm, 29-31 August 1984. Acta universitatis
Stockholmiensis. Studia Latina Stockholmiensia, 30; Stockholm:
Almqvist and Wiksell International, 1986, 213-44.
- de Libera, A. "La littérature des Abstractiones et
la tradition logique d'Oxford." In P. O. Lewry, ed. The Rise
of British Logic. Acts of the Sixth European Symposium on Medieval
Logic and Semantics. Balliol College, Oxford, 19-24 June 1983.
Papers in Mediaeval Studies, 7; Toronto, Pontifical Institute of
Mediaeval Studies, 1983, 63-114.
- de Libera, A. "La problématique de l' ’instant
du changement’ au XIIIe siècle: contribution à
l'histoire des sophismata physicalia." In S. Carloti,
ed. Studies in Medieval Natural Philosophy. Florence: Leo
S. Olschki, 1989, 43-93.
- Murdoch, J. E. "Mathematics and Sophisms in Late Medieval Natural
Philosophy." In Les genres littéraires dans les sources
théologiques et philosophiques médiévales.
Actes du colloque international de Louvain-la-Neuve, 25-27 mai
1981. Université Catholique de Louvain, Publications de
l'Institut Supérieur d'Etudes
Médiévales. Deuxième Série: Textes,
Etudes, Congrès, 5; Louvain-la-Neuve: Institut d'Etudes
Médiévales de L'Université Catholique de
Louvain, 1982, 85-100.
- Murdoch, J. E. "Infinity and Continuity." In N. Kretzmann, et
al., ed. The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy
from the Rediscovery of Aristotle to the Disintegration of
Scholasticism, 1100-1600. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press,
- Rosier, I. and Roy, B. "Grammaire et liturgie dans les sophismes
du XIIIe siècle." Vivarium 28 (1990), 118-35.
- Rosier, I. "Les sophismes grammaticaux au XIIIe s."
Medioevo 17 (1991), 175-230.
- Sylla, E. D. "William Heytesbury on the Sophism infinita sunt
finita." In Sprache und Erkenntnis im Mittelalter. Akten des
6. Internationalen Kongresses für mittelalterliche Philosophie
der Société Internationale pour l'étude de
la philosophie médiévale, 29. August-3. September 1977
im Bonn. Miscellanea Mediaevalia, 13.1-2; Berlin: W. de Gruyter,
1981, Vol.II, 628-36.
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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy