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Wilfrid Stalker Sellars (b. 1912, d. 1989) was a profoundly creative
and synthetic thinker whose work both as a systematic philosopher and
as an influential editor helped set and shape the Anglo-American
philosophical agenda for over four decades. Sellars is perhaps best
known for his classic 1956 essay "Empiricism and the Philosophy of
Mind", a comprehensive and sophisticated critique of "the myth of the
given" which played a major role in the postwar deconstruction of
Cartesianism, but his published corpus of three books and more than
one hundred essays includes numerous original contributions to
ontology, epistemology, and the philosophies of science, language,
and mind, as well as sensitive historical and exegetical studies.
Although Wilfrid Sellars is best known for his his ground-breaking
essay "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind" [EPM] and his critique
of what he there called "the myth of the given", he was in fact a
systematic philosopher par excellence. "The aim of
philosophy," he wrote, "is to understand how things in the broadest
possible sense of the term hang together in the broadest possible
sense of the term." [PSIM, 37] This image of the philosopher as a
reflective generalist recurs frequently in Sellars'
metaphilosophical reflections. His most explicit account of the
central task confronting contemporary philosophy aligns it firmly
with the modernist project of achieving a rapprochement
between our humanistic understanding of ourselves as free and
rational agents, at home among meanings and values, and the
thoroughly "disenchanted" picture of the world being painted by an
increasingly comprehensive natural science. Sellars thematized this
contrast as a confrontation of two "images": the "manifest
image" whose primary objects are persons, beings who
can and do conceive of themselves as sentient perceivers, cognitive
knowers, and deliberative agents, and the "scientific
image", whose primary entities are some sophisticated version of
"atoms in the void". "The scientific image," Sellars wrote, "presents
itself as a rival image. From its point of view the manifest
image on which it [methodologically] rests is an
‘inadequate’ but pragmatically useful likeness of a reality
which first finds its adequate (in principle) likeness in the
scientific image." [PSIM, 57] As Sellars saw it, the goal of
philosophy was to transform this tension between our lived
self-conception and our hard won explanatory understanding of the
world into a single "stereoscopic" image, a synoptic vision
of persons-in-the-world. Much of his philosophical work is addressed
to three central moments of this complex undertaking: accommodating
the intentional contents of thought and language, the
sensuous contents of perception and imagination, and the
normative dimensions of knowledge and conduct within such a
stereoscopic image - all the while resolutely maintaining a robust
scientific realism, for "in the dimension of describing and
explaining the world, science is the measure of all things, of what
is that it is, and of what is not that it is not." [EPM, 173]
Sellars' interpretation of the epistemology of natural science
departed decisively from the received view according to which
explanation was identified with derivation - singular matters of
empirical fact being explained by deriving descriptions of them from
(“inductively” established) empirical generalizations
(along with appropriate statements of initial conditions), and these
“empirical laws” in turn being explained by deriving them
from theoretical postulates and correspondence rules. On this received
Positivist view, theories (e.g., microtheories) explain empirical
matters of fact only indirectly, by implying generalizations framed in
an observation-language that explain them directly. In consequence, as
Hempel pointed out in “The Theoretician's Dilemma”,
such theories, although perhaps convenient aids to calculation and
compact representation, are in principle utterly dispensable.
- 1912 born May 20 in Ann Arbor, MI
- 1933 receives AB at the University of Michigan
- 1934 receives AM at the University of Buffalo, NY, enters Oriel
College, Oxford, as a Rhodes Scholar
- 1936 receives BA with First Class Honours in Philosophy,
Politics, and Economics (MA 1940)
- 1938 becomes Assistant Professor of Philosophy, University of
- 1943 enters U.S. Naval Reserve, assigned to Air Combat
- 1946 becomes Assistant Professor of Philosophy, University of
- 1950 founds Philosophical Studies with Herbert Feigl,
the first scholarly forum explicitly created for the new hybrid
- 1951 becomes Professor of Philosophy, University of
- 1956 serves as Special Lecturer in Philosophy at the University
of London, published as "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind"
- 1958 moves to Yale University, CN, first as a visitor,
subsequently as Professor of Philosophy
- 1963 assumes the position of University Professor of Philosophy
and Research Professor of Philosophy at the University of Pittsburgh,
PA, publishes Science, Perception and Reality
- 1965 delivers John Locke Lectures for 1965-66 at Oxford
University, subsequently published as Science and
- 1970 serves as president of the Eastern Division of the American
- 1971 delivers Matchette Foundation Lectures, University of Texas,
subsequently published as "The Structure of Knowledge"
- 1973 delivers John Dewey Lectures for 1973-74, University of
Chicago, IL, subsequently published as Naturalism and
- 1977 delivers Paul Carus Lectures for 1977-78 at the Eastern
Division meetings of the American Philosophical Association, later
published as "Foundations for a Metaphysics of Pure Process"
- 1987 Colloquium in Sellarsian Philosophy held at University of
Pittsburgh in honor of Sellars' 75th birthday
- 1989 dies at home in Pittsburgh, PA, on July 2
Sellars regarded this “layer-cake model” or
“levels picture” of theories as fundamentally misguided. He
argued that there is no autonomous stratum of empirical counterparts to
theoretical laws. The empirical generalizations corresponding to
theoretical laws become salient only from the theoretical
perspective. Generalizations arrived at autonomously at the
observational level, however reliable, are not laws of nature, and
theories consequently cannot be in the business of explaining such
lower-level generalizations by entailing them. Rather, “theories
explain laws by explaining why the objects of the domain in question
obey the laws that they do to the extent that they do.”
[That is,] they explain why individual objects of various
kinds and in various circumstances in the observation framework behave
in those ways in which it has been inductively established that they do
behave. Roughly, it is because a gas is ... a cloud of molecules which
are behaving in certain theoretically defined ways, that it obeys the
empirical Boyle-Charles Law. (LT,121)
On Sellars' view stories that postulate "theoretical entities"
are not merely manageable second-class surrogates for more complicated
and unwieldy stories about entities that we have good, i.e.,
observational, reasons to believe actually exist. Theoretical entities,
rather, are those entities we warrantedly believe to exist for good and
sufficient theoretical reasons. On this understanding,
scientific theories explanatorily "save the appearances" precisely by
characterizing the reality of which the appearances are appearances.
Like Quine, Sellars was deeply influenced by the work of Rudolf
Carnap. Sellars' sophisticated account of the nature and import
of theoretical reasoning in natural science, however, enabled him to
develop a systematic naturalistic alternative to Quine's
influential critique of Carnapian logical empiricism. In
particular, the epistemological contrast between two sorts of empirical
generalizations - those adopted on narrowly inductive grounds and those
expressing constitutive principles of postulational theories adopted on
broadly empirical, i.e., explanatory grounds - enabled Sellars to
distinguish among three different grades of "observational
involvement": observations and general claims individually validated
"inductively" by way of direct appeals to observational
backing, the constitutive posits of postulational theories holistically
validated by way of indirect, explanatory appeals to
observational backing, and purely formal claims expressing necessary
conditions for the formulation of scientific hypotheses in general.
Consequently, where Quine rejected the classical Kantian
analytic-synthetic dichotomy out of hand, Sellars argued that there
were two quite different distinctions tangled up in the single
dichotomy that Carnap had inherited from the Kantian tradition: the
distinction between logical and empirical (matter-of-factual) claims
(analytic2-synthetic2), and the distinction
between claims whose revision requires abandonment or modification of
the system of (theoretical) concepts in terms of which they are framed
and claims revisable on the basis of observations formulated in terms
of a system of (theoretical) concepts which remained fixed throughout
(analytic1-synthetic1). Like Quine, then, Sellars
moved decisively away from classical Kantian rationalism, but in the
direction of a Kantian empiricism which preserved logical
space for a theory of semantic meaning and the correlative distinctions
between individual matter-of-factual truths and truths which, although
belonging to theoretical systems themselves adopted on broadly
empirical (synthetic2) grounds, were, relative to such a
system, true ex vi terminorum (analytic1):
Grounded in experience
("a posteriori", simple induction)
Not so grounded
Arithmetic, Geometry, Mechanics
("synthetic a priori")
"Our conceptual framework" (innate principles)
Essential to Sellars' thoroughgoing naturalism is an account of
semantic meaning that requires no recourse to irreducibly platonistic
or mentalistic idioms. Sellars consequently resolutely locates the
normative conceptual order within the causal order and advances a
naturalistic interpretation of the modes of causality exercised by
linguistic rules centered on the notion of pattern-governed
Grounded in experience (Empirical)
Not so grounded
Observation, Simple Induction
(Operational geometry, mechanics)
(Physical geometry, idealizing scientific theories,
Logic, arithmetic, mathematical analysis
(Pure geometry qua calculus)
Material (empirical) categories
Formal (ontological) categories
behavior which exhibits a pattern, not because it is
brought about by the intention that it exhibit this pattern, but
because the propensity to emit behavior of the pattern has been
selectively reinforced, and the propensity to emit behavior which does
not conform to this pattern selectively extinguished.
Pattern-governed behavior characteristic of a species - e.g., the dance
of the bees - can arise from processes of natural selection on an
evolutionary time scale, but, crucially, pattern-governed behavior can
also be developed in individual "trainees" by deliberate selective
reinforcement on the part of other individuals, the trainers, acting
under the guidance of linguistic rules of criticism. In
contrast to linguistic rules of action, e.g.,
"Ceteris paribus, one ought to (or: may) say such and such if in
circumstances C", which can be efficacious in guiding linguistic
activity only to the extent that their subjects already possess the
concepts of "saying such-and-such", "being in circumstances C", and,
indeed, obeying a rule (i.e., doing something because it is enjoined or
permitted by a rule), rules of criticism are ought-to-be's -
e.g., "Westminster clock chimes ought to strike on the quarter hour"
(LTC,95) - whose subjects, although their performances may be assessed
according to such rules, need not themselves have the concept of a rule
nor, indeed, any concepts at all. Thus a trainer can be construed as
Patterned-behavior of such and such a kind ought to be
exhibited by trainees, hence we, the trainers, ought to do this and
that, as likely to bring it about that it is exhibited.
And, in consequence of the conducts of trainers under the guidance of
such rules of action, the behavior of a language-learner can come to
conform to the relevant rules of criticism without his
"grasping" them himself in any other sense. "Trainees conform to
ought-to-be's because trainers obey corresponding
Against this background, then, Sellars advanced an account of
meaning as functional classification according to which
semantic idioms in the first instance mark contexts within which
structurally distinct "natural-linguistic objects" (e.g., utterings or
inscribings) are classified in terms of their roles or functions in
language entry transitions (linguistic responses to perceptual
stimuli), language exit transitions (causal-linguistic
antecedents of non-linguistic conduct), and intra-linguistic
moves (inferential transitions from one linguistic representing to
another). In particular, ‘means’ is interpreted as a
specialized form of the copula, tailored to metalinguistic contexts,
according to which the right side of the superficially relational form
"___ means …" is properly understood as mentioning or exhibiting
a linguistic item.
On Sellars' view, such special copulae and metalinguistic
indicators initially arise in response to the need to abstract from our
domestic sign designs in order to classify items of different languages
on the basis of such functional criteria. In this project, ordinary
quotation suffers from a systematic ambiguity regarding the criteria -
structural (e.g., geometric, acoustic) or functional - according to
which linguistic tokens are classifiable as belonging to this or that
linguistic type. Accordingly, Sellars introduced a more straightforward
device of two separate styles of quotation marks, star-quotes and
dot-quotes, tied respectively to the structural and functional modes of
sorting and individuating lexical items. Both star- and dot-quotes are
illustrating, and thus indexical, devices, but dot-quotes are, in a
sense, doubly so. For, whereas star-quotes form a common noun that is
true of inscriptions (empirical structures) appropriately
design-isomorphic to the token exhibited between them, dot-quotes form
a common noun true of items in any language that play the role or do
the job performed in our language by the tokens exhibited between them.
In terms of this notational apparatus, then, such semantic claims as,
can be more perspicuously expressed by
- (1s) (In German) ‘rot’ means red.
- (2s) (In German) ‘Schnee ist weiss’ means snow is
Once such a distinction between functional and structural
classification of linguistic representing items is in hand, it is a
straightforward matter to extend it to an account of mental
representations, i.e., thoughts, as well. Unlike Quine,
Sellars never abandoned the classical notion of thoughts as intentional
inner episodes that play a causal-explanatory role
vis-à-vis overt, paradigmatically linguistic, behavior.
Consistent with his thoroughgoing naturalism, however, correlative to
his ontological "linguistic nominalism", Sellars embraced a form of
"psychological nominalism", whose leitmotif was
- (1*) (In the German linguistic community) *rot*s are .red.s.
- (2*) (In the German linguistic community) *Schnee ist weiss*s are
.snow is white.s.
. . . the denial of the claim, characteristic of the
realist tradition, that a "perception" or "awareness" of abstract
entities is the root mental ingredient of mental acts and dispositions.
Instead, Sellars argued, the proper account of the distinctive
intentionality of thought is also to be drawn in terms of the forms and
functions of natural linguistic items. The positive thesis correlative
to psychological nominalism, consequently, is modeled by what Sellars
came to call "verbal behaviorism".
According to VB [verbal behaviorism], thinking
‘that-p,’ where this means ‘having the thought occur
to one that-p,’ has as its primary sense [an event of] saying
‘p’; and a secondary sense in which it stands for a short
term proximate propensity [dispositional] to say ‘p’.
The origins of Sellars' mature forms of verbal behaviorism lie
in the revolutionary theses of his classic essay "Empiricism and the
Philosophy of Mind", and, in particular, in his mythical story of our
Rylean ancestors and the genius Jones. The story begins in
medias res with people who have mastered a "Rylean language",
a sophisticated expressive system, including logical operators and
subjunctive conditionals, whose fundamental descriptive vocabulary
pertains to public spatio-temporal objects. Consonant with the
Sellarsian account of linguistic meaning as functional classification,
this hypothetical Rylean language, although lacking any resources for
speaking of inner episodes, thoughts or experiences has been enriched
by the fundamental resources of semantical discourse - enabling our
ancestors to say of the their peers' utterances that they mean
this or that, that they stand in various logical relations to one
another, that they are true or false, and so on. In this milieu now
appears the genius Jones.
[In] the attempt to account for the fact that his fellow
men behave intelligently not only when their conduct is threaded on a
string of overt verbal episodes . . . but also when no detectable
verbal output is present, Jones develops a theory according to which
overt utterances are but the culmination of a process which begins with
certain inner episodes. . . . [His] model for these episodes which
initiate the events which culminate in overt verbal behavior is that of
overt verbal behavior itself. (EPM,186)
Although the primary use of semantical terms remains the semantical
characterization of overt verbal episodes, this Jonesean theory thus
carries over the applicability of those semantical categories to its
postulated inner episodes. i.e., to (occurrent) thoughts. The point of
the Jonesean myth is to suggest that the epistemological
status of thoughts (qua inner episodes) vis-à-vis candid public
verbal performances is most usefully understood as analogous
to the epistemological status of, e.g., molecules vis-à-vis the
public observable behavior of gases.
[Thought] episodes are ‘in’ language-using
animals as molecular impacts are ‘in’ gases, not as
‘ghosts’ are in ‘machines’.
Unlike molecules, however, which are introduced into kinetic gas theory
as having a specific empirical character (represented by the posited
essentially Newtonian lawfulness of their dynamic interactions), the
thought episodes postulated by that theory as covert states of persons
are introduced by a purely functional analogy. The concept of
an occurrent thought is that of a causally-mediating logico-semantic
role player, whose determinate empirical/ontological character, and
thereby logical space for some form of "identity theory" is so far left
[The] fact that [thoughts] are not introduced as
physiological entities does not preclude the possibility that at a
later methodological stage they may, so to speak, ‘turn
out’ to be such. Thus, there are many who would say that it is
already reasonable to suppose that these thoughts are to be
‘identified’ with complex events in the cerebral cortex . .
Since, on Sellars' account, the concept of a thought is
fundamentally the concept of a functional kind, no ontological tensions
would be generated by the identification within the scientific image of
items belonging to that functional kind with, for instance, states and
episodes of an organism's central nervous system. The manifest
image's conception of person as thinkers, Sellars concludes, can
fuse smoothly with the scientific image's conception of persons
as complex material organisms having a determinate physiological and
The idea that the intentionality of the mental is to be understood
in terms of epistemologically theoretical transpositions of the
semantic categories of public language, themselves interpreted as modes
of functional classification earn Sellars a definitive place
in contemporary analytic philosophy of mind. As Dennett puts it,
Thus was contemporary functionalism in the philosophy of
mind born, and the varieties of functionalism we have subsequently seen
are in one way or another enabled, and directly or indirectly inspired,
by what was left open in Sellars' initial proposal ...
Sellars' proposal that we can illuminate the epistemic status of
mental concepts by an appeal to the contrast between theoretical and
non-theoretical discourse makes sense only against the background of
another central element of his philosophical thought, his comprehensive
critique of the "myth of the given". The philosophical framework of
givenness historically takes on many guises, including not only the
idea that empirical knowledge rests on a foundation, but also,
crucially, the assumption that the "privacy" of the mental and
one's "privileged access" to one's own mental states are
fundamental features of experience, both logically and
epistemologically prior to all intersubjective concepts pertaining to
Sellars argues, on the contrary, that what begins in the case of
inner episodes as a language with a purely theoretical use can acquire
a first-person reporting role. It can turn out to be possible to train
people, in essence by a process of operant conditioning, to have
"privileged access" to some of their inner episodes, that is, to
respond directly and non-inferentially to the occurrence of one thought
with another (meta-) thought to the effect that one is thinking it. It
is a special virtue of this aspect of Sellars' Jonesean story
that it shows how the essential intersubjectivity of language can be
reconciled with the "privacy" of inner episodes, i.e.,
. . . that it helps us understand that concepts pertaining
to such inner episodes as thoughts are primarily and essentially
inter-subjective, as inter-subjective as the concept of a positron, and
that the [first-person] reporting role of these concepts . . .
constitutes a dimension of [their] use . . . which is built on and
presupposes this inter-subjective status. (EPM,189)
At the heart of Sellars' general case against the Myth of the
Given is his articulate recognition of the irreducibly normative
character of epistemic discourse.
The essential point is that in characterizing an episode or
a state as that of knowing, we are not giving an empirical description
of that episode or state, we are placing it in the logical space of
reasons, of justifying and being able to justify what one says.
Once it is acknowledged that the senses per se grasp no facts, that all
knowledge that something is such-and-so (all "subsumption of
particulars under universals") presupposes learning, concept formation,
and even symbolic representation, it follows that ". . . instead of
coming to have a concept of something because we have noticed that sort
of thing, to have the ability to notice a sort of thing is already to
have the concept of that sort of thing, and cannot account for it."
Sellars follows Kant in rejecting the Cartesian picture of a
sensory-cognitive continuum. The "of-ness" of sensations -
e.g., a sensation's being of a red triangle or of a sharp
shooting pain - he insists, is not the intentional "of-ness"
("aboutness") of thoughts. The "rawness" of "raw feels" is rather their
non-conceptual character. (cf. IAMBP,376) Consequently, while
his epistemological views regarding sensory episodes parallel
his treatment of the epistemology of occurrent thoughts,
Sellars' account of the ontology of sensations diverges
dramatically from his functionalist account of thoughts.
In a final episode of the Jonesean myth, sensations are introduced
as elements of an explanatory account of the occurrence in various
circumstances of perceptual cognitions, having determinate semantic
. . . the hero . . . postulates a class of inner -
theoretical - episodes which he calls, say, impressions, and which are
the end results of the impingement of physical objects and processes on
various parts of the body. . . (EPM,191)
This time, however, the model for Jones' theory is not that of
functionally-individuated families of sentences, but rather "a domain
of ‘inner replicas’ which, when brought about in standard
conditions share the perceptible characteristics of their physical
sources". (EPM,191) The leading idea of this model is the occurrence,
‘in’ perceivers of "replicas" per se, not of
perceivings of "replicas" (which would mistakenly inject into the
account of impressions the intentionality of thought), and, although
the entities of this model are particulars, the entities
introduced by the theory are not particulars but rather states of a
perceiving subject. Thus, although talk of the "of-ness" of sensations,
like that of the "of-ness" of thoughts is, on Sellars' view,
fundamentally classificatory, the classification at issue is based not
on a functional (logical, semantic) analogy but rather on analogies
that, although in the first instance extrinsic and causal, ultimately
attribute to sensations a determinate intrinsic content. The specific
point of the model is to insist that states of, e.g., sensing [red
triangle]ly (to highlight the status of ‘sensation’ as a
"verbal noun"), characteristically brought about in normal perceivers
in standard conditions by the action of red triangular objects on the
eyes, can discharge their explanatory jobs in relation to cognitive
perceptual takings (especially non-veridical perceptual judgments) only
if they are conceived as resembling and differing from other sensory
states - e.g., sensing [green triangular]ly, sensing [red square]ly,
etc. - in a manner formally analogous to the way in which objects of
the "replica" model - e.g., red and triangular, green and triangular,
and red and square "wafers" - are conceived to resemble and differ from
If that were the end of Sellars' ontological story regarding
sensations, matters would be complicated enough. But Sellars proceeds
to develop this core account in a variety of different directions, in
consequence of which his full theory of sensations has emerged as being
one of the most difficult and controversial aspects of his
The first complication of Sellars' theory of sensation
results from his conviction that, in the case of sensations,
Jones' theory is interpretive. It does not introduce
new domains of entities, but rather reinterprets the
categorial/ontological status of sensory contents as states of
perceivers. The crux of the original Jonesean theory that the very
color quanta of which we are perceptually aware as existing in
space are instead actually states of persons-qua-perceivers. Already
within the manifest image, then, the ontological status ultimately
accorded to sensory "content qualia" is incompatible with their being
instantiated in physical space.
The second complication of Sellars' theory of sensations
arises from the further conclusion that it is this manifest image
conception of sensory contents as states of perceivers which must
ultimately be synoptically "fused" with the scientific image, and that
the latter's commitment to the idea that those perceivers
themselves are complex systems of micro-physical particles constitutes
a barrier to doing so in any straightforward way. Sellars notoriously
concludes that sensory contents can be synoptically integrated into the
scientific image only after both they and the currently-fundamental
micro-physical particulars of that image as well undergo yet another
categorial transposition into a categorially monistic ontology whose
fundamental entities are all "absolute processes". Sensings qua
absolute processes would then be physical, he writes,
. . . not only in the weak sense of not being mental (i.e.,
conceptual), for they lack intentionality, but in the richer sense of
playing a genuine causal role in the behavior of sentient organisms.
They would, as I have used the terms, be physical-l but not physical-2.
Not being epiphenomenal, they would conform to a basic metaphysical
intuition: to be is to make a difference. (CL,III,126)
Lengthy as this discussion has been, it only begins to capture the
scope, depth, and systematic character of Sellars' philosophical
accomplishments. Many themes from his work have simply gone unmentioned
- his anticipation of epistemological externalism and defense of a
strong internalist alternative, his insightful analysis of predication
and correlative nominalistic alternative to classical Platonistic
categorial ontology, his sophisticated account of induction as a form
of vindicatory practical reasoning, his significant contributions to
ethical theory and the theory of action, and his masterful
interpretations of the work of many of the discipline's great
historical figures, not as scholarly museum exhibits, but always as
active participants in a continuing philosophical conversation. The
bibliographies and Internet resources listed below will point the way
to both more comprehensive and more detailed accounts of the work of
this towering philosophical figure of the postwar era.
- Pure Pragmatics and Possible Worlds-The Early Essays of Wilfrid
Sellars, [PPPW], ed. by Jeffrey F. Sicha, (Ridgeview Publishing
Co; Atascadero, CA; 1980). [Contains a long introductory essay by Sicha
and an extensive bibliography of Sellars' work through
- Science, Perception and Reality, [SPR], (Routledge &
Kegan Paul Ltd; London, and The Humanities Press: New York; 1963)
[Reissued in 1991 by Ridgeview Publishing Co., Atascadero, CA. This
edition contains a complete bibliography of Sellars' published
work through 1989.]
- Philosophical Perspectives, [PP], (Charles C. Thomas:
Springfield, IL; 1967). Reprinted in two volumes, Philosophical
Perspectives: History of Philosophy and Philosophical
Perspective: Metaphysics and Epistemology, (Ridgeview Publishing
Co.; Atascadero, CA; 1977).
- Science and Metaphysics: Variations on Kantian Themes.
[S&M], (Routledge & Kegan Paul Ltd; London, and The Humanities
Press; New York; 1968). The 1966 John Locke Lectures. [Reissued in 1992
by Ridgeview Publishing Co., Atascadero, CA. This edition contains a
complete bibliography of Sellars' published work through 1989, a
register of Sellars' philosophical correspondence, and a listing
of circulated but unpublished papers and lectures.]
- Essays in Philosophy and Its History, [EPH], (D. Reidel
Publishing Co.; Dordrecht, Holland; 1975).
- Naturalism and Ontology, [N&O], (Ridgeview Publishing
Co.; Atascadero, CA: 1979). [An expanded version of the 1974 John Dewey
- The Metaphysics of Epistemology, Lectures by Wilfrid
Sellars, edited by Pedro Amaral, (Ridgeview Publishing Co.;
Atascadero, CA; 1989). [Contains a complete bibliography of
Sellars' published work through 1989.]
- Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind [EPM*], edited by
Robert Brandom, (Harvard University Press.; Cambridge, MA; 1997).
[The original, 1956, version of [EPM] (see below), lacking footnotes
added in [SPR], with an Introduction by Richard Rorty and Study Guide
- [AAE], "Actions and Events", Noûs 7, 1973, pp.
- [AE], "Abstract Entities", Review of Metaphysics 16, 1983;
reprinted in [PP], pp. 229-69.
- [CDCM], "Counterfactuals, Dispositions, and the Causal Modalities",
in Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. II,
ed. by H. Feigl, M. Scriven, and G. Maxwell, (University of Minnesota
Press; Minneapolis, MN: 1957), pp. 225-308.
- [CL], "Foundations for a Metaphysics of Pure Process", The Carus
Lectures for 1977-78, published in The Monist 64, No. 1,
- [EAE], "Empiricism and Abstract Entities", in The Philosophy of
Rudolph Carnap, ed. by P.A. Schilpp (Open Court; LaSalle, IL;
1963); reprinted in [EPH], pp. 245-86.
- [EPM], "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind", in The
Foundations of Science and the Concepts of Psychoanalysis, Minnesota
Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. I, ed. by H. Feigl and
M. Scriven (University of Minnesota Press; Minneapolis, MN; 1956);
reprinted in [SPR], pp. 127-96).
- [FD], "Fatalism and Determinism", in Keith Lehrer, ed., Freedom
and Determinism, (Random House; New York, NY: 1966), pp.
- [GEC], "Givenness and Explanatory Coherence", Journal of
Philosophy 70, 1973, pp. 612-24.
- [I], "…this I or he or it (the thing) which thinks", the
1970 Presidential Address, American Philosophical Association (Eastern
Division), reprinted in [EPH].
- [IAMBP], "The Identity Approach to the Mind-Body Problem",
Review of Metaphysics 18, 1965; reprinted in [PP], pp.
- [IKTE], "The Role of Imagination in Kant's Theory of
Experience", The 1977 Dotterer Lecture, in H.W. Johnstone, Jr., ed.,
Categories: A Colloquium, (Pennsylvania State University
Press: 1977), pp. 231-45.
- [IV], "Induction as Vindication", Philosophy of Science
31, 1964; reprinted in [EPH], pp. 367-416.
- [ISRT], "Is Scientific Realism Tenable", Proceedings of the
PSA, Volume 2, 1976, pp. 307-34.
- [KTE], "Some Remarks on Kant's Theory of Experience",
Journal of Philosophy 64, 1967, pp. 633-47.
- [LT], "The Language of Theories", in Current Issues in the
Philosophy Science, ed. by H. Feigl and G. Maxwell (Henry Holt,
Rhinehart and Winston; New York, NY; 1961): reprinted in [SPR], pp.
- [LTC],"Language as Thought and Communication", Philosophy and
Phenomenological Research 29. 1969; reprinted in [EPH], pp.
- [MFC], "Meaning as Functional Classification", Synthese
27, 1974; pp. 417-37. (Issue also contains comments by Daniel Dennett
and Hilary Putnam and Sellars' replies.)
- [MEV], "Mental Events", Philosophical Studies 81, 1981;
- [MGEC], "More on Givenness and Explanatory Coherence", in George S.
Pappas, ed., Justification and Knowledge, (D. Reidel
Publishing Co.; Dordrecht, Holland: 1979), pp. 169-82.
- [NDL], "Are There Non-Deductive Logics?", in N. Rescher et
al, eds., Essays in Honor of Carl G. Hempel, Synthese
Library, (D. Reidel Publishing Co.; Dordrecht, Holland: 1970), pp.
- [OAFP], "On Accepting First Principles", in J. Tomberlin, ed.,
Philosophical Perspectives 2: Epistemology, 1988, (Ridgeview
Publishing Co.; Atascadero, CA: 1988), pp. 301-14.
- [P], "Phenomenalism", in [SPR], pp. 60-105.
- [PSIM], "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man", in
Frontiers of Science and Philosophy, ed. by Robert Colodny
(University of Pittsburgh Press; Pittsburgh, PA; 1962); reprinted in
[SPR], pp. 1-40.
- [SK], "The Structure of Knowledge", The Matchette Foundation
Lectures for 1971, published in Castañeda, ed., Action,
Knowledge, and Reality (see below).
- [SSMB], "A Semantical Solution of the Mind-Body Problem",
Methodos 5, 1953, pp. 45-82. Reprinted in [PPPW].
- [TA], "Thought and Action", in Keith Lehrer, ed., Freedom and
Determinism, (Random House; New York, NY: 1966), pp. 105-39.
- [TWO], "Time and the World Order", in Minnesota Studies in the
Philosophy of Science, Vol. III, ed. by H. Feigl and G. Maxwell,
(University of Minnesota Press; Minneapolis, MN: 1962), pp.
Major Critical Studies
- Castañeda, H-N., ed. Action, Knowledge, and Reality
[AK&R] (Bobbs-Merrill; Indianapolis, IN; 1975). [Also contains an
extensive bibliography of Sellars' work through 1974,
Sellars' intellectual autobiography, and ‘The Structure of
Knowledge’ (see above).]
- deVries, Willem A., and Timm Triplett, Knowledge, Mind, and the
Given: Reading Wilfrid Sellars' “Empiricism and the
Philosophy of Mind”, (Hackett Publishing Co.; Indianapolis,
IN & Cambridge, MA; 2000). [A detailed commentary on [EPM] (see
above), including the complete text as published with additional
footnotes in [SPR], 1963. The best general introduction to
Sellars' classic essay.]
- Delaney, C.F., Michael J. Loux, Gary Gutting, and W. David Solomon,
The Synoptic Vision: Essays on the Philosophy of Wilfrid
Sellars (University of Notre Dame Press; Notre Dame. IN; 1977).
[Also contains an extensive bibliography.]
- Pitt, Joseph C., ed., The Philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars:
Queries and Extensions [PSQE] (D. Reidel Publishing Co; Dordrecht,
Holland; 1978). [Revised proceedings of a workshop on the Philosophy of
Wilfrid Sellars held at Virginia Polytechnic Institute and State
University in Blacksburg, VA, in November 1976.]
- Pitt, Joseph C., Pictures, Images, and Conceptual Change: An
Analysis of Wilfrid Sellars' Philosophy of Science (D.
Reidel Publishing Co.; Dordrecht, Holland; 1981).
- Seibt, Johanna, Properties as Processes, A Synoptic Study
of Wilfrid Sellars' Nominalism", (Ridgeview Publishing Co.;
Atascadero, CA; 1990.
- Noûs, Vol. 7, No. 2, 1973. [Special issue devoted to
the philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars.]
- The Monist, Vol. 65, No. 3, 1982. [Issue devoted to the
philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars.]
- Philosophical Studies, Vol. 54, No. 2, 1988. [Revised
proceedings of the colloquium on Sellars' philosophy held in
October 1987 at the University of Pittburgh's Center for
Philosophy of Science.]
- Philosophical Studies, Vol. 101, Nos. 2-3, 2000.
[Special issue devoted to the philosophy of Wilfrid Sellars.]
Carnap, Rudolf |
Kant, Immanuel |
mind: philosophy of |
Quine, Willard van Orman |
science, philosophy of
- Alanen, L., "Thought-Talk: Descartes and Sellars
on Intentionality", American Philosophical Quarterly, 29,
1992, pp. 19-34.
- Aune, Bruce, "Sellars' Two Images of the
World", Journal of Philosophy, 87, 1990, pp. 537-45.
- Bernstein, Richard J., "Sellars' Vision of
Man-in-the-Universe", Review of Metaphysics, 20, 1965-66, pp.
- Brandom, Robert, Making It Explicit,
(Harvard University Press; Cambridge, MA; 1995).
- ____________, “Study Guide”, in EPM* (see above).
- ____________, Articulating Reasons: An Introduction to
Inferentialism, (Harvard University Press; Cambridge, MA;,
- Clark, Romane, "Sensibility and Understanding: The
Given of Wilfrid Sellars", The Monist, 65, 1982, 350-64.
- Cornman, James, "Sellars, Scientific Realism, and
Sensa", Review of Metaphysics, 23, 1969-70, pp. 417-51.
- ____________, "Sellars on Scientific Realism and Perceiving", in
Proceedings of the PSA, Volume 2, ed. by F. Suppe and P.D.
Asquith, 1976, pp. 344-58.
- Dennett, Daniel C.,[MTE], "Mid-Term Examination:
Compare and Contrast", in The Intentional Stance (Bradford
Books, The MIT Press; Cambridge, MA; 1987), pp. 339-50.
- Echelbarger, Charles, "Sellars on Thinking and the
Myth of the Given", Philosophical Studies 25, 1974, pp.
- ____________, “An Alleged Legend”, Philosophical
Studies, 39, 1981, pp. 227-46.
- Garfield, Jay, “The Myth of Jones and the
Mirror of Nature: Reflections on Introspection”, Philosophy
and Phenomenological Research, 50, 1989, pp. 1-23.
- Geiger, L., Die Logik der seelischen
Ereignisse. Zu Theorien von L. Wittgenstein und W. Sellars,
(Suhrkamp Verlag; Frankfurt/M: 1969).
- Habermas, Juergen, "Sprachspiel, Intention und
Bedeutung. Zu Motiven bei Sellars und Wittgenstein", in Wiggerhaus, R.,
(ed.), Sprachanalyse und Soziologie. Die sozialwissenschalfliche
Relevanz von Wittgensteins Sprachphilosophie, (Suhrkamp Verlag;
Frankfurt/M: 1975), pp. 319-40.
- Harman, Gilbert H.,
"Sellars' Semantics", The Philosophical
Review 79, 1970, pp. 404-19.
- Hooker, C.A., "Sellars' Argument for the
Inevitability of the Secondary Qualities", Philosophical
Studies 32, 1977, pp. 335-48.
- Koch, Anton F., Vernunft und Sinnlichkeit im
praktischen Denken. Eine sprachbehavioristische Rekonstruktion
Kantisher Theoreme gegen Sellars, (Verlag Königshausen +
Neumann; Würzburg: 1980).
- Kurthen, M., "Qualia, Sensa und Absolute Prozesse.
Zu W. Sellars' Kritik des psychocerebalen Reduktionismus",
Journal for General Philosophy of Science (Zeitschrift für
Allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie), 21, 1990, 25-41.
- Marras, Antonio, "Sellars on Thought and
Language", Noûs 7, 1973, pp. 152-63.
- ____________, "On Sellars' Linguistic Theory of Conceptual
Activity", Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 2, 1973, pp.
- ____________, "Reply to Sellars", Canadian Journal of
Philosophy, 2, 1973, pp. 495-501.
- ____________, "Sellars' Behaviourism: A Reply to Fred
Wilson", Philosophical Studies, 30, 1976, pp. 413-18.
- McDowell, John, Mind and World, (Harvard
University Press; Cambridge, MA; 1994).
- ____________, “Having the World in View: Sellars, Kant, and
Intentionality”, Journal of Philosophy, 95, 1998, pp.
- McGilvray, J.A., "Pure Process(es)?",
Philosophical Studies 43, 1983, pp. 243-51.
- Meyers, R.G., "Sellars' Rejection of
Foundations", Philosophical Studies, 39, 1981, pp. 61-78.
- Pohlenz, G., "Phänomenale Realität und
naturalistische Philosophie. Eine systematische Widerlegung der
Feigl'schen und Sellars'schen Theorien phänomenaler
Qualitäten und Skizze einer alternativen Theorie", Zeitschrift
für philosophische Forschung, 44, 1990, 106-42.
- Richardson, R.C. and Muilenburg, G., "Sellars and
Sense Impressions", Erkenntnis, 17, 1982, pp. 171-211.
- Rosenberg, Jay F., "The Elusiveness of Categories,
the Archimedean Dilemma, and the Nature of Man", in Castañeda,
ed., [AK&R](see above), pp. 147-84.
- ____________, "Linguistic Roles and Proper Names", in Pitt, [PSQE]
(see above), pp. 189-216.
- ____________, "The Place of Color in the Scheme of Things: A
Roadmap to Sellars' Carus Lectures", The Monist, 65, 3,
1982, pp. 315-35.
- ____________, "Wilfrid Sellars' Philosophy of Mind" in
Contemporary Philosophy, 4: Philosophy of Mind, ed. by Guttorm
Floistad, (Martinus Nijhoff Publishers; 1983), pp. 417-39.
- ____________, [FI] "Fusing the Images: Nachruf for Wilfrid
Sellars", Journal for General Philosophy of Science
(Zeitschrift für allgemeine Wissenschaftstheorie), Vol.
XXI, No. 1, 1990, pp. 3-25.
- ____________, "Response to Aune, "Sellars' Two Images of the
World"", (Abstract), The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 87, No.
10, October, 1990, pp. 546-7.
- ____________, “Wilfrid Sellars und die
Theorie-Theorie”, Deutsche Zeitschrift für
Philosophie, 48, 2000, pp. 639-655.
- ____________, “Sellars, Wilfrid Stalker”, entry in
A Companion to Analytic Philosophy, A. Martinich & D.
Sosa, eds., (Blackwell Publishing Ltd; Oxford: 2001), pp. 239-53.
- Rottschaefer, W.A., "Verbal Behaviorism and
Theoretical Mentalism: An Assessment of the Marras-Sellars Dialogue",
Philosophical Research Archives, 9, 1983, pp. 511-33.
- Seibt, Johanna, "Analysis without synopsis must be
blind. Obituary for W. Sellars", Erkenntnis, 33, 1990, pp.
- ____________, "Wilfrid Sellars' systematischer Nominalismus",
Information Philosophie, 3, 1995, pp. 22-6.
- Sicha, Jeffrey, The Metaphysics of Elementary
Mathematics, (University of Massachusetts Press; Amherst, MA:
- Smart, J.J.C., "Sellars on Process", The
Monist 65, 1982, pp. 302-14.
- Sosa, Ernest, “Mythology of the
Given”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 14, 1997, pp.
- Tye, Michael, "The Adverbial Theory: A Defense of
Sellars against Jackson", Metaphilosophy, 6, 1975, pp.
- van Fraassen, Bas C., "Wilfrid Sellars on
Scientific Realism", Dialogue 14, 1975, pp. 606-16.
- ____________, "On the Radical Incompleteness of the Manifest
Image", Proceedings of the PSA, Volume 2, ed. by F. Suppe and
P.D. Asquith, 1976, pp. 335-43.
- Vinci, T., "Sellars and the Adverbial Theory of
Sensation", Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 11, 1981, pp.
- Wilson, Fred, "Marras on Sellars on Thought and
Language", Philosophical Studies, 28, 1975, pp. 91-102.
- Woods, M., "Sellars on Kantian Intuitions",
Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 44, 1984, pp.
- Wright, E.L., "A Defense of Sellars",
Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 46, 1985, pp.
Copyright © 1997, 2002
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy