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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Johannes (c.800 - c.877), who signed himself as ‘Eriugena’ in one manuscript, and who was referred to by his contemporaries as ‘the Irishman’ (scottus — in the 9th century Ireland was referred to as ‘Scotia Maior’ and its inhabitants as ‘scotti’) is the most significant Irish intellectual of the early monastic period. He is generally recognized to be both the outstanding philosopher (in terms of originality) of the Carolingian era and of the whole period of Latin philosophy stretching from Boethius to Anselm. Eriugena is also, though this parallel remains to be explored, more or less a contemporary of the Arab Neoplatonist Al-Kindi. Since the seventeenth century, it has become usual to refer to this Irish philosopher as John Scottus (or ‘Scotus’) Eriugena to distinguish him from the thirteenth-century John Duns Scotus.
Eriugena's uniqueness lies in the fact that, quite remarkably for a scholar in Western Europe in the Carolingian era, he had considerable familiarity with the Greek language, affording him access to the Greek Christian theological tradition, from the Cappadocians to Gregory of Nyssa, hitherto almost entirely unknown in the Latin West. He also produced a complete, if somewhat imperfect, Latin translation of the Corpus Dionysii, the works of the obscure, possibly Syrian, Christian Neoplatonist, Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite, a follower of Proclus. In addition, Eriugena translated Gregory of Nyssa’s De hominis opificio and Maximus Confessor's Ambigua ad Iohannem, and possibly other works, such as Epiphanius' Anchoratus.
Eriugena's thought is best understood as a sustained attempt to create a consistent, systematic, Christian Neoplatonism from diverse but primarily Christian sources. Eriugena had a unique gift for identifying the underlying intellectual framework, broadly Neoplatonic but also deeply Christian, assumed by the writers of the Christian East. Drawing especially on Basil, Gregory of Nyssa, Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite, Maximus Confessor, as well as on the more familiar authorities (auctores) of the Latin West (e.g. Cicero, Martianus Capella, Augustine, Boethius), he developed a highly original cosmology, where the highest principle, the ‘the immovable self-identical one’ (unum et idipsum immobile, Periphyseon, Patrologia Latina CXXII I. 476b), engenders all things and retrieves them back into itself. Contrary to what some earlier commentators supposed, it is most unlikely that Eriugena had direct knowledge of the original texts of Plotinus, Porphyry, Proclus, or other pagan Neoplatonists, but he did have some direct knowledge of Plato (a portion of Timaeus in the translation of Calcidius) as well as familiarity with the pseudo-Augustinian Categoriae decem.
Overall, Eriugena develops a Neoplatonic cosmology according to which the infinite, transcendent and ‘unknown’ God, who is beyond being and non-being, through a process of self-articulation, procession, or ‘self-creation’, proceeds from his divine ‘darkness’ or ‘non-being’ into the light of being, speaking the Word who is understood as Christ, and at the same timeless moment bringing forth the Primary Causes of all creation. These causes in turn proceed into their Created Effects and as such are creatures entirely dependent on, and will ultimately return to, their sources, which are the Causes or Ideas in God. These Causes, considered as diverse and infinite in themselves, are actually one single principle in the divine One. The whole of reality or nature, then, is involved in a dynamic process of outgoing (exitus) from and return (reditus) to the One. God is the One or the Good or the highest principle, which transcends all, and which therefore may be said to be ‘the non-being that transcends being’. In an original departure from traditional Neoplatonism, in his dialogue Periphyseon, this first and highest cosmic principle is called ‘nature’ (natura) and is said to include both God and creation.
Nature is defined as universitas rerum, the ‘totality of all things’, and includes both the things which are (ea quae sunt) as well as those which are not (ea quae non sunt). This divine nature may be divided into a set of four ‘species’ or ‘divisions’ (divisiones) which nevertheless retain their unity with their source. These four divisions of nature taken together are to be understood as God, presented as the ‘Beginning, Middle and End of all things’.
Apart from having a minor influence in France in the ninth century, Eriugena's cosmological speculations appear too conceptually advanced for the philosophers and theologians of his time, and his philosophical system was generally neglected in the tenth and eleventh centuries. His main work, Periphyseon, was revived by twelfth-century Neoplatonists, and also circulated in a compendium, Clavis Physicae [The Key of Nature] of Honorius Augustodunensis. The Periphyseon was popular among the philosophers of Chartres and St. Victor (e.g. Hugh of St. Victor refers to it) but was condemned in the thirteenth century, alongside the writings of David of Dinant and Amaury of Bène, for promoting the identity of God and creation. In the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries, Eriugena continued to have a relatively clandestine but still important influence on Christian Neoplatonists such as Meister Eckhart and especially Nicholas of Cusa. The first printed editions of his works appeared in the seventeenth century, but it was not until the nineteenth century that interest in him was revived, especially among followers of Hegel who saw Eriugena as a forerunner to speculative idealism, as a ‘Proclus of the West’ (Hauréau) and the ‘Father of Speculative Philosophy’ (Huber). The first truly scholarly attempt to establish the facts of his life, his works and influence was by the Belgian scholar Maiul Cappuyns, whose 1933 work Jean Scot Erigène: sa vie, son oeuvre, sa pensée is still reliable. Many valuable twentieth-century studies (e.g. Contreni, Marenbon, Schrimpf, O’Meara) have explored Eriugena’s Carolingian background and continuity with Latin authors. However, systematic studies of his thought (Beierwaltes, Gersh, Moran) have also recognized him as a highly original metaphysician and speculative thinker of the first rank whose work transcends the limitations of his age and mode of expression.
Nothing is known about Eriugena's place or date of birth or of the circumstances of his early life, but, on the basis of circumstantial evidence and some surviving testimonia (helpfully gathered in Brennan, 1986), it is conjectured that he was born in Ireland around 800 or possibly slightly earlier (c. 790). His Irish provenance is confirmed by the fact that he self-consciously signed his translation of Pseudo-Dionysius’ works with the neologism ‘Eriugena’ (Patrologia Latina, hereafter PL, CXXII 1236a) meaning ‘Irish born’, a word possibly modelled on the Virgilian ‘Graiugena’ found in one of his poems and also in Columbanus’ Ad Filiolum 119.. The word ‘Eriugena’ became corrupted to ‘Erigena’ in twelfth century library entries (e.g. the Cluny catalogue) and by the seventeenth century it became common to refer to him as ‘John Scot(t)us Erigena’ (e.g. by Bishop Ussher and Thomas Gale). A scattering of Old Irish words used to explain difficult or recondite Latin terms, in his Biblical glosses (Glossae, edited by Contreni and Ó Néill, 1997), is further evidence of his Irish origin and of the presence of Irish students in his audience (since the time of Charlemagne Irish scholars had constituted a considerable presence in the Frankish court, where they were renowned for their learning).
Eriugena’s first certain appearance in historical records occurs around 850/1 where mention is made, in a letter by Bishop Pardulus of Laon, of ‘a certain Irishman, named Johannes, who is at the palace of the king’ (“Scotum illum qui est in palatio regis, joannem nomine”, Epistola ad ecclesiam Lugdunensem, in De tribus epistolis, PL CXXI 1052a), who was engaged in a theological controversy with Gottschalk of Fulda. It is also certain that Johannes had been installed for some time at the court of Charles the Bald, the Westfrankish king, but he was also associated with other ecclesiastical centers, including Rheims, Laon, Soissons and Compigne. There is no direct evidence that he was a monk or cleric (he refers to his ‘frater in Christo’ [“brother in Christ”]) Wulfad, who later became a bishop, but this appellation does not definitively confirm Eriugena’s own church status.
Eriugena had a justified reputation among his contemporaries as a man of considerable learning. Florus calls him scholasticus et eruditus (PL CXIX 103a) and Anastasius, the Vatican librarian of the day, marveled at the fact that this ‘barbarian’ (vir barbarus) from a remote land knew Greek. Two partial commentaries (c. 840-c.850) on De nuptiis Philologiae et Mercurii [The Marriage of Philolology and Mercury], the liberal arts handbook of the late Latin author, Martianus Capella, survive from Eriugena’s period as royal master, as well as the Biblical glosses, Glossae Divinae Historiae, all of which attest to his skill as a grammaticus. Eriugena has a rich and eclectic knowledge of the liberal arts tradition, including Isidore, Cassiodorus, and Cicero. He had a reputation for dialectic as his opponents recognized when they criticized him for bringing his dialectical skills to bear on theological discussion. Thus his critic Prudentius remarked: ‘Your Capella has led you into a labyrinth, because you have tied yourself more to the meditation of his work than to the truth of the Gospel’ (PL CXV 1294a). The Martianus commentary is most famous for its apparent espousal of a non-Ptolemaic account of the movement of the planets in Book Seven on astronomy. Pierre Duhem thought that Eriugena was offering a version of the system later proposed by Tycho Brahe, and in fact Eriugena is correctly reporting Martianus’ account which seems to be a version of Heraclides of Pontus’ theory. Indeed, Copernicus would later single out Martianus for praise for his theory that Mercury and Venus orbit the sun instead of the earth. Eriugena went further than Martianus in placing Mars and Jupiter in orbit around the sun also.
Eriugena first came to historical notice when he was commissioned by two French bishops — Archbishop Hincmar of Rheims and Bishop Pardulus of Laon — to refute a treatise by a Saxon monk, Gottschalk (806-68), a priest of Orbais in the diocese of Soissons, who interpreted St. Augustine as teaching a ‘twofold’ or ‘twin predestination’ (gemina praedestinatio) of the elect to heaven and of the damned to hell, based on the opinion of St. Isidore, Sententiae II, 6, I (PL LXXXIII 606a). Gottschalk had already been condemned by a synod at Mainz in 848 and another at Quierzy in 849 and had been imprisoned in the abbey of Hautvillers (where he remained until his death in 868), but Prudentius, the bishop of Troyes, appeared to side with him. Hincmar was worried that Gottschalk’s side was attracting powerful supporters and he engaged Eriugena to write a strong rebuttal. Eriugena's response, De divina praedestinatione (On Divine Predestination, c. 851, ed. Madec, 1978), a treatise of nineteen chapters, which survives in a single manuscript, is a robust rebuttal of Gottschalk. Eriugena rejects any divine predestination to evil by an appeal to God's unity, transcendence and goodness. While purporting merely to interpret Augustinian texts, this early theological treatise is philosophically significant for its rationalistic, dialectical analysis of key theological concepts and its reliance on argument rather than scriptural citation. In this treatise, Eriugena, citing Augustine's De uera religione 5, 8, claims ‘that true philosophy is true religion and conversely that true religion is true philosophy’. As one gloss in the Annotationes in Marcianum attests: ‘no one enters heaven except through philosophy’ (nemo intrat in celum nisi per philosophiam, Annotationes 57.15, Lutz, 1939, p. 64). Eriugena then argues that philosophy has four principal parts — division, definition, demonstration, and resolution — and that pursuit of this fourfold method of reasoning will lead to truth. This stress on dialectic as the path to truth is a constant theme of Eriugena's philosophy, one recognized by his contemporaries.
Eriugena argues in De divina praedestinatione that God, being perfectly good, wants all humans to be saved, and does not predestine souls to damnation. God's being is His willing and ‘no necessity binds the will of God’. On the contrary, humans damn themselves through their own free choices: ‘Sin, death, unhappiness are not from God’. Since God is outside time, He cannot be said to fore-know or to pre-destine, terms that involve temporal predicates. Furthermore, if God's being is His wisdom, God can be said to have but a single knowledge and hence a ‘double’ predestination cannot be ascribed to Him. Human nature, on the other hand, was created rational, and rationality requires freedom. Human nature is therefore essentially free: ‘For God did not create in man a captive will but a free one, and that freedom remained after sin’.
In the course of his diatribe against the ‘ravings’ of Gottschalk, Eriugena locates his opponent's heresy as midway between the heresy of Pelagius, which rejects the power of grace, and the opposing heresy, which denies the possibility of human freedom. Ironically, Eriugena himself would in turn be accused of ‘Origenism’ and ‘Pelagianism’ by Gottschalk's advocate, Bishop Prudentius of Troyes (see the latter's De Praedestinatione, PL CXV 1010c), due to his perceived emphasis on human free-will in the salvific process. Prudentius, an erstwhile admirer of Scottus, published an opposing treatise, which, while acknowledging his ‘Irish eloquence’ (Celtica eloquentia, PL CXV 1194a), dismisses Eriugena's reasoning as confused and not based on sound knowledge of scripture. Florus too attacked Eriugena. Subsequently, On Divine Predestination was condemned by the bishops in France at the councils of Valence (855) and Langres (859), in part for its over-use of logical method or dialectic (dialectica). The phrase ‘Irish porridge’ (pultes scottorum), recalling Jerome's sneer against Pelagius, is used in these official denunciations.
Despite the official ecclesiastical condemnations of On Predestination, for reasons that are not known but are presumed to be political, Eriugena continued to have the protection and patronage of King Charles the Bald, who, around 860, invited him to translate the writings of Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite, a mysterious Christian Neoplatonist who purported to be Dionysius, the first convert of St. Paul at Athens, but was more likely a late fifth or early sixth-century Christian follower of Proclus. The Corpus Dionysii had been given a gift to Charles the Bald's father, Louis the Pious, from the Byzantine Emperor Michael the Stammerer in 827, a gift thought appropriate possibly because of a misidentification of Pseudo-Dionysius with the patron saint of France, St. Denis. Hilduin had attempted an earlier translation in 832-5, but Eriugena's version was most successful and remained in circulation until the thirteenth century when Jean Sarrazin's translation replaced it.
The discovery of Dionysius had a profound effect on Eriugena's thinking. He enthusiastically adopted the Areopagite's main ideas (many of which appear to be drawn from Proclus’ Commentary on the Parmenides), e.g. the distinction between affirmative and negative theology, according to which denials concerning God (e.g. ‘God is not good [in the way we know goodness]’) are ‘more true’, (verior) ‘better’, ‘more apt’, than affirmations (‘God is good’), as well as the analysis of the divine names as applying only metaphorically (metaphorice, transferre, per metaphoram) and not literally (proprie) to God, who is ‘beyond all that is’. For Pseudo-Dionysius, we do not know God directly but know Him only through his theophaniai, or divine appearances (Pseudo-Dionysius, Divine Names, ch. 7, PG III 869c-d). We could, in affirmative theology, attribute attributes to God, because He is the ‘cause of all’ (aitia panton, Mystical Theology, ch. 2, PG III 1000b), but in fact God in His nature is transcendent and ‘unknowable’, he is the ‘more-than-divine divinity’, which Eriugena renders as superdeus deitas in his translation (PL CXXII 1121c). Pseudo-Dionysius claims that God is the affirmation of all things, the negation of all things, and beyond all affirmation and denial (in Eriugena's translation: God is omnium positio, omnium ablatio, super omnem positionem et ablationem inter se invicem, PL CXXII 1121 c-d).
Soon after completing his translation of Pseudo-Dionysius (c. 862), he went on to translate other Greek Christian texts, including Gregory of Nyssa's De hominis opificio, under the title of De imagine, which provided Eriugena with an account of human nature as an image of the divine, and possibly Epiphanius’ Anchoratus. De Fide. Eriugena also wrote a long commentary on Pseudo-Dionysius’ Celestial Hierarchy (Expositiones in hierarchiam coelestem) and translated and commented on Maximus’ Ambigua ad Ioannem and translated his Quaestiones ad Thalassium. It is possible he made other translations which have not survived or which cannot be definitively attributed to him.
Eriugena's major dialogue, Periphyseon, also entitled in some manuscripts, De divisione naturae [On the Division of Nature], was probably begun in the early 860s, just after he had completed the Pseudo-Dionysius translation, and finished around 867 (the date Wulfad, to whom the work is dedicated, became bishop, making it unlikely that Eriugena would have referred to him as frater, brother, after his consecration as bishop). The first printed edition of this dialogue appeared in 1681 and subsequently an edition by Floss appeared in 1853 which is now contained in PL CXXII. Inglis Patrick Sheldon-Williams (1908-1973) began a new edition of Periphyseon with the publication of his text and translation of Book One in 1968 in the Scriptores Latini Hiberniae series of the Dublin Institute of Advanced Studies, followed soon after by his edition of Periphyseon Book Two in 1970, and Book Three, published after Sheldon-Willams’ death, in the same series in 1981, seen through the press by the late John J. O’Meara. Sheldon-Williams had assembled materials for the edition of Books Four and Five and had completed a draft English translation of these books, which was published separately in one volume edited by John J. O’Meara. O’Meara and Édouard Jeauneau continued the edition of Sheldon-Williams, bringing out Book Four in the same series in 1995. Book Five is still scheduled to appear. However, due to some deficiencies in Sheldon-Williams’ manner of editing, and his mistaken conception of the manuscript tree, Jeauneau has undertaken an entirely new edition of the Periphyseon for the Corpus Christianorum Continuatio Medievalis series. So far three volumes have appeared in this series and two more are in process. Sheldon-Williams was of the opinion that Periphyseon Book One had emerged from an earlier ‘essay in dialectic’, but offered no evidence for this interpretation, which takes an overly restrictive view of the first book of the dialogue. The main weakness of Sheldon-Williams’ editing strategy was that it had conflated various versions of the text drawn from several different manuscripts into a single composite script, in a similar manner to the earlier editors, Thomas Gale in 1681 and Floss in 1853. Gale and Floss had published editions that combined into a single text both the text of the main body of the manuscript and the various marginal annotations in different hands. This composite version disguised the gradual evolution of the text and Jeauneau is of the opinion that this mixed type of edition is inadequate to the needs of scholarship. The new Jeauneau edition is based on six manuscripts, including two manuscripts, Paris Bibl. nat. lat. 12965 and Bamberg Phil. 2/2, not used by Sheldon-Williams since they contained only Books Four and Five. Jeauneau has suggested that the extant manuscripts of the Periphyseon show four distinct levels of development, that is, four early ‘editions’. One special difficulty in editing the Periphyseon is that the earliest manuscripts preserve only the first three books whereas the extant manuscripts for Books Four and Five date from the twelfth century. Avranches and Cambridge, both twelfth century manuscripts, are the sole witnesses for the end of Book Four and the whole of Book Five in Stage Two versions, with Avranches noticeably less accurate than Cambridge in several places.
The Periphyseon, deeply influenced by Eriugena's engagement with Greek Christian authors, is a work of astonishing scope, a veritable Neoplatonic summa. At the beginning of Book Four Eriugena labels his enterprise a physiologia, a ‘study of nature’, and indeed one manuscript of the Periphyseon in the British Library in London calls the whole dialogue ‘Liber Phisiologiae Iohannis Scottigenae’. The term ‘physiologia’ is apt in that the term ‘nature’ for Eriugena spans the whole cosmological domain, including not just created nature but also the Divine Creator, and treats of the essentially dialectical relation between Creator and created, where God expresses Himself in creation and creation culminates in return to the divine. Nature is to be understood as what is real in the widest sense, the totality of all things that are and are not. Nature includes both God and creation and has four divisions: nature which creates and is not created (God), nature which creates and is created (the Primordial Causes), nature which is created and does not create (the Created Temporal Effects), and nature which is neither created nor creates (Non-Being). The original intention (expressed at III.619d-620b) was to devote one book to each of the four divisions; thus Book One deals with the divine nature and the procession or exitus of all things from God, Book Two treats of the Primordial Causes and Book Three their Created Effects, including the nature of ex nihilo creation and the stages of the creation of the world. The topic of creation requires Eriugena to address issues connected with the Biblical account of creation, and thus, in Book Three, he embarks on his own version of a Hexaemeron. The momentous event of the emergence of human nature on the Sixth Day of creation requires extended treatment, and Eriugena is forced to devote a fourth book to this topic, thus relegating the return of all things to God to a fifth book. Thus Eriugena was forced to depart from his original plan of four books and add a fifth. This change of plan is particularly important in that it helps to identify different stages of composition of the text.
A fragmentary Commentary on the Gospel of St. John (Commentarius in Evangelium Iohannis) and a sermon (Homilia in Johannem) on the Prologue to St John's Gospel were also written probably in the late 860s or 870s. A number of interesting poems survive which show the breadth of Eriugena's learning; but also portray him as a courtier quite well versed in political affairs. Some poems are written specifically in praise of the king, including an important poem, Aulae sidereae [Starry Halls] which appears to celebrate the dedication of Charles the Bald's new church in Compigne on 1 May 875. The poems show Eriugena's fascination with Greek, indeed some poems are written entirely in Greek. It is probable that Eriugena died sometime around 877. An apocryphal tale, dating from the twelfth century, records that Eriugena was stabbed to death by his students with their pens!
Despite the claims of some nineteenth-century commentators, it is now clear that Eriugena did not have direct knowledge of the writings of Plotinus, Porphyry or Proclus. He had almost no contact with pagan Neoplatonism in general (apart possibly from Priscianus Lydus and Calcidius' translation of the Timaeus). His familiarity with Aristotle was also indirect — through the anonymous but widely circulated compilation, Categoriae decem, the Pseudo-Augustinian paraphrase of Aristotle's Categories. He knew Boethius’ trinitarian tracts (Opuscula sacra) and possibly the Consolation of Philosophy, since a set of glosses on this work may be in Eriugena's hand (although this is disputed). His chief authorities in the Latin Christian Tradition were the works of the Fathers, chiefly Augustine (especially his De Genesi ad litteram), Ambrose, Hilary of Poitiers, and Jerome. His originality is largely due to the manner in which he assimilated (often translating) the Neoplatonic thought of Eastern Christian writers such as the Cappadocians, Basil, Gregory of Nyssa, Gregory Nazianzus, as well as Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite and Maximus Confessor. He also had familiarity with Rufinus’ Latin translation of Origen's On First Principles and was often linked with Origen in medieval times. Though he took the view that the authorities of East and West were not in conflict, nevertheless he usually expressed a preference for the Eastern Church Fathers. An especially important authority was Maximus Confessor, whose account of the return of all things Eriugena copiously borrowed.
Eriugena's exceptional learning would be sufficient to distinguish him from contemporary Carolingian scholars, such as Alcuin and Sedulius Scottus; but his true and lasting genius lay in his ability to combine elements from these auctores into a new cosmological framework which is rationally argued to the highest degree. Eriugena enthusiastically incorporated many Greek Christian theological concepts. God, the One, creates by self-emanation. Creation is a timeless, and hence on-going and always contemporary, event. Human nature is originally a Platonic Idea in the mind of God: human nature is a certain intellectual concept formed eternally in the mind of God, Periphyseon, IV.768b). Humans fail to understand their true nature as image of God in God, because they are distracted by created, fleeting temporal ‘appearances’ (phantasiai), which entrap the intellect in the clouded spatio-temporal realm of sense. However, through intellectual contemplation (theoria, intellectus) and divine illumination (which is the receiving of a divine self-manifestation, theophania), humans may achieve unification (henosis) with God, and the select few will even undergo ‘deification’ (deificatio, theosis) which Eriugena interprets as complete identity with God. Eriugena often quotes Augustine to the effect that God became man so that humans can become God; inhumanatio leads to deificatio. In his discussion of this cosmological saga, Eriugena always appeals to dialectic and the order of reasons. For Eriugena, true philosophy is vera ratio and indeed, all appeal to authority is nothing other than an appeal to right reason (Periphyseon, I.511b). Eriugena is therefore a strongly rationalistic philosopher, struggling to make sense of scriptural revelation in terms consistent with the evidence of reason. Thus, in the Periphyseon IV.781c-d, he makes the bold claim that one need only introduce the ‘opinions of the holy Fathers’ where ‘the gravest necessity requires that human reason be supported for the sake of those who, being untrained in it, are more amenable to authority than reason’.
Eriugena's masterpiece is undoubtedly the Periphyseon (written c.862- c.867), a long dialogue in five books between an anonymous ‘Teacher’ (nutritor) and his ‘Student’ (alumnus) that attempts to be a compendium of all knowledge presented within a Neoplatonic cosmology of the procession and return of all things from the divine One.
Book One opens abruptly with the claim that ‘nature’ (natura), ‘the general term for all things that are and all things that are not,’ (I.441a), including both God and creation, is divided into four species. Echoing similar divisions in Augustine (De civitate Dei Bk. V. 9, PL xli.151) and Marius Victorinus (Ad Candidum), nature's four ‘divisions’ or ‘species’ are: that which creates and is not created (i.e. God); that which creates and is created (i.e. Primary Causes or Ideas); that which is created and does not create (i.e. Temporal Effects, created things); that which is neither created nor creates (i.e. non-being, nothingness). The first species of nature is God, “the cause of all things that are and that are not” (I.442b). There are several remarkable aspects of this division. First of all, division is defined by Eriugena in De praedestinatione as a branch of dialectic. Dialectic, moreover, is not just about the organization of words and thoughts but also describes the structure of reality itself. Secondly, the four divisions are not strictly a hierarchy in the usual Neoplatonic sense where there are higher and lower orders, rather, as Eriugena will explain, the first and fourth divisions both refer to God as the Beginning and End of all things, and the second and third divisions may also be thought to express the unity of the cause-effect relation. Finally, the division is an attempt to show that nature is a dialectical coming together of being and non-being. Creation is normally understood as coming into being from non-being. God as creator is then a kind of transcendent non-being above the being of creation. These themes are rigorously discussed and disentangled throughout the dialogue.
Immediately following on his abrupt announcement of the four divisions of nature, Eriugena proceeds to list ‘five ways of interpreting’ (quinque modi interpretationis) the manner in which things may be said to be or not to be (Periphyseon, I.443c-446a). According to the first mode, things accessible to the senses and the intellect are said to be, whereas anything which, ‘through the excellence of its nature’ (per excellentiam suae naturae), transcends our faculties are said not to be. According to this classification, God, because of his transcendence is said not to be. He is ‘nothingness through excellence’ (nihil per excellentiam).
The second mode of being and non-being is seen in the ‘orders and differences of created natures’ (I.444a), whereby, if one level of nature is said to be, those orders above or below it are said not to be:
For an affirmation concerning the lower (order) is a negation concerning the higher, and so too a negation concerning the lower (order) is an affirmation concerning the higher. (Periphyseon, I.444a)
According to this mode, the affirmation of man is the negation of angel and vice versa (affirmatio enim hominis negatio est angeli, negatio vero hominis affirmatio est angeli, I.444b). This mode illustrates Eriugena's original way of dissolving the traditional Neoplatonic hierarchy of being into a dialectic of affirmation and negation: to assert one level is to deny the others. In other words, a particular level may be affirmed to be real by those on a lower or on the same level, but the one above it is thought not to be real in the same way. If humans are thought to exist in a certain way, then angels do not exist in that way.
The third mode (I.444c-45b) contrasts the being of actual things with the ‘non-being’ of potential or possible things still contained, in Eriugena's memorable phrase, ‘in the most secret folds of nature’ (in secretissimis naturae sinibus). This mode contrasts things which have come into effect with those things which are still contained in their causes. According to this mode, actual things, which are the effects of the causes, have being, whereas those things which are still virtual in the Primary Causes (e.g. the souls of those as yet unborn) are said not to be.
The fourth mode (I.445b-c) offers a roughly Platonic criterion for being: those things contemplated by the intellect alone (ea solummodo quae solo comprehenduntur intellectu) may be considered to be, whereas things caught up in generation and corruption, viz. matter, place and time, do not truly exist. The assumption is that things graspable by intellect alone belong to a realm above the material, corporeal world and hence are timeless.
The fifth mode offered by Eriugena is essentially theological and applies solely to humans: those sanctified by grace are said to be, whereas sinners who have renounced the divine image are said not to be.
One of the striking features of this complex — and certainly, in this form, original — account is that being and non-being are treated as correlative categories: something may be said to be under one mode and not to be under another. Attribution of being is subject to the dialectic of affirmation and negation. Eriugena returns in Book Three to give a very complex discussion of the meaning of ‘ex nihilo’ in the concept of creatio ex nihilo, which makes use of some of these modes of being and non-being, and, in general, these modes should be borne in mind when interpreting Eriugena's more overt metaphysical statements. Thus when Eriugena calls God ‘nothing’, he means that God transcends all created being, God is nihil per excellentiam (‘nothingness on account of excellence’) or, as he puts it, nihil per infinitatem (‘nothingness on account of infinity’). Matter, on the other hand, is also called ‘nothing’ but it is ‘nothing through privation’ (nihil per privationem). Similarly, created things are called ‘nothing’ because they do not contain in themselves their principles of subsistence (Eriugena is here repeating St. Augustine's view that the creature, considered apart from God, is mere nothing).
God is a ‘nothingness’ (nihilum) whose real essence is unknown to all created beings, including the angels (447c). Indeed, Eriugena argues in a radical manner, following Maximus Confessor, that God's nature is infinite and uncircumscribable, such that He is unknown even to Himself, since He is the ‘infinity of infinities’ and beyond all comprehension and circumscription. In the Periphyseon, Eriugena repeats the position of the De Praedestinatione that God does not know evil, and, in a genuine sense, God may be said not to know anything; his ignorance is the highest wisdom.
Eriugena conceives of the act of creation as a kind of self manifestation wherein the hidden transcendent God creates himself by manifesting himself in divine outpourings or theophanies (I.446d). He moves from darkness into the light, from self-ignorance into self-knowledge. The divine self-creation or self-manifestation (I.455b) is, at the same time (or rather timelessly), the expression of the Word and hence the creation of all other things, since all things are contained in the Word. The Word enfolds in itself the Ideas or Primary Causes of all things and in that sense all things are always already in God:
...the Creative nature permits nothing outside itself because outside it nothing can be, yet everything which it has created and creates it contains within itself, but in such a way that it itself is other, because it is superessential, than what it creates within itself (Periphyseon, III.675c).
God's transcendent otherness above creatures is precisely that which allows creatures to be within God and yet other than God. Eriugena stresses both the divine transcendence above and immanence in creation. The immanence of God in the world is at the same time the immanence of creatures within God. Creatures however, as fallen, do not yet know that they reside in God. In cosmological terms, however, God and the creature are one and the same:
It follows that we ought not to understand God and the creature as two things distinct from one another, but as one and the same. For both the creature, by subsisting, is in God; and God, by manifesting himself, in a marvelous and ineffable manner creates himself in the creature... (Periphyseon, III.678c).
Elsewhere Eriugena's asserts that God is the ‘essence of all things’ (essentia omnium) and the ‘form of all things’ (forma omnium). In the thirteenth century, expressions such as these led to the accusation of heresy, i.e. that Eriugena is collapsing the difference between God and creation. It must be noted, however, that although Eriugena asserts the identity of God and creation, he explicitly rejects the view that God is the ‘genus’ or ‘whole’ (totum) of which the creatures are ‘species’ or ‘parts’. Only metaphorically (metaforice, translative) can it be said that God is a ‘genus’ or a ‘whole’. Assertions concerning the immanence of God in creation are always balanced in Eriugena's writings by assertions of God's transcendence above all things. God is both ‘form of all things’ and also is without form, formless. Since God cannot be said to be anything, God cannot be simply identified with any or every creature either.
The main focus of the Second Book of the Periphyseon is an analysis of what Eriugena terms ‘the Primary Causes’ (causae primordiales) which are the patterns of all things located in the mind of God and function as the timeless and unchanging causes of all created things. This doctrine represents an eclectic combination of various earlier doctrines, including the Platonic theory of Forms or ideai, Dionysius’ discussion of the divine names, and Augustine's revival of the Stoic notion of eternal reasons (rationes aeternae).
God's mind, understood as the logos or verbum, contains in one undivided Form all the reasons for every individual thing. These reasons (rationes, logoi) are productive of the things of which they are the reasons. Their number is infinite and none has priority over the other, e.g., Being is not prior to Goodness, or vice-versa. Each is a divine theophany, a way in which the divine nature is manifested. The very nature of these Causes is to flow out from themselves, bringing about their Effects. This ‘outflowing’ (proodos; processio, exitus) creates the whole universe from the highest genus to the lowest species and ‘individuals’ (atoma). In his understanding of this causal procession, Eriugena accepts Neoplatonic principles: like produces like; incorporeal causes produce incorporeal effects; an eternal cause produces an eternal effect. Since the causes are immaterial, intellectual and eternal, so their created effects are essentially incorporeal, immaterial, intellectual, and eternal. Eriugena, however, thinks of cause and effect as mutually dependent, relative terms (V 910d-912b): a cause is not a cause unless it produces an effect, an effect is always the effect of a cause.
What is the ontological status of the created effects? By nature they are eternal and incorruptible, but Eriugena also thinks of individual created things as located spatially and temporally. He seems to think there are two kinds of time: an unchanging time (a reason or ratio in the divine mind, V. 906a) and a corrupting time. Place and time are definitions in that they situate or locate the things they define, and since definitions are in the mind, then place and time are in the mind (I.485b). Following Gregory of Nyssa, Eriugena holds that the sensible, corporeal, spatio-temporal appearances of things are produced by the qualities or ‘circumstances’ of place, time, position, and so on, which surround the incorporeal, eternal essence. The whole spatio-temporal world and our corporeal bodies are a consequence of the Fall, an emanation of the mind. Eriugena is somewhat ambiguous about this. His considered position appears to be that God, foreseeing that man would fall, created a body and a corporeal world for him. But this corporeal body is not essential to human nature and in the return of all things to God, the body will be absorbed back into the spiritual body (spirituale corpus) and the spiritual body back to the mind (mens). The corporeal world will return to its incorporeal essence, and place understood as the extension will return back into its cause or reason as a definition in the mind (V.889d).
Book Three discusses the nature of created effects and the meaning of ‘creation from nothing’ (creatio ex nihilo). The term ‘nothing’ has two meanings: it can mean ‘nothing through privation’ (nihil per privationem), or ‘nothing on account of excellence’ (nihil per excellentiam). The lowest rung in the hierarchy of being, unformed matter, is ‘almost nothing’ (prope nihil), or ‘nothing through privation’. In contrast, God is non-being through the excellence of His nature which transcends all being. Since there is nothing outside God, ‘creation from nothing’ cannot mean creation from some principle outside God, rather it means: creation out of God's superabundant nothingness. God creates out of himself (a se) and all creation remains within him.
Books Four and Five, originally planned as one book, discuss the return (epistrophe, reditus, reversio) of all things to God. According to the cosmic cycle Eriugena accepts, drawing heavily on Maximus Confessor and Maximus’ interpretation of Gregory of Nyssa, it is in the nature of things for effects to return to their causes. There is a general return of all things to God. Corporeal things will return to their incorporeal causes, the temporal to the eternal, the finite will be absorbed in the infinite. The human mind will achieve reunification with the divine, and then the corporeal, temporal, material world will become essentially incorporeal, timeless, and intellectual. Human nature will return to its ‘Idea’ or ‘notio’ in the mind of God. According to Eriugena's interpretation of scripture, ‘paradise’ is the scriptural name for this perfect human nature in the mind of God. Humans who refuse to let go of the ‘circumstances’ remain trapped in their own phantasies, and it is to this mental state that the scriptural term ‘hell’ applies. Aside from the general return of all things to God, Eriugena claims there is a special return whereby the elect achieve ‘deification’ (deificatio, theosis) whereby they will merge with God completely, as lights blend into the one light, as voices blend in the choir, as a droplet of water merges with the stream. God shall be all in all (omnia in omnibus, V 935c).
Books Four and Five contain Eriugena's anthropology which has recently been the focus of much philosophical interest. Eriugena's account ranges widely, treating of the creation of man, the Fall and the consequent division of the sexes, the meaning of human nature as made in the image and likeness of God (in imaginem et similitudinem dei), the nature of paradise to which perfected human nature will return, the nature of the devil and of evil will. He draws heavily on Augustine's commentaries on Genesis, especially De Genesi ad litteram, as well as Ambrose's De Paradiso and Gregory of Nyssa's De hominis opificio. But Eriugena is never a slavish follower - he departs from Augustine on several points, including on the question of the purely spiritual nature of paradise: whether Adam's body was animal or spiritual, and whether humans ante peccatum ever actually spent time in paradise. Eriugena adopts Gregory of Nyssa's view that sexual difference is a result of the Fall, that the real Fall is the fall from intellect into sense, intellect distracted by the voluptuousness of sense. So, sexual difference really makes no difference for humans, or as Eriugena boldly puts it: ‘Man is better than sex’ (homo melior est quam sexus, II. 534a). This, Eriugena believes, agrees with Scripture: ‘in Christ there is neither male nor female’ (IV.795a). Thus, Eriugena's radical Scriptural exegesis supports original philosophical claims about the sexless nature of true, undivided, human nature.
Just as the transcendent nature of God allows us to legitimately apply contradictory predicates to Him (‘Deus est; deus non est’), so too we may apply contradictory predicates to human nature. Though Book IV of the Periphyseon has the appearance of a Biblical commentary, dialectic also plays a privileged role. Eriugena employs dialectic to highlight the contradictions inherent in human nature: Man is an animal and man is not an animal; man is spiritual and not spiritual. For Eriugena, these contradictions are really indications of man's exalted status. His essence cannot be circumscribed. For Eriugena, ‘rational animal’ does not adequately define human nature.
Humanity is a mirror of all things, and therefore Eriugena can offer the definition of humanity as ‘a certain intellectual concept formed eternally (aeternaliter facta) in the divine mind’ (IV.768b). But of course, since everything is an Idea in the divine mind, this definition applies not only to human nature but to all other things too. Eriugena believes he has articulated the universality and comprehensive nature of humanity but not its uniqueness in this definition. Following Gregory of Nyssa, Eriugena therefore rejects the traditional account of human nature as a ‘microcosm’, made up of all parts of the world. He uses the Greek term ‘microcosmos’ only once in the Periphyseon, at IV.793c, where he is quoting Gregory of Nyssa, De imagine Chapter 17 (Cappuyns, 1965: 232) and glosses the word: ‘id est paruum mundum’: ‘that is, a small world’. Gregory says those who try to glorify human nature by saying it is a microcosm actually do not glorify human nature at all. For all creatures, even a mouse, are made up of the four elements, and will pass away. Gregory continues:
But, according to the Church's reasoning, the greatness of man lies not in his likeness to the created world but in the fact that he is created according to the image of the Creator of nature. Periphyseon IV.794a.
Eriugena, however, recognizes the role of human nature in mediating between the divine and created things. Human nature is the ‘workshop of all things’ (officina omnium, II.530d; IV.755b). Human nature is a medium between animal and angel, a medietas between the earthly and the intelligible worlds. Human nature contains not only elements from the corporeal world but also belongs to the intelligible world:
I declare that man consists of one and the same rational soul conjoined to the body in a mysterious manner, and that it is by a certain wonderful and intelligible division that man himself is divided into two parts, in one of which he is created in the image and likeness of the Creator, and participates in no animality … while in the other he communicates with the animal nature and was produced out of the earth, that is to say, out of the common nature of all things, and is included in the universal genus of animals. IV.754a-b.
The highest dignity for human nature is that it uniquely mirrors transcendent divine nature. Only of human nature can it be said that it is made in the image and likeness of God. Not even the angels are accorded that honor, so in a sense man is greater than the angels. Human nature may even require the application of affirmative and negative propositions: Man is an animal and man is not an animal (IV.758b).
Human nature in this respects resembles the divine nature which too is ‘both beyond all things and in all things’ (IV.759a-b).
This mirroring of God in man occurs especially in the cognitive domain. God knows that He is, but not what He is. God has existential knowledge, but no circumscribing knowledge of His essence, since, as infinite, He is uncircumscribable:
So God does not know of Himself what He is because He is not a ‘what’, being in everything incomprehensible both to Himself and to every intellect … But He does not recognize Himself as being something (Se ipsum autem non cognoscit aliquid esse) … For if He were to recognize Himself in something He would show that He is not in every respect infinite and incomprehensible. Periphyseon II.589b-c.
A human being too knows that he or she is, but he or she too cannot comprehend or circumscribe his or her essence or nature, since that too is infinite in some sense. All that can be done is to specify the ‘circumstances’ (circumstantiae) which surround his essence, e.g. place, time, rest, motion, condition, etc., Periphyseon II.586d). The human being in this sense is an image of the infinite and uncircumscribable God, and an image is identical to its archetype in all respects ‘except in respect of subject’ (praeter rationem subiecti, Periphyseon II.598b). Any difference between God and human nature is the result not of essence but of ‘an accident produced by sin’ (sed ex delicto accidit, II.598b). Human self-ignorance mirrors the divine self-ignorance; human incomprehensibility mirrors divine incomprehensibility. This makes human nature share in infinity. Eriugena elaborates on the parallels between human and divine nature. Perfect human nature would have possessed the fullest knowledge of its Creator, of itself, and of everything else, had it not sinned (IV.778c). Man would have ruled the whole of the universe as a king rules his subjects (IV.782c). Man, like God, is the plenitudo bonorum (IV.796a) Just as God is infinite and unbounded, human nature is indefinable and incomprehensible and open to infinite possibility and perfectibility (V.919c); God's transcendence and immanence are reflected in human transcendence and immanence with regard to its world. Consider the following remarkable passage from Book Four which is a typical example of Eriugena's dialectical thinking and of the close parallelism between human and divine:
For just as God is both beyond all things and in all things — for He Who only truly is, is the essence of all things, and while He is whole in all things He does not cease to be whole beyond all things, whole in the world, whole around the world, whole in the sensible creature, whole in the intelligible creature, whole creating the universe, whole created in the universe, whole in the whole of the universe and whole in its parts, since He is both the whole and the part, just as He is neither the whole nor the part — in the same way human nature in its own world (in its own subsistence) in its own universe and in its invisible and visible parts is whole in itself, and whole in its whole, and whole in its parts, and its parts are whole in themselves and whole in the whole. (Periphyseon, IV.759a-b).
Eriugena concludes that human nature is “wholly in the wholeness of the whole created nature (in universitate totius conditae naturae tota est), seeing that in it every creature is fashioned, and in it all are linked together (in ipsa copulata), and into it all shall return, and through it must all be saved” (Periphyseon, IV.760A).
Eriugena's cosmological account has been criticized for collapsing the differences between God and creation, leading to a heresy later labeled as pantheism. There is no doubt that Eriugena's theological intentions are orthodox, but he is a bold, speculative thinker, who believes that philosophy uncovers the true meaning of faith. Eriugena (as does Nicholas of Cusa) gives a unique place to Christ in the outgoing and return of all things. Christ is the coming together of the divine and the created orders. Christ possesses all the perfections of human nature, since vir autem perfectus est Christus ( IV. 743b), and Christ is also one in substance with God. Eriugena recognizes that Christ is unique and that the individual is not collapsed into the universal, even in the return. Humans will always be different from God in that they have been created and God is Creator (IV.796b). However, a case can also be made for saying that Eriugena really intends his perfected human nature to possess divine attributes in a genuine way. The argument turns on an answer to the following question: To what extent is man made in the image and likeness of God? Eriugena has two answers: an image is not an image unless it is identical to its exemplar in all respects “except number” or “subject” (excepta subiecti ratione , IV.778a). From this we may conclude that man differs from God in subiecto, that is, there is solely a difference in number. But difference in number does not mean that God and man stand apart from each other as two identical billiard balls would occupy different places. Neither God nor man is in space or time; both are incorporeal, and hence numerical difference, or difference in subject, can only have the Neoplatonic meaning that the first will always differ from what comes after the first. God is first, and hence man comes after. But ‘after’ (post) here has no temporal meaning, as Eriugena emphasizes (IV.808a). A second answer he gives is that God is creator and man is created, but since creation is self-manifestation, that amounts to saying no more than that God manifests himself fully in man. Eriugena sometimes qualifies this by saying that man is by grace (per gratiam) what God is by nature, quoting Maximus Confessor (e.g. V.879c-880a), but elsewhere, especially in the concept of theophany or divine manifestation, he fuses the notion of nature with that of grace: all natures are theophanies, that is produced by grace. God is the source of both dona [gifts of grace] and data[what are given in nature], both are revelations of the divine nature. Indeed there are many places where Eriugena cites texts (e.g. Maximus) to suggest that God and man mirror each other. His translation of Maximus includes the proposition: ‘For they say that man and God are paradigms of each other’ (Dicunt enim inter se invicem paradigmata Deum et hominem, PL CXXII 1220a). One is at the heart of the other. Similarly human nature and the angelic nature are mutually mirroring. This notion of the intertwining and merging of minds is at the very core of Eriugena's mysticism and of his understanding of the relation between human and divine natures and their coming together in the person of Christ. Christ is actually what all human beings can be and will be, that is precisely the promise of salvation for Eriugena. Consider the following passage from Book Two:
For if Christ Who understands of all things, (Who) indeed is the understanding of all things, really unified all that He assumed, who doubts then that what first took place in the Head and principal Exemplar of the whole of human nature will eventually happen in the whole? (Periphyseon, II.545a)
This clearly implies that humanity as a whole, that is, resurrected human nature in its perfected state will be truly illuminated and merged with the divine, for human nature itself in its very essence is the intellectus omnium. Furthermore, the use of the future tense here is somewhat misleading, since time itself is a function of our fallen state and the perfected state is timeless so there is a sense in which perfected human nature already is one with God and always has been one with God. Eriugena, then, has a dialectical understanding of the relation of God and man which can be viewed as orthodox from one point of view, but which is always transgressing the boundaries of orthodoxy in the direction of a view which has God and man mutually contemplating themselves and each other, in an endless, eternal play of theophanies. Thus, a kind of mystical humanism is celebrated in Periphyseon Book Four, a humanism explicated through the dialectic of self-knowledge and ignorance.
In Eriugena's conceptions of God, the cosmos and human nature, there is an extraordinarily bold emphasis on infinity. God is infinite and manifests Himself infinitely in His theophanies; the causes themselves are infinite; the created cosmos too would be infinite were it not for the Fall; finally, human nature is essentially unbounded and infinite. The Holy Scriptures too have a kind of infinite richness: Sacrae scripturae interpretatio infinita est, II.560a. Employing an original simile, Eriugena claims that the number of interpretations of Holy Scripture is like the innumerable colors in a peacock's tail (IV.749c). Human understanding and learning are also endless. Eriugena celebrates the lack of limit and inherent transcendence not just of human nature but also of the whole of nature. Nature as a whole is an infinite series of theophanies. This conception of God as ‘more than infinite’ and as the ‘infinity of infinities’ is Eriugena's most significant contribution to philosophy, one that attracted both the attention of medieval mystics and later of German Idealists.
Eriugena's Periphyseon had immediate influence in France, notably at the schools of Laon, Auxerre and Corbie. His translations of Pseudo-Dionysius were widely used until they were gradually replaced in the thirteenth century by those of Johannes Sarracenus. His Homily on the Prologue to John (albeit often attributed to Origen) circulated widely through the Middle Ages. The Periphyseon became particularly popular in the twelfth century, especially when circulated in the ‘edition’ of William of Malmsebury or in the paraphrase by Honorius Augustodunensis known as Clavis physicae. Hugh of Saint Victor, Alanus of Lille, and Suger of Saint-Denis were among those influenced by Eriugena. In the thirteenth century, however, the Periphyseon was linked with the writings of David of Dinant and Amaury of Bène, two theologians at the University of Paris, and was condemned with them in 1210 and 1225. According to Thomas Aquinas (ST I.3.8; SCG I.17; I.26), Amaury of Bne was condemned for saying that God is the formal principle of all things, an accusation of pantheism, which recalled Eriugena's statement that God is the ‘form of all things’ (forma omnium). David of Dinant (fl. 1210), on the other hand, was supposed to have identified God with prime matter and proclaimed that God was the materia omnium. It is likely that Eriugena's discussion of God and matter as ‘nothing’, and as both transcending sense and intellect according to the first mode of being and non-being, contributed to this accusation.
In the later Middle Ages both Meister Eckhart of Hochheim (c.1260- c.1328) and Nicholas of Cusa (1401-64) were sympathetic to Eriugena and familiar with his Periphyseon. Cusanus owned a copy of the Periphyseon. Interest in Eriugena was revived by Thomas Gale's first printed edition of 1687. However, soon afterwards, Thomas Gale's first printed edition, the Periphyseon, was listed in the first edition of the Index Librorum Prohibitorum, and remained on it, until the Index itself was abolished in the 1960's. In the nineteenth century, Hegel and his followers, interested in the history of philosophy from a systematic point of view, read Eriugena rather uncritically as an absolute idealist and as the father of German idealism. The first critical editions of his major works were not produced until the twentieth century. A conference organized by John O’Meara and Ludwig Bieler in the Royal Irish Academy, Dublin, in 1970 led to the founding of the Society for the Promotion of Eriugenian Studies (SPES) which has been active in developing Eriugena studies at a high scholarly level by hosting international colloquia and publishing the proceedings.
Eriugena is an original philosopher who articulates the relation between God and creation in a manner which preserves both divine transcendence and omnipresence. His theory of human nature is rationalist and intellectualist. His theory of place and time as defining structures of the mind anticipates Kant, his dialectical reasoning prefigures Hegel. But above all, Eriugena is a mystic who emphasizes the unity of human nature with God.