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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Schopenhauer toured through Europe with his family as a youngster, living briefly in England and France, and learning how to speak the languages of those countries. As he later reported, these experiences abroad were among the happiest of his life. The professional occupations of a merchant or banker, however, was not sufficiently consistent with Schopenhauer's scholarly disposition, and although for two years after his father's death (in Hamburg, April 20, 1805; possibly by suicide) Schopenhauer continued to respect the commercial aspirations his father had had for him, he finally left his Hamburg business apprenticeship at age 19 to prepare for university studies. In the meantime, his mother, Johanna Henriette Troisiener Schopenhauer (1766--1838), who was the daughter of a senator, along with Schopenhauer's sister, Luise Adelaide [Adele] Lavinia Schopenhauer (1797-1849), left their Hamburg home at Neuer Wandrahm 92 and moved to Weimar after Heinrich Floris's death, where Johanna established a friendship with Johann Wolfgang von Goethe (1749-1832). In Weimar, Goethe frequently visited Johanna's intellectual salon, and Johanna Schopenhauer herself soon became a well-known writer of the period, producing a voluminous assortment of essays, novels, biographies, and travelogues.
In 1809, Schopenhauer began studies at the University of Göttingen, where he remained for two years, first studying medicine, and then, philosophy. In Göttingen, he absorbed the views of the skeptical philosopher, Gottlob Ernst Schulze (1761-1833), who introduced him to Plato and Kant. Schopenhauer next enrolled at the University of Berlin (1811-13), where his lecturers included Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762-1814) and Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768-1834). At age 25, and ready to write his doctoral dissertation, he then moved in 1813 to Rudolstadt, a small town located a short distance southwest of Jena, where he lodged for the duration in an inn named Zum Ritter. Entitling his work The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, it formed the centerpiece of his later philosophy, articulating arguments he would use to criticize as charlatans, the prevailing German Idealistic philosophers of the time, namely, his former lecturer, J. G. Fichte, along with F. W. J. Schelling (1775-1854) and G. W. F. Hegel (1770-1831). In that same year, Schopenhauer submitted his dissertation to the nearby University of Jena, and was awarded a doctorate in philosophy in absentia.
From 1814-1818, Schopenhauer lived in Dresden, developing ideas from The Fourfold Root into his most famous book, The World as Will and Representation, which was completed in March of 1818 and published in December of that same year (with the date, 1819). In sympathy with Goethe's theory of color, he also wrote during this time, On Vision and Colors (1816). In Dresden, while living on the Grosse Meissensche Gasse, Schopenhauer became acquainted with the philosopher and freemason, Karl Christian Friedrich Krause (1781-1832), whose panentheistic views appear to have influenced Schopenhauer rather significantly. Panentheism (i.e., all-in-God), as opposed to pantheism (i.e., all-is-God), is the view that what we can comprehend and imagine to be the universe, is an aspect of God, but that the being of God is in excess of this projection, and is neither identical with, nor exhausted by, the universe we can imagine and comprehend. As we will see below, Schopenhauer's view of the thing-in-itself is structured much like a panentheistic position.
After a year's vacation in Italy and with his book in hand, Schopenhauer applied for the opportunity to give lectures at the University of Berlin, the institution at which he had formerly studied, and where two years earlier (1818), Hegel had arrived to assume Fichte's prestigious philosophical chair. In Italy, Schopenhauer had been carrying with him a letter of introduction to Lord Byron that he had been given by Goethe, but when strolling along the Lido beach in Venice, upon noticing how his female companion reeled with delight when the nobleman passed by on horseback, Schopenhauer decided to forego the opportunity to meet Byron.
Schopenhauer's experiences upon returning to Berlin were less than professionally fruitful, for in March of 1820, he daringly scheduled his class at a time that was simultaneous with Hegel's popular lectures, and few students chose to hear Schopenhauer rather than Hegel. Two years later, in 1822, Schopenhauer left his Berlin apartment at Früher Niederlagstraße 2 and traveled to Italy for a second time, returning to Munich a year later. He then lived in Mannheim and Dresden in 1824 before tracing his way back to Berlin in 1825. A second attempt to lecture at the University of Berlin was unsuccessful, and this disappointment was complicated by Schopenhauer's loss of a lawsuit that had begun several years earlier in August, 1821. The dispute issued from an angry shoving-match between Schopenhauer and a seamstress, Caroline Luise Marguet, which occurred in the rooming house where they had both been living.
Leaving Berlin in 1831 in light of a cholera epidemic that was entering Germany from Russia, Schopenhauer moved south, first briefly to Frankfurt-am-Main, and then to Mannheim. Shortly thereafter, in June of 1833, he settled permanently in Frankfurt, where he remained for the next twenty-seven years, residing in an apartment along the river Main's waterfront from 1843 to 1859 at Schöne Aussicht 17. His daily life, living alone with a succession of pet French poodles (named Atma and Butz), was defined by a deliberate routine: Schopenhauer would awake, wash, read and study during the morning hours, play his flute, lunch at an inn called the Englisher Hof, rest afterwards, read, take an afternoon walk, check the world events as reported in The London Times, sometimes attend concerts in the evenings, and frequently read inspirational texts such as the Upanishads before going to sleep.
During this later phase of his life, Schopenhauer wrote a short work in 1836, Über den Willen in der Natur (On the Will in Nature), that aimed to confirm and reiterate his metaphysical views in light of scientific evidence. He also completed an essay of which he was immensely proud, “On the Freedom of Human Will” (“Über die Freiheit des menschlichen Willens”) in 1839, which was awarded first prize from the Royal Norwegian Society of Sciences and Letters in Drontheim. A year later, he complemented this with a second essay, “On the Foundations of Morality” (“Über die Grundlage der Moral”) which, although it was the sole submission, was not honored with an award by The Royal Danish Society of the Sciences in Copenhagen. Schopenhauer also completed an accompanying volume to The World as Will and Representation, which was published in 1844 along with the first volume in a combined second edition.
In 1851, Schopenhauer published a set of assorted philosophical reflections, entitled Parerga and Paralipomena, and within a couple of years, he began to receive the philosophical recognition for which he had long hoped. This recognition was stimulated by a favorable review of Schopenhauer's philosophy published in 1853 without signature in the Westminster Review (“Iconoclasm in German Philosophy,” by John Oxenford), which, acknowledging the centrality of the “will” within Schopenhauer's outlook, drew insightful parallels between Schopenhauer's and Fichte's more well-known thought. A year after the third edition of The World as Will and Representation appeared in 1859, Schopenhauer died peacefully on September 21, 1860, in his apartment in Frankfurt at Schöne Aussicht 16. He was 72. After Schopenhauer'sdeath, Julius Frauenstädt published new editions of most of Schopenhauer's works, with the first complete edition (six volumes) appearing in 1873.
Schopenhauer donated his estate to help disabled Prussian soldiers and the families of those soldiers killed, who had participated in the suppression of the 1848 revolution. An assortment of photographs of Schopenhauer was taken during his final years, and although they reveal to us an old man, we should be appreciate that Schopenhauer completed The World as Will and Representation by the time he had reached the age of thirty.
The principle of sufficient reason might seem to be non-controversial, but it yields surprising and curious results. For example, we can appeal to this principle to argue that there can be no two individuals exactly alike, because there would otherwise be no sufficient reason why one individual was in one place, while the other individual was in another place. Moreover, if the principle of sufficient reason's scope of applicability is assumed to be limitless, then there is a definite answer to the question, “Why is there something, rather than nothing?” Schopenhauer was keen to question the universal extension of the principle of sufficient reason, mainly owing to his advocacy of Kant's view that for the purposes of answering metaphysical questions, human rationality lacks the power to transcend human finitude, if only because human comprehension is limited by our specific and narrowly-circumscribed capacities for organizing our field of sensation.
Schopenhauer observed as an elementary matter, that to employ the principle of sufficient reason, we must think about something in particular that stands in need of explanation. This indicated to him, that at the root of our epistemological situation, we must assume the presence of a subject that thinks about some object to be explained. From this, he concluded that the general root of the principle of sufficient reason, is the distinction between subject and object that we must presuppose as a condition for the very enterprise of looking for explanations (The Fourfold Root, Section 16), and as a condition for knowledge in general.
Schopenhauer's claim that the subject-object distinction is the most general condition for human knowledge has its theoretical source in Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, for Kant similarly grounded his own theory of knowledge upon a highly-abstracted, formalized, and universalized subject-object distinction. Kant characterized the subjective pole of the distinction as the contentless transcendental unity of self-consciousness and the objective pole as the contentless transcendental object that corresponds to the concept of an object in general (CPR, A 109). The general root of the principle of sufficient reason, as Schopenhauer characterizes it, is also the general root of Kant's epistemology.
Following the demanding conceptions of knowledge typical of his time that had been inherited from René Descartes (1596-1650), Schopenhauer maintained that if any explanation is to be genuine, then whatever is explained cannot be thought to have arisen by accident, but must be regarded as having been necessary. Schopenhauer's investigation into the principle of sufficient reason can thus be alternatively characterized as an inquiry into the nature of the various kinds of necessary connection that can arise between different kinds of objects.
Inspired by Aristotle's doctrine of the four basic kinds of explanatory reason or four [be]causes (Physics, Book II, Chapter 3), Schopenhauer defined four kinds of necessary connection that arise within the general context of seeking explanations, and he correspondingly identified four independent kinds of objects in reference to which explanations can be given:
With this set of regulations about what counts as a legitimate way to conduct explanations, Schopenhauer ruled out the often-cited and (especially during his time) philosophically often-relied-upon cosmological and ontological arguments for God's existence, and along with them, all philosophies that ground themselves upon such traditional arguments. Schopenhauer believed emphatically that the German Idealist outlooks of Fichte, Schelling and Hegel rested upon explanatory errors of this kind, and he regarded them -- often bitingly -- as fundamentally wrongheaded styles of thought, because he saw their philosophies as being specifically grounded upon versions of the ontological argument for God's existence. His condemnation of German Idealism was advanced in light of what he considered to be sound philosophical reasons, despite his frequent rhetoric and personal attacks on Fichte, Schelling and Hegel.
Schulze's critique of Kant boils down to the following: it is incoherent to posit as a matter of philosophical knowledge -- as Kant seems to have done -- a mind-independent object that is beyond all human experience, and which serves as the objective cause of our experience. Schulze argues that this position illegitimately uses the concept of causality to conclude as a matter of strong epistemological requirement, and not merely as a matter of rational speculation, that there is some object -- namely, the thing-in-itself -- outside of all possible human experience, that is nonetheless the cause of our sensations.
Schopenhauer concurs that hypothesizing a thing-in-itself as the cause of our sensations amounts to a constitutive application and projection of the concept of causality beyond its legitimate scope, for according to Kant himself, the concept of causality only supplies knowledge when it is applied within the field of possible experience, and not outside of it. Schopenhauer therefore denies that our sensations have an external cause, in the specific sense that we can know there is some epistemologically inaccessible object -- the thing-in-itself -- that exists independently of our sensations and is the cause of them.
These internal problems with Kant's argument suggest to Schopenhauer that Kant's reference to the thing-in-itself as a transcendental object (or, for that matter, as an object of any kind) is misleading. Instead, Schopenhauer maintains that if we are to refer to the thing-in-itself, then we must come to an awareness of it, not by invoking the relationship of causality -- a relationship where the cause and the effect are logically understood to designate different objects or events (since self-causation is a contradiction in terms) -- but through another means altogether. As we will see in the next section, and as we can see immediately in the very title of his main work -- The World as Will and Representation -- Schopenhauer believes that the world has a double-aspect, namely, as will (Wille) and as representation (Vorstellung).
Schopenhauer does not believe, then, that the will causes our representations. His position is that will and representations are one and the same reality, regarded from different perspectives. They stand in relationship to each other, in a way that is more akin to the relationship between a force and its manifestation (e.g., as exemplfied in the relationship between electricity and a spark) as opposed to the relationship between cause and effect. Rather than say that the thing-in-itself causes our sensations, as if we were referring to one domino striking another domino, Schopenhauer maintains that the relationship between the thing-in-itself and our sensations is more like that between two sides of a coin, neither of which causes the other, and both of which are of the same coin and coinage.
Among his other criticisms of Kant (see Schopenhauer's appendix to the first volume of The World as Will and Representation, entitled, “Criticism of the Kantian Philosophy”), Schopenhauer also maintains that Kant's twelve categories of the human understanding -- the various categories through which we logically organize our field of sensations into comprehensible individual objects -- are reducible to the single category of causality, and that this category, along with the intuitive forms of space and time, is sufficient to explain the basic format of all human experience, viz., individual objects dispersed throughout space and time, causally related to one another.
Schopenhauer further comprehends these three (and for him, interdependent) principles as expressions of a single principle, namely, the principle of sufficient reason, whose fourfold root he had examined in his doctoral dissertation. In The World as Will and Representation, Schopenhauer often refers to the principle of sufficient reason as the principle of individuation, thereby linking the idea of individuation with rationality, necessity, systematicity and determinism, and using the two characterizations as a shorthand expression for what Kant had more complexly referred to as space, time and the twelve categories of the understanding (viz., unity, plurality, totality, reality, negation, limitation, substance, causality, reciprocity, possibility, actuality [Dasein], and necessity).
Among the most frequently-identified principles that is introspectively brought forth -- and one that was the standard for German Idealist philosophers such as Fichte, Schelling and Hegel who were philosophizing within the Cartesian tradition -- is the principle of self-consciousness. With the belief that acts of self-consciousness exemplify a self-creative process akin to divine creation itself, and developing a logic that reflected the structure of self-consciousness, namely, the dialectical logic of position, opposition and reconciliation, the German Idealists maintained that dialectical logic mirrors the structure not only of human productions, both individual and social, but the structure of reality as a whole.
As much as he opposes the traditional German Idealists in their metaphysical celebration of self-consciousness, Schopenhauer stands within the spirit of this tradition, for he believes that the ultimate principle of the universe is likewise apprehensible through introspection, and that we can philosophically understand the world as various manifestations of this general principle. For Schopenhauer, however, this is not the principle of self-consciousness and rationally-infused will, but rather, what he calls simply “will” -- a mindless, aimless, non-rational urge at the foundation of all of our instinctual drives, and at the foundational being of everything. Schopenhauer's originality does not reside in his characterization of the world as will, or as act -- for we encounter this position in Fichte's philosophy as well -- but in Schopenhauer's conception of the will as being utterly devoid of rationality.
Having rejected the Kantian position that our sensations are caused by an unknowable object that exists independently of us, Schopenhauer notes importantly that our body -- which is just one among the many objects in the world -- is given to us in two different ways: we perceive our body as a physical object among other physical objects, subject to the natural laws that govern the movements of all physical objects, and we are aware of our body through our immediate awareness, as we each consciously inhabit our body, intentionally moving it, feeling directly our pleasures, pains, and emotional states. We can objectively perceive our hand as an external object, as a surgeon might perceive it during a medical operation, and we can also be subjectively aware of our hand as something we inhabit, as something we can willfully move, and of which we can feel its inner muscular workings.
From this observation, Schopenhauer asserts that our body is given in two entirely different ways, namely, as representation (i.e., objectively; externally) and as will (i.e., subjectively; internally). One of his intriguing conclusions is that when we move our hand, this is not to be comprehended as a motivational act that first happens, and then causes the movement of our hand as an effect. Rather, Schopenhauer maintains that the movement of our hand is but a single act -- again, like the two sides of a coin -- that has a subjective feeling of willing as one of its aspects, and the movement of the hand as the other of its aspects. He states in general that the action of the body is nothing but the act of will objectified, that is, translated into perception.
At this point in his argumentation, Schopenhauer has established only that among his thousands upon thousands of ideas, or representations, only one of them (viz., the [complex] representation of his body) has this special double-aspected quality. When he perceives the moon, or a mountain, he does not have any direct access to the metaphysical inside of these objects; they remain as representations that reveal to him only their objective side. Schopenhauer asks, though, how he might understand the world as an integrated whole, or how he might render it more comprehensible, for as things stand, he can directly experience the inside of one of his representations, but of no others. To answer this question, Schopenhauer takes a philosophical leap, and uses the double-knowledge of his own body as the key to the inner being of every other natural phenomenon. He consequently regards every object in the world as being double-aspected, and as having an inside or inner aspect of its own, just as his consciousness is the inner aspect of his own body. For such reasons, Schopenhauer flatly rejects Descartes's causal interactionism, where thinking substance is said to cause changes in a metaphysically independent material substance and vice-versa.
This precipitates a position that characterizes the inner aspect of things, as far as we can describe it, as will, and ultimately, as a dimension of the thing-in-itself, which in his critique of Kant, Schopenhauer had argued also has a double-aspected relationship to our sensory experience. Hence, Schopenhauer regards the world as a whole as having two sides: the world is will and the world is representation. The world as will (for us) is the world as it is in itself, and the world as representation is the world of appearances, of our ideas, or objects. An alternative title for Schopenhauer's main book, The World as Will and Representation, might well have been, The World as Reality and Appearance. Similarly, his book might have been entitled, The Inner and Outer Nature of the World, or perhaps, The World as Subject and as Object.
An inspiration for Schopenhauer's view that ideas are like inert objects is George Berkeley (1685-1753), who describes ideas in this despiritualized way in his A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge (1710) [Section 25]. A primary inspiration for Schopenhauer's double-aspect view of the universe is Baruch Spinoza (1632-1677), who developed a similarly-structured metaphysics, and who Schopenhauer had studied in his early years before writing his dissertation. A subsequent, but crucial, inspiration is from the classical Upanishadic writings of India (c. 900-600 BCE) which also express the view that the universe is double-aspected, having objective and subjective dimensions that are referred to respectively as Brahman and Atman.
After completing his dissertation, Schopenhauer was exposed to Upanishadic thought in 1813 by the orientalist Friedrich Majer (1771-1818), who visited Johanna Schopenhauer's salon in Weimar. Even more importantly, Schopenhauer's appreciation for Upanishadic thought was augmented in Dresden during his writing of The World as Will and Representation by Karl Friedrich Christian Krause, Schopenhauer's 1815-1817 neighbor. Krause was not only a metaphysical panentheist (see biographic segment above); he was also an enthusiast of South Asian thought. Familiar with the Sanskrit language, he introduced Schopenhauer to both meditative techniques and to publications on India in the Asiatisches Magazin. It was during this time that Schopenhauer was able to study the first European-language translation of the Upanishads, for in 1804, a Persian version of the Upanishads (the Oupnekhat) was rendered into Latin by the French Orientalist, Abraham Hyacinthe Anquetil-Duperron (1731-1805) -- a scholar who was also responsible for introducing translations of Zoroastrian texts into Europe in 1771.
Despite its general precedents within the philosophical family of double-aspect theories, Schopenhauer's particular characterization of the world as will, is nonetheless novel and daring. It is also frightening and pandemonic: he maintains that the world as it is in itself (sometimes he crucially adds, “for us”) is an endless striving and blind impulse with no end in view, devoid of knowledge, lawless, absolutely free, entirely self-determining and almighty. Within Schopenhauer's vision of the world as will, there is no God to be comprehended, and the world is conceived of as being utterly meaningless. When anthropomorphically considered, the world is represented as being in a condition of eternal frustration, as it endlessly strives for nothing in particular, and as it goes essentially nowhere. It is a world far beyond any ascriptions of good and evil.
In its essential meaninglessness, Schopenhauer's characterization of the world differs from the views of Fichte, Schelling and Hegel, all of whom fostered some distinct hope that everything is moving towards a harmonious and just end. But like these German Idealists, Schopenhauer also tries to explain how the world that we experience daily, is the result of the activity of the central principle of things. As the German Idealists tried to account for the great chain of being -- the rocks, trees, animals, and human beings -- as the increasingly complicated and detailed expressions of self-consciousness, Schopenhauer attempts to do the same with respect to explaining the world in terms of will, albeit through the human lens.
For Schopenhauer, the world that we experience is constituted by various objectifications of the will that correspond first, to the general root of the principle of sufficient reason, and second, to the more specific fourfold root of the principle of sufficient reason. This generates initially, a basic two-tiered outlook (viz., will vs. objects-in-general [i.e., reality vs. appearance]) that is articulated into a three-tiered outlook (viz., will -- timeless, universal objects -- spatio-temporal objects [reality -- appearance, universal level -- appearance, individuated level]), by further distinguishing between two levels of appearance that correspond to two kinds of objects.
The general philosophical pattern of a single world-essence that initially manifests itself as a multiplicity of abstract essences, which, in turn, manifest themselves as a multiplicity of physical individuals can be found throughout the world. For instance, it is characteristic of Neoplatonism (c. third century, C.E., as represented by Plotinus [204-270]), and it also characteristic of the Buddhist Three Body Doctrine [trikaya] of the Buddha's manifestation which originated in the Yogacara school of Mahayana Buddhism as represented by Maitreya (270-350), Asanga (375-430) and Vasubandu (400-480).
According to Schopenhauer, corresponding to the level of the universal subject-object distinction, the will is objectified first into a set of universal objects or Platonic Ideas which constitute the timeless patterns for each of the individual things that we experience in space and time. There are different Platonic Ideas, and although this multiplicity of Ideas implies that some measure of individuation is present within this realm, each Idea nonetheless contains no plurality within itself and is said to be “one.” The Platonic Ideas are in neither space nor time, and they therefore lack the qualities of individuation that would follow from the introduction of spatial and temporal qualifications. So in these respects, the Platonic Ideas are independent of the specific fourfold root of the principle of sufficient reason, even though it would be misleading to say that there is no individuation whatsoever at this universal level, because there are many different Platonic Ideas, and these are externally individuated from one another. Schopenhauer refers to the Platonic Ideas as the direct objectifications of the will, and as the immediate objectivity of the will.
The will's indirect objectifications appear when we continue to specify the application of the principle of sufficient reason beyond its general root, and introduce the forms of time, space and causality, not to mention logic, mathematics, geometry and moral reasoning. When the will is objectified at this level of determination, we have emerge as a result, the world of everyday life, whose objects are, in effect, kaleidoscopically multiplied manifestations of the Platonic forms, endlessly dispersed through space and time.
Since the principle of sufficient reason is -- given Schopenhauer's inspiration from Kant -- the epistemological form of the human mind itself, the spatio-temporal world is the world of our own objectification. The world's spatio-temporal appearance is a reflection of the epistemological form of our own mind, and to that extent, as Schopenhauer says, life is like a dream. As a condition of our knowledge, Schopenhauer believes that the laws of nature, along with the sets of objects that we experience, we ourselves create in way that is not unlike the way the constitution of our tongues invokes the taste of sugar. For if ears tongues and noses were removed from the world, as Galileo Galilei (1564-1642) states in “The Assayer” (1623), then odors tastes and sounds would be removed as well.
At this point, what Schopenhauer has developed philosophically is surely interesting, but we have not yet mentioned its particularly remarkable and memorable aspect. If we combine his claim that the world is will with his Kantian view that we are responsible for the individuated world of appearances, we arrive at an exceptionally novel outlook -- an outlook that depends heavily upon Schopenhauer's characterization of the thing-in-itself as will, understood to be an aimless, blind striving.
Before the human being comes onto the scene with its principle of sufficient reason (or principle of individuation) there are no individuals. It is the human being that, in its very effort to know anything, objectifies an appearance for itself that involves the fragmentation of the will and its breakup into a comprehensible set of individuals. The implication of this fragmentation, given the nature of the will, is terrible: the result of the epistemological fragmentation is a world of constant struggle, where each individual thing strives against every other individual thing; the result is a permanent “war of all against all” akin to what Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679) characterized as the state of nature.
Kant concludes in the Critique of Pure Reason that we create the laws of nature (CPR, A125); similarly, Schopenhauer concludes in The World as Will and Representation that we create the violent state of nature, for he maintains that the individuation that the human being imposes upon things, is imposed upon a blind striving energy that, once it becomes individuated and objectified, turns against itself, consumes itself, and does violence to itself. His paradigm image is of the bulldog-ant of Australia, which when cut in half, struggles in a battle to the death between its head and tail. Our very quest for scientific and practical knowledge creates a world that feasts upon itself.
Hence derives Schopenhauer's renowned pessimism: he claims that as individuals, we are the unfortunate products of our own epistemological making, and that within the world of appearances that we ourselves structure, we are forever doomed to fight with other individuals, and to want more than we can ever have. On Schopenhauer's view, the world of daily life is essentially violent and frustrating; it is a world that, as long as our consciousness remains at that level where the principle of sufficient reason applies in its fourfold root, will never resolve itself into a condition of greater tranquillity. As he explicitly states, daily life “is suffering” (WWR, Section 56) and to express this, he employs images of frustration taken from classical Greek mythology, such as those of Tantalus and the Danaids, along with the suffering of Ixion on the ever-spinning wheel of fire.
One way to achieve a more tranquil state of consciousness, according to Schopenhauer, is through aesthetic perception. This is a special state of perceptual consciousness, where we apprehend some spatio-temporal object and discern through this object, the Platonic Idea that corresponds to the type of object in question. In this special form of perception, Schopenhauer maintains, we lose ourselves in the object, we forget about our individuality, and we become the clear mirror of the object. For example, through the aesthetic perception of an individual tree, we perceive shining through it, the archetype of all trees (i.e., the Ur-phenomenon, as Goethe would describe it).
Since Schopenhauer assumes that the quality of the subject of experience must correspond to the quality of the object of experience, he infers that in the state of aesthetic perception, where the objects are universal, the subject of experience must likewise become universal (WWR, Section 33). Aesthetic perception thus raises a person into a pure will-less, painless, and timeless subject of knowledge (WWR, Section 34).
In Schopenhauer's opinion, few people have the capacity to remain for long in such an aesthetic state of mind, and most people are denied the transcendent tranquillity of aesthetic perception. Only the artistic genius has the capacity to remain in the state of pure perception, and it is to these individuals that we must turn -- as we appreciate their works of art -- in order to obtain a more concentrated and knowledgeable glimpse of the world of Platonic Ideas. The artistic genius contemplates the Platonic Ideas, creates a work of art that portrays these Ideas in a fashion more clear and accessible than is usual, and thereby communicates the vision of the Platonic Ideas to those who do not have the idealizing power to see through, and to rise above, the ordinary world of spatio-temporal objects.
Schopenhauer states that the purpose of art is the communication of Platonic Ideas (WWR, Section 50). As constituting art, he has in mind the traditional five fine arts minus music, namely, architecture, sculpture, painting, and poetry. These four arts he comprehends in relation to the Platonic Ideas -- those universal objects of aesthetic awareness that are located at the objective pole of the universal subject-object distinction that is general root of the principle of sufficient reason. Schopenhauer's account of the visual and literary arts corresponds to the world as representation in its immediate objectification, namely, the field of Platonic Ideas as opposed to the field of spatio-temporal objects.
With respect to music, Schopenhauer develops as a counterpart to his interpretation of the visual and literary arts, an account that coordinates music with the subjective pole of the universal subject-object distinction. His account of music corresponds to the world as will in its immediate objectification. Separate from the other traditional arts, Schopenhauer maintains that music is the highest art, and is on a par with the Platonic Ideas themselves, insofar as music is also an immediate objectification of the will. Just as the Platonic Ideas contain the patterns for the types of objects in the daily world, the field of music formally duplicates the basic structure of the world: the bass notes are analogous to inorganic nature, the harmonies are analogous to the animal world, and the melodies are analogous to the human world. And just as the sounding of the bass notes produces more subtle sonic structures in the overtones, animate life arises from inanimate nature.
In short, Schopenhauer discerns in the structure of music, a series of analogies to the structure of the physical world that allow him to claim that music is a copy of the will itself. Schopenhauer's view might seem extravagant upon first hearing, but underlying it is the insight that if one is to discern the truth of the world, it might be advantageous to apprehend the world, not exclusively in scientific, mechanical and causal terms, but rather in aesthetic, analogical, expressive and metaphorical terms that require a sense of taste for their discernment. And if the form of the world is best reflected in the form of music, then the most philosophical sensibility will be a musical sensibility. This partially explains the positive attraction of Schopenhauer's theory of music to thinkers such as Richard Wagner and Friedrich Nietzsche, both of whom were philosopher-musician types.
With respect to the theme of achieving more peaceful and transcendent states of mind, Schopenhauer believes that music achieves this end by embodying the abstract forms of feelings, or feelings abstracted from their particular everyday circumstances. This allows us to perceive the quintessence of emotional life, without the contents that would typically cause suffering. By expressing emotion in this detached or disinterested way, music allows us to apprehend the nature of the world without the frustration involved in daily life, and hence, in a mode of aesthetic awareness that is akin to the tranquil philosophical contemplation of the world.
Schopenhauer's conception of moral awareness is consistent with his overall project of seeking more tranquil, transcendent states of mind. Within the moral realm specifically, this quest for transcendence leads Schopenhauer to maintain that once we recognize each human as being merely an instance and aspect of the single act of will that is humanity itself, we will appreciate that the difference between the tormentor and the tormented is illusory, and that in fact, it is the very same eye of humanity that looks out from each and every person. For Schopenhauer, according to the true nature of things, each person has all the sufferings of the world as his or her own, for it is the same inner human nature that ultimately bears all of the pain and all of the guilt. Thus, with the consciousness of humanity in mind, a moral consciousness would necessarily take upon himself or herself, the sins of the whole world (WWR, Sections 63 and 64).
So not only does the specific application of the principle of sufficient reason fragment the world into a set of individuals dispersed through space and time for the purposes of attaining scientific knowledge, this rationalistic principle generates the illusion that when one person does wrong to another, that these two people are essentially separate and private individuals. Just as the fragmentation of the world into individuals is necessary to apply the relationship of causality, where A causes B and where A and B are conceived to be two independent objects, this same fragmentation leads us to conceive of the relationships between people on a model where some person P acts upon person Q, where P and Q are conceived as two independent individuals. The conditions for scientific knowledge have a negative moral impact, because they lead us to regard each other as individuals separate and alien to one another.
By compassionately recognizing at a more universal level, that the inner nature of another person is of the same substance as oneself, one arrives at a moral outlook. This compassionate way of apprehending another person is not merely understanding abstractly the proposition that “each person is a human being,” or understanding abstractly (as would Kant) that, in principle, the same regulations of rationality operate equally in each of us and oblige us accordingly. It is to feel directly the concrete life of another person; it is to enter into the life of humanity imaginatively, such as to coincide with all others as much as one possibly can. It is to imagine equally, and in full force, what it is like to be both a cruel tormentor and a tormented victim, and to locate both opposing experiences and characters within a single, universal consciousness that is the consciousness of humanity itself. With the development of moral consciousness, one expands one's consciousness towards the mixed-up, tension-ridden, bittersweet, tragicomic, multi-aspected and distinctively sublime consciousness of humanity itself.
Edmund Burke (1729-1797) characterized the sublime as a sense of tranquillity tinged with terror, and Schopenhauer's moral consciousness fits such a description. Just as music embodies the emotional tensions within the world in an abstracted and distanced manner, and thus affords a measure of tranquillity by presenting a softened, sonic image of the daily world of universal conflict, moral consciousness is also attended by a measure of tranquillity. When attaining the universal consciousness of humanity itself that transcends spatial and temporal determinations, the desires that derive their significance from one's personal condition as a spatio-temporal individual are seen for what they are, as being grounded upon the illusion of fragmentation, and they thereby lose much their compelling force. In this respect, moral consciousness becomes the “quieter” of the will, despite its first-person recognition of human torment. Works of art that portray this kind of sublime consciousness would include the Laocoön (c. 25 B.C.E.) and Hieronymous Bosch's painting, Christ Carrying the Cross (c. 1515).
Negatively considered, moral consciousness delivers us from the unquenchable thirst that is individuated human life, along with its incessant oscillation between pain and boredom. Positively considered, moral consciousness generates a measure of wisdom, as one's outlook becomes akin to a universal novel that contains the templates for all of the human stories which have been repeating themselves generation after generation -- stories comic and tragic, pathetic and triumphant, and trivial and monumental. One becomes like the steadfast tree, whose generations of leaves fall away with each passing season, as does generation after generation of people (Homer, Iliad, Book VI).
In a similar connection, Schopenhauer maintains in his “Essay on the Freedom of the Will” (1839) that everything that happens, happens necessarily. Having accepted Kant's view that cause and effect relationships extend throughout the world of experience, he believes that every individual act is determined by prior causes or motives. This fatalistic realization is a source of comfort and tranquillity for Schopenhauer, for upon becoming aware that nothing can be done to alter the course of events, he finds that the struggle to change the world quickly loses its force (see also WWR, Section 56).
Schopenhauer emphatically denies the common conception that being free entails that we could always have done otherwise than what we have chosen to do. He augments this denial, however, with the claim that each of us is free in a higher sense. Noting that we have “an unshakeable certainty that we are the doers of our deeds” (“Essay on the Freedom of the Will”, Conclusion), he maintains that one's sense of responsibility reveals an innate character that is self-determining and independent of experience. Just as individual trees and individual flowers are the multifarious expressions of the Platonic Ideas of tree and flower, each and every one of a person's individual actions is the spatio-temporal manifestation of that person's respective innate or intelligible character.
A person's intelligible character is a timeless act of will that the person essentially is, and it can be conceived of as the subjective aspect of the Platonic Idea that would objectively define the person's inner essence (WWR, Section 28), as a portrait artist might perceive it. This concept of the intelligible character is Kantian (Critique of Pure Reason, A539/B567), and in conjunction with Kant's correlated concept of an empirical character (i.e., the intelligible character as it is experientially expressed) Schopenhauer regards it as a means to resolve the problem of freedom and determinism, and to be one of the most profound ideas in Kant's whole philosophy.
From the standpoint of later philosophical influence, Schopenhauer's discussion of the intelligible character resonates with Friedrich Nietzsche's famous injunction to “become what one is” (Ecce Homo, “Why I am so Clever”, Section 9). Schopenhauer believes that as we learn more about ourselves, we can manifest our intelligible character more effectively, and can thereby play our designated role “artistically and methodically, with firmness and grace.” With self-knowledge, we can transform our lives into works of art, as Nietzsche prescribed.
Character development thus involves expanding the knowledge of one's innate individuality, and a primary effect of this knowledge and self-realization is greater peace of mind (WWR, Section 55). Moreover, since one's intelligible character is both subjective and universal, its status coordinates with that of music, the highest art. This association with music -- as Nietzsche probably observed -- reveals a systematic link between Schopenhauer's aesthetics and moral theory, and it can account for Schopenhauer's reference to the emergence of pleasing aesthetic and artistic, if not musical, qualities in connection with the expression of one's acquired character.
According to Schopenhauer, aesthetic perception offers only a short-lived transcendence from the daily world. And moral awareness, despite its comparative tranquillity in contrast to the daily world of violence, is not the ultimate state of mind. Schopenhauer believes that a person who experiences the truth of human nature from a moral perspective -- who appreciates how its spatial and temporal forms of knowledge generate a constant passing away, continual suffering, vain striving and inner tension -- will be so profoundly repulsed by the human condition, that he or she will lose the desire to affirm the objectified human scene in any of its manifestations. The result is an attitude of the denial of the will-to-live, which Schopenhauer identifies with an ascetic attitude of renunciation, resignation, and willessness, but also composure and tranquillity. In a manner reminiscent of traditional Buddhism, Schopenhauer recognizes that life is filled with unavoidable frustration, and he acknowledges that the suffering caused by this frustration can itself be reduced by minimizing one's desires. Moral consciousness and virtue thus give way to the voluntary poverty and chastity of the ascetic. St. Francis of Assisi (WWR, Section 68) and Jesus (WWR, Section 70) emerge, accordingly, as Schopenhauer's prototypes for the most enlightened lifestyle, as do the ascetics from every religious tradition.
With his elevation of the ascetic consciousness and its associated detachment and tranquillity, some paradox enters into Schopenhauer's outlook. For he acknowledges that the denial of one's will-to-live entails a terrible struggle with one's instinctual energies, as one avoids the temptations of bodily pleasures and resists the mere animal force to endure and flourish. So before one can enter the transcendent consciousness of heavenly tranquillity, one must pass through the fires of hell and experience a dark night of the soul, as one's universal self fights against one's individuated and physical self, as pure knowledge struggles against animalistic will, and as freedom struggles against nature.
A tension within Schopenhauer's view arises in light of the following. One can superficially maintain that no contradiction is involved in the act of struggling (i.e., willing) to deny one's will-to-live, because one is not saying that the will is somehow destroying itself, but only saying that a more universal manifestation of the will is overpowering a less universal manifestation of the will, namely, the natural, individuated, physically-embodied aspect. But it remains that within this opposition, the will as a whole is nonetheless set against itself according to the very the model that Schopenhauer is trying to transcend, namely, the model wherein one aspect of the will fights against another aspect, like the divided bulldog ant. This in itself is not a problem, but the location of the tormented and self-crucifying ascetic consciousness at the penultimate level of enlightenment is theoretically disturbing, owing to its high degree of inner ferocity. Even though this ferocity occurs at a reflective and introspective level, we nonetheless have before us a spiritualized life-and-death struggle within the ascetic consciousness.
This peculiarity notwithstanding, the ascetic's struggle is none other than a supreme struggle against human nature. It is a struggle against the close-to-unavoidable tendency to apply the principle of sufficient reason for the purpose of attaning practical knowledge -- an application which has for Schopenhauer, the utterly repulsive side-effect of creating the illusion of a world permeated with endless conflict. From a related angle, the ascetic's struggle is a struggle against the forces of violence and evil, which, owing to Schopenhauer's acceptance and interpretation of Kant's epistemology, locate these forces significantly within human nature itself. When the ascetic transcends human nature, the ascetic resolves the problem of evil: by removing the individuated and individuating human consciousness from the scene, one removes the entire spatio-temporal scene upon which daily violence occurs.
In a way, then, the ascetic consciousness can be said symbolically to return Adam and Eve to Paradise, for it is the very quest for knowledge (i.e., the will to apply the principle of individuation to experience) that the ascetic overcomes. This amounts to a self-overcoming at the universal level, where not only physical desires are overcome, but where humanly-inherent epistemological dispositions are also overcome.
Schopenhauer's advocacy of mystical experience presents us with a puzzle: if everything is will without qualification, then where are we to locate the will-less mystical state of mind? According to Schopenhauer's three-tiered philosophical schema, it must be located either at the level of the will as it is in itself, or at the level of Platonic Ideas, or at the level of individual things in space and time. It cannot be the latter, because individuated consciousness is the everyday consciousness of desire, frustration and suffering. Neither can it be located at the level of the will as it is in itself, because the will is a blind striving, without knowledge, and without satisfaction.
The ascetic consciousness might be most plausibly located at the level of the universal subject-object distinction, akin to the music-filled consciousness, but Schopenhauer states explicitly states that the mystical consciousness abolishes not only time and space, but also the fundamental forms of subject and object. He states, “no will: no representation, no world” (WWR, Section 71). So in terms of its degree of generality, the mystical state of mind seems to be located at a level of universality comparable to that of the will as thing-in-itself. But it is defined clearly as not being a manifestation of the will, and therefore appears to be keyed into another dimension altogether, in total disconnection from the will as thing-in-itself. Which is to say that if the thing-in-itself is exactly congruent with will, then there is no place for the mystical consciousness within Schopenhauer's three-tiered philosophical schema of reality.
In the second volume of The World as Will and Representation (1844), published twenty-six years after the first volume, Schopenhauer addresses the above complication, and he explicitly qualifies his claim that the thing-in-itself is will. He states in the later work, that it is only “to us” that the thing-in-itself appears as will and that it remains possible that the thing-in-itself has other modes of being that are incomprehensible in ordinary terms, but which might be accessible to mystical consciousness (WWR, II, Chapter XVIII, “On the Possibility of Knowing the Thing-in-Itself”). He concludes that mystical experience is only a relative nothingness, namely, when it is considered from the standpoint of the daily world, but that it is not an absolute nothingness, as would be the case if the thing-in-itself were will in an unconditional sense, and not merely will to us.
Schopenhauer's considered position is that the thing-in-itself is multidimensional, and although the thing-in-itself is not wholly identical to the world as will, it nonetheless includes as its manifestations, the world as will and the world as representation. Hence the underlying panentheistic structure to Schopenhauer's view (noted earlier in the views of K.C.F. Krause). From a scholarly standpoint, this implies that interpretations of Schopenhauer that portray him as a Kantian who believes that knowledge of the thing-in-itself is impossible, along with interpretations of Schopenhauer that portray him as a traditional metaphysician who claims that the thing-in-itself is straightforwardly, wholly and unconditionally will, inaccurately represent Schopenhauer's outlook.
In the first volume and first edition of The World as Will and Representation (1819), we find Schopenhauer stating at one point that the thing-in-itself “to us” is will (WWR, Section, 31), and at other points stating simply that the thing-in-itself “is” will, without relativizing it to the human perspective (WWR, Sections 22 and 23). Most frequently, he uses the ambiguous phrase “the will as thing-in-itself”(“der Wille als Ding an sich”). So there is an indeterminacy about what position Schopenhauer adopted in the first volume. However, as noted, in the second volume (1844) he states explicitly that the thing-in-itself can have many dimensions, not all of which are captured by the term “will.” If we add to these considerations, that while Schopenhauer was in Dresden writing The World as Will and Representation, he lived for two years next to the theorist of panentheism, K.C.F. Krause, a stronger case can be made that with respect to the conception of the thing-in-itself, Schopenhauer consistently adopted a multidimensional, panentheist-inspired and Upanishads-inspired outlook from the start.
This observation does not render (within the parameters of his outlook) Schopenhauer's ruthlessly competitive world-scenario typically any less avoidable, but it does lead us to understand Schopenhauer's pessimistic vision of the world-as-will, as less of an outlook derived from an absolute standpoint that transcends human nature, and as more of an outlook expressive of human nature in its effort to achieve philosophical understanding. Owing to its fundamental reliance upon the subject-object distinction, Schopenhauer's classical account of the daily world as the objectification of the will, should not therefore be understood as a traditional metaphysical theory which purports to describe the unconditional truth. It should rather be understood as an expression of the human perspective on the world, which, as an embodied individual, we typically cannot avoid. It expresses only a perspective on the world, but to the degree that the subject-object distinction is epistemologically and practically unavoidable, it is a necessary one.
Rather than rendering Schopenhauer's philosophy more problematic, his later clarification renders it more systematic. For in his first volume, he emphasizes how our awareness of the thing-in-itself as will is conditioned by our bodily awareness, which is necessarily in time. In his second volume, he explains how our awareness of the thing-in-itself as will is conditioned, not only by our bodily awareness, but also by our epistemological condition, which requires the employment of the subject-object distinction. In effect, as his philosophy matures, Schopenhauer develops a dual-qualification to the absolute (i.e., higher-dimensional) knowledge of the thing-in-itself, expressed in reference to the theoretical (i.e., in relation to epistemological theory) and practical (i.e., in relation to the situated human body) aspects of the principle of sufficient reason.
As noted above, this does not imply that with respect to the question of whether higher-dimensional knowledge of the thing-in-itself is possible, Schopenhauer became more Kantian as he grew older. For unlike Kant, it appears that Schopenhauer always believed that such knowledge of the thing-in-itself is possible. Throughout his philosophical writings, Schopenhauer acknowledges that mystical experience might provide this sort of knowledge, and this view was probably only reinforced by his increasing interest in Upanishadic and Buddhistic thought as the years went by. Over time, however, Schopenhauer did achieve a more perspicuous expression of the view that the conflict-ridden daily world is only a horrible vision compelled by human nature, as it exercises its efforts to achieve knowledge at both the general (subject-object) and specific (space, time, causality) levels of the principle of sufficient reason.
Schopenhauer's influence has been strong among literary figures, which include poets, playwrights, essayists, novelists and historians such as Charles Baudelaire, Samuel Beckett, Thomas Bernhard, Jorge Luis Borges, Jacob Burckhardt, Joseph Conrad, André Gide, George Gissing, Franz Grillparzer, Thomas Hardy, Gerhardt Hauptmann, Friedrich Hebbel, Hugo von Hoffmansthal, Joris Karl Huysmans, Ernst Jünger, Karl Kraus, Stephane Mallarmé, Thomas Mann, Guy de Maupassant, Robert Musil, Edgar Allan Poe, Marcel Proust, Arno Schmidt, August Strindberg, Italo Svevo, Leo Tolstoy, Ivan Turgenev, Frank Wedekind, W. B. Yeats, and Emile Zola. In general, these authors were inspired by Schopenhauer's sense of the world's absurdity, either regarded in a more nihilistic and gloomy manner, or regarded in a more lighthearted, absurdist and comic manner.
Among philosophers, one can cite Henri Bergson, Eduard von Hartmann, Suzanne Langer, Friedrich Nietzsche, and Hans Vaihinger, who tended to focus on selected aspects of Schopenhauer's philosophy, such as his views on the meaning of life, his theory of the non-rational will, his theory of music, or his Kantianism.
Schopenhauer's theory of music, along with his emphasis upon artistic genius and the world-as-suffering, was also influential among composers such as Johannes Brahms, Antonín Dvorák, Gustav Mahler, Hans Pfitzner, Sergei Prokofiev, Nikolay Rimsky-Korsakoff, Arnold Schönberg, and Richard Wagner.
Schopenhauer's 19th century historical profile is frequently obscured by the shadows of Kant, Hegel, Marx, Mill, Darwin and Nietzsche, but more than is usually recognized, Schopenhauer perceived the shape of things to come in his rejection of rationalistic conceptions of the world. The hollow, nihilistic laughter expressed by the Dada movement at the turn of the century in the midst of WWI, reiterates feelings that Schopenhauer's philosophy had embodied almost a century earlier. Schopenhauer's ideas about the importance of instinctual urges at the core of daily life also reappeared in Freud's surrealism-inspiring psychoanalytic thought, and Schopenhauer's conviction that human history is going nowhere, became keynotes within 20th century French philosophy, after two World Wars put a damper on the 19th century anticipations of continual progress that had captured the hearts of thinkers such as Hegel and Marx.