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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
The philosophy of human rights addresses questions about the existence, content, nature, universality, and justification of human rights. The strong claims made on behalf of human rights (e.g., that they are universal, or that they exist independently of legal enactment as justified moral norms) often provoke skeptical doubts. Reflection on these doubts and the responses that can be made to them has become a sub-field of political philosophy with a substantial literature.
The general idea of human rights can be explained by setting out some defining features. It answers the question of what human rights are with a general description of the concept rather than a list of specific rights. Two people can have the same general idea of human rights even though they disagree about whether some particular rights are human rights.
Human rights are political norms dealing mainly with how people should be treated by their governments and institutions. They are not ordinary moral norms applying mainly to interpersonal conduct (such as prohibitions of lying and violence). As Thomas Pogge puts it, "to engage human rights, conduct must be in some sense official" (Pogge 2000, 47). But we must be careful here since some rights, such as rights against racial and sexual discrimination are primarily concerned to regulate private behavior (Okin 1998, United Nations 1979). Still, governments are directed in two ways by rights against discrimination. They forbid governments to discriminate in their actions and policies, and they impose duties on governments to prohibit and discourage both private and public forms of discrimination.
Second, human rights exist as moral and/or legal rights. A human right can exist as a shared norm of actual human moralities, as a justified moral norm supported by strong reasons, as a legal right at the national level (here it might be referred to as a "civil" or "constitutional" right), or as a legal right within international law. The aspiration of the human rights movement is that all human rights will come to exist in all four ways. See 3. The Existence of Human Rights
Third, human rights are numerous (several dozen) rather than few. John Locke's rights to life, liberty, and property were few and abstract, but human rights as we know them today address specific problems (e.g., guaranteeing fair trials, ending slavery, ensuring the availability of education, preventing genocide.) They protect people against familiar abuses of fundamental human interests. Because many concern contemporary institutions and problems they are not transhistorical. One could formulate human rights abstractly or conditionally to make them transhistorical, but the fact remains that the formulations in contemporary human rights documents are neither abstract nor conditional. They presuppose criminal trials, governments funded by income taxes, and formal systems of education.
Fourth, human rights are minimal standards. They are concerned with avoiding the terrible rather than with achieving the best. Their focus is protecting minimally good lives for all people (Nickel 1987). Henry Shue suggests that human rights concern the "lower limits on tolerable human conduct" rather than "great aspirations and exalted ideals" (Shue 1996). As minimal standards they leave most legal and policy matters open to democratic decision-making at the national and local levels. This allows them to accommodate a great deal of cultural and institutional variation.
Fifth, human rights are international norms covering all countries and all people living today. They are the sorts of norms that are appropriately recommended to all countries. International law plays a crucial role in giving human rights global reach. We can say that human rights are universal provided that we recognize that some rights, such as the right to vote, are held only by adult citizens; that some human rights documents focus on vulnerable groups such as children, women, and indigenous peoples; and that some rights, such as the right against genocide, are group rights.
Sixth, human rights are high-priority norms. As Maurice Cranston put it "A…test of a human right…is the test of paramount importance." "A human right is something of which no one may be deprived without a grave affront to justice" (Cranston 1967). This does not mean, however, that we should take human rights to be absolute. As James Griffin says, human rights should be understood as "resistant to trade-offs, but not too resistant" (Griffin 2001b). The high priority of human rights needs support from a plausible connection with fundamental human interests or powerful normative considerations.
Seventh, human rights have robust justifications that apply everywhere and support their high priority. Without this they cannot withstand cultural diversity and national sovereignty. Robust justifications are powerful but need not be understood as ones that are irresistible.
Eighth, human rights are rights, but not necessarily in a strict sense. As rights they have several features. One is that they have rightholders -- a person or agency having a particular right. Broadly, the rightholders of human rights are all people living today. More precisely, they are sometimes all people, sometimes all citizens of countries, sometimes all members of groups with particular vulnerabilities (women, children, racial and religious minorities, indigenous peoples), and sometimes all ethnic groups (as with rights against genocide.) Another feature of rights is that they focus on a freedom, protection, status, or benefit. A right is always to something which is the focus of the rightholders' interest (Brandt 1983, 44). Rights also have addressees who are assigned duties or responsibilities. A person's human rights are not primarily rights against the United Nations or other international bodies; they primarily impose obligations on the government of the country in which the person resides or is located. The human rights of a citizen of Belgium are mainly addressed to his government. International agencies, and the governments of countries other than one's own, are secondary or "backup" addressees. International human rights organizations provide encouragement, assistance, and sometimes criticism to states in order to assist them in fulfilling their duties. The duties associated with human rights typically require actions involving respect, protection, facilitation, and provision. Finally, rights are usually mandatory in the sense of imposing duties on their addressees, but they sometimes do little more than declare high-priority goals and assign responsibility for their progressive realization. For example, the International Covenant on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (United Nations 1966c), which covers rights to basic human needs such as food, clothing, housing, and education, commits its signatories to "take steps...to the maximum of...available resources, with a view to achieving progressively the full realization of the rights recognized in the present Covenant…." It is possible to argue, of course, that goal-like rights are not real rights, but it may be better to recognize that they compromise a weaker or looser notion of a right.
Having set out a general idea of human rights with eight elements, it is useful to consider three other candidates which I think should be rejected. The first is the claim that all human rights are negative rights, in the sense that they only require governments to refrain from doing things. On this view, human rights never require governments to take positive steps such as protecting and providing. This claim is not compatible with the attractive view that one of the main jobs of governments is to protect people's rights by creating a system of criminal law and of legal property rights. The European Convention on Human Rights (Council of Europe 1950) incorporates this view when it says that "Everyone's right to life shall be protected by law" (Article 2.1). And the UN Torture Convention (United Nations 1984) imposes the requirement that "Each State Party shall ensure that all acts of torture are offences under its criminal law" (Article 4.1).
A second claim to be rejected is that human rights are inalienable. Inalienability does not mean that rights are absolute or can never be overridden by other considerations. To say that a right is inalienable means that its holder cannot lose it temporarily or permanently by bad conduct or by voluntarily giving it up. I doubt that all human rights are inalienable in this sense. If we believe in imprisonment for legal crimes, then people's rights to freedom of movement can be forfeited temporarily or permanently by just convictions of serious crimes. And the right to freedom of movement can be voluntarily alienated by a person who makes a lifelong commitment to live in a monastery. Human rights are not inalienable but they are hard to lose.
Third, I think we should reject John Rawls' proposal in The Law of Peoples that by definition human rights define where legitimate toleration of other countries ends. Rawls says that human rights "specify limits to a regime's internal autonomy" and that "their fulfillment is sufficient to exclude justified and forceful intervention by other peoples, for example, by diplomatic and economic sanctions, or in grave cases by military force" (Rawls 1999, 79-80).
It is a grave oversimplification to suggest that there is a line defined by human rights where national sovereignty ends. There is no need to deny that human rights are helpful in identifying the limits of justifiable toleration, but there are several reasons to doubt that they simply define that boundary. First, the "fulfillment" of human rights is a very vague idea. No country fully satisfies human rights; all countries have significant human rights problems. Some countries have large human rights problems, and many have massive problems ("gross violations of human rights"). Beyond this, the responsibility of the current government of a country for these problems also varies. The main responsibility may belong to the previous government and the current government may be taking reasonable steps to move towards greater compliance.
Further, defining human rights as norms that set the bounds of toleration requires restricting human rights to only a few fundamental rights. Rawls suggests the following list: "the right to life (to the means of subsistence and security); to liberty (to freedom from slavery, serfdom, and forced occupation, and to a sufficient measure of liberty of conscience to ensure freedom of religion and thought); to property (personal property); and to formal equality as pressed by the rules of natural justice (that is, that similar cases be treated similarly)" (Rawls 1999, 65). As Rawls recognizes this list leaves out most freedoms, rights of political participation, equality rights, and welfare rights. Leaving out any protection for equality and democracy is a high price to pay for assigning human rights the role of setting the bounds of tolerance, and we can accommodate Rawls' underlying idea without paying it. The underlying idea is that countries with massive violations of the most important human rights are not to be tolerated -- particularly when the notion of toleration implies, as Rawls thinks it does, full and equal membership in good standing in the community of nations. But to use this idea we do not need to follow Rawls in equating human rights with some radically stripped down list of human rights. Instead we can develop a doctrine -- which is needed for other purposes anyway -- of which human rights are the most important. Massive violations of the most fundamental rights can then be used as grounds for non-tolerance.
The UDHR has been astoundingly successful in setting the pattern for subsequent human rights treaties, and in getting countries to include its list of rights in national constitutions and bills of rights (Morsink 1999). The UDHR, and the treaties that followed it, largely define what people today mean when they speak of human rights. The UDHR was not so successful, however, in gaining real compliance with its norms rather than lip service to the general idea of human rights. Real acceptance of the full range of human rights still seems to be missing in many parts of the world.
The ECHR created a human rights court, the European Court of Human Rights, to interpret human rights norms and to adjudicate disputes. Countries that ratify the ECHR agree to respect and implement a list of rights, but they also agree to the investigation, mediation, and adjudication of human rights complaints. The ECHR is now the most effective system for protecting human rights at the international level. The Court, based in Strasbourg, France, has one judge from each participating state -- although the judges are appointed as independent jurists rather than as state representatives. Citizens from the participating countries with human rights complaints who have been unable to find a remedy in their national courts may petition the European Court of Human Rights. Complaints by governments about human rights violations in another participating country are also permitted, but are rarely made. If the Court agrees to hear a complaint, it investigates and adjudicates it. Before issuing a judgment, the Court attempts to mediate the dispute. If conciliation fails, the Court will issue a judgment and impose a remedy. Through this process a large body of international human rights jurisprudence has developed (Jacobs and White 1996; Janis, Kay and Bradley 1995). Governments almost always accept the Court's judgments. Compliance occurs because governments are committed to the ECHR and to the rule of law, and because their membership in good standing in the Council of Europe would be endangered were they to defy the Court.
The plan to make the rights in the UDHR into norms of international law also went ahead, but at a glacial pace. Drafts of the International Covenants were submitted to the General Assembly for approval in 1953. To accommodate those who believed that economic and social rights were not genuine human rights or that they should not be enforceable in the same way as civil and political rights, two treaties were prepared, the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights (ICCPR; United Nations 1966b) and the International Covenant on Economic, Social, and Cultural Rights (ICESCR; United Nations 1966c). These treaties embodying the UDHR's rights were not approved by the General Assembly until 1966 and only received enough ratifications to become operative in 1976. The ICCPR contains most of the civil and political rights found in the UDHR. The ICESCR contains the economic and social rights found in the second half of the UDHR.
Between the UDHR of 1948 and the General Assembly's approval of the International Covenants in 1966, many African and Asian nations, recently freed from colonial rule, entered the United Nations. They were generally willing to go along with the human rights enterprise, but they modified it to reflect their own interests and concerns, such as finishing off colonialism, criticizing Apartheid in South Africa, and condemning racial discrimination around the world. The International Covenants reflect these concerns; both contain identical articles asserting rights of peoples to self-determination and to control their own natural resources. Rights against discrimination were given a prominent place. And the UDHR's rights to property and to remuneration for property taken by the state were deleted from the Covenants.
A country ratifying a UN human rights treaty agrees to respect and implement the rights the treaty covers. It also agrees to accept and respond to international scrutiny and criticism of its compliance. The ICCPR, which has been ratified by nearly 150 countries, illustrates the standard UN system for implementing an international bill of rights. The Covenant created an agency, the Human Rights Committee, to promote compliance with its norms. The eighteen members of the Human Rights Committee serve in their personal capacity as experts rather than as state representatives, which gives them some freedom to express their own perspectives as experts rather than those of their country. Unlike the ECHR, the ICCPR did not create a human rights court to give authoritative interpretations of its norms. The Human Rights Committee can express its views as to whether a particular practice is a human rights violation, but it is not authorized to issue legally binding reports (Alston and Crawford 2000).
The ICCPR requires participating states to report periodically on their compliance with the treaty. The Human Rights Committee has the job of receiving, studying, and commenting critically on these reports (Boerefijn 1999, McGoldrick 1994). The Committee holds public sessions in which it hears from non-governmental organizations such as Amnesty International and meets with representatives of the state making the report. The Human Rights Committee then publishes "Concluding Observations" that evaluate human rights compliance by the reporting country. This process requires countries to hold discussions with the Human Rights Committee and have their human rights problems exposed to world public opinion. The reporting procedure is useful in encouraging countries to identify their major human rights problems and to devise methods of dealing with them over time. But the reporting system has few teeth when dealing with countries that stonewall or fail to report, and the Human Rights Committee's conclusions often receive little attention (Bayefsky 2001). In addition to the required reporting procedure, the ICCPR has an optional provision requiring separate ratification that authorizes the Human Rights Committee to receive, investigate, and mediate complaints from individuals alleging that their rights under the ICCPR have been violated by a participating state (Joseph, Schultz, and Castan 2000). By 2000, 95 of the 144 states adhering to the ICCPR had ratified this optional provision.
Overall, this system for implementing human rights is limited. It does not give the Human Rights Committee the power to order states to change their practices or compensate a victim. Its tools are limited to persuasion, mediation, and exposure of violations to public scrutiny.
There are many other UN human rights treaties that are implemented in roughly the same way as the ICCPR. These include the International Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Racial Discrimination (United Nations 1966). The Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women (United Nations 1979), The Convention on the Rights of the Child (United Nations 1989), and The Convention against Torture and Other Cruel, Inhuman or Degrading Treatment or Punishment (United Nations 1984).
Another UN agency with jurisdiction in the human rights area is the International Criminal Court (United Nations, 1998). Its members were selected in 2003. As noted above, its jurisdiction includes genocide, war crimes, and crimes against humanity such as extermination, enslavement, and torture. (Schabas 2001).
The High Commissioner for Human Rights coordinates the many human rights activities within the UN. The High-Commissioner receives complaints about human rights violations, assists in the development of new treaties and procedures, sets the agenda for human rights agencies within the UN, and provides advisory services to governments. Most importantly, the High Commissioner serves as a full-time advocate for human rights within the United Nations (Korey 1998, 369).
The Human Rights Commission is a standing body, created by the UN Charter, composed of 53 state representatives. Its main job is to deal with gross violations of human rights wherever they occur. Because its members are state representatives rather than independent experts or jurists, the Commission is more of a political body than the Human Rights Committee established by the ICCPR. If the Human Rights Committee established under the ICCPR deals with human rights issues as a matter of international law, the Human Rights Commission deals with human rights issues as matters of international politics and diplomacy. The Human Rights Commission's achievements include authoring the UDHR and many human rights treaties, as well as the extended and successful campaign against apartheid in South Africa (Tolley 1987).
The Commission's main focus is situations revealing "a consistent pattern of gross…violations of human rights." The Commission is authorized to receive complaints alleging gross violations, and it deals with these complaints in closed sessions. The Human Rights Commission also holds a public session each year in which states and nongovernmental organizations are invited to identify areas of the world in which there are serious human rights problems for the Commission to address. When the Commission decides to take up a complaint it has a number of means it can use. It can ask the government to respond to the complaint, appoint investigators of its own, or refer the matter to the Security Council. The Commission also has "thematic" working groups that work with particular types of human rights problems.
The Security Council's mandate under the UN Charter is the maintenance of international peace and security. The fifteen-member body can authorize military interventions and impose diplomatic and economic sanctions (Bailey 1994, Ramcharan 2002). During the Cold War the Security Council tended to avoid human rights disputes other than apartheid in South Africa. But since the early 1990s the Security Council has dealt with many issues pertaining to human rights and war crimes. It authorized the use of military force in Somalia, the former Yugoslavia, Rwanda, Haiti, and East Timor, and sponsored a number of peacekeeping missions (Katayanagi 2002). It also established international criminal tribunals for Rwanda and Yugoslavia.
The first, which includes almost all countries of the Americas, is broadly similar to the European system. Its main documents are: The American Declaration of the Rights and Duties of Man (Organization of American States, 1948) and The American Convention on Human Rights (Organization of American States 1969). Its bodies are the Inter-American Commission on Human Rights (established 1960) and The Inter-American Court of Human Rights (established 1979). The Commission investigates individual complaints and prepares reports on countries with severe human rights problems. The Court is authorized to interpret and enforce the Convention (Davidson 1997) Although this system is broadly similar to the European human rights regime, the context in which it operates is very different. The scale of human rights problems in Latin America is far larger than in Europe, and during the 1980s many governments were committed to flouting human rights. So far, the Commission has been a far more important actor than the Court (Farer 1997).
The African System, covering the countries of the African continent, has a human rights treaty and a human rights commission. The treaty, created by the African Union (formerly the Organization of African Unity), is The African Charter on Human and Peoples' Rights (African Union 1981). The African Commission on Human and Peoples' Rights, created in 1986, promotes human rights in Africa and monitors compliance with the treaty. Countries are required to submit regular reports to the Commission on their human rights problems and efforts to address them. An effort to create a court, The African Court on Human and Peoples' Rights, is underway. The African system has enormous human rights problems to address, frequently faces non-cooperation by governments, and has inadequate resources to play a major role (Evans and Murray 2002).
Efforts by states help to add real power to the international human rights system. The countries of Western Europe, Canada, Australia, and the United States, have been the pillars of the human rights establishment. They have lent their considerable support and clout to the system, keeping it going during hard times and helping it expand and flourish in better times. Although they have not always risen to the challenge of human rights emergencies, they have sometimes done so at considerable cost to themselves in money and lives. They have often worked closely with the Security Council. They do not, however, have a standing legal commitment to do this, except their commitment in the UN Charter to support the actions of the Security Council (Steiner and Alston 2000, 987f).
Enactment in national and international law is one of the ways in which human rights exist. But many have suggested that this is not the only way. If human rights exist only because of enactment, their availability is contingent on domestic and international political developments. Many people have sought to find a way to support the idea that human rights have roots that are deeper and less subject to human decisions than legal enactment. One version of this idea is that people are born with rights, that human rights are somehow innate or inherent in human beings. One way that a normative status could be inherent in humans is by being God-given. The US Declaration of Independence (1776) claims that people are "endowed by their Creator" with natural rights to "life, liberty, and the pursuit of happiness." On this view, God is the supreme lawmaker and enacted some basic human rights.
Rights plausibly attributed to divine decree must be very general and abstract (life, liberty, etc.) so that they can apply to thousands of years of human history, not just to recent centuries. But contemporary human rights are more numerous and specific (the right to a fair trial, the right to freedom of religion, the right to equality before the law, etc.) Even if people are born with God-given natural rights, we need to explain how we get from those general and abstract rights to the specific rights found in contemporary declarations and treaties. Attributing human rights to God's commands may give them a secure status at the metaphysical level, but in a very diverse world it does not in fact make them practically secure. Billions of people do not believe in the God found in Christianity, Islam, and Judaism. If people do not believe in God, or in the sort of god that prescribes rights, then if you want to base human rights on theological beliefs you must persuade these people of a rights-supporting theological view, which is likely to be even harder than persuading them of human rights. Legal enactment at the national and international levels provides a far more secure status for practical purposes.
Human rights might also exist independently of legal enactment by being part of actual human moralities. It appears that all human groups have moralities, that is, imperative norms of behavior backed by reasons and values. These moralities contain specific norms (e.g., a prohibition of the intentional murder of an innocent person) and specific values (e.g., valuing human life.) One way in which human rights could exist apart from divine or human enactment is as norms accepted in all or almost all actual human moralities. If almost all human groups have moralities containing norms prohibiting murder, these norms could constitute the human right to life. Human rights can be seen as basic moral norms shared by all or almost all accepted human moralities.
This view is attractive but filled with difficulties. First, it seems unlikely that the moralities of almost all human groups agree in condemning, say, torture, unfair criminal trials, undemocratic institutions, and discrimination on the basis of race or sex. There is a lot of disagreement among countries and cultures about these matters. Human rights declarations and treaties are intended to change existing norms, not just describe the existing moral consensus. Second, it is far from clear that the shared norms that do exist support rights held by individuals. A group may think that torture is generally a bad thing without holding that all individuals have a high-priority right against being tortured. Third, human rights are mainly about the obligations of governments. Ordinary interpersonal moralities often have little to say about what governments should and should not do. This is a matter of political morality, and depends not just on moral principles but also on views of the dangers and capacities of the contemporary state.
Yet another way of explaining the existence of human rights is to say that they exist in true or justified moralities. On this account, to says that there is a human right against torture is just to say that there are strong reasons for believing that it is almost always wrong to engage in torture. This approach would view the UDHR as attempting to formulate a justified political morality. It was not merely trying to identify a preexisting moral consensus; it was also trying to create a consensus on how governments should behave that was supported by the most plausible moral and practical reasons. This approach requires commitment to the objectivity of moral and practical reasons. It holds that just as there are reliable ways of finding out how the physical world works, or what makes buildings sturdy and durable, there are ways of finding out what individuals may justifiably demand of governments. Even if there is little present agreement on political morality, rational agreement is available to humans if they will commit themselves to open-minded and serious moral and political inquiry. If moral reasons exist independently of human construction, they can when combined with premises about current institutions, problems, and resources generate moral norms different from those currently accepted or enacted. The UDHR seems to proceed on exactly this assumption. One problem with this view is that existence as good reasons seems a rather thin form of existence for human rights. But perhaps we can view this thinness as a practical rather than a theoretical problem, as something to be remedied by the formulation and enactment of legal norms. After all, the best form of existence for human rights would combine robust legal existence with the sort of moral existence that comes from being supported by strong moral and practical reasons.
Human rights are specific and problem-oriented. Historic bills of rights often begin with a list of complaints about the abuses of previous regimes or eras. Bills of rights may have preambles that speak grandly and abstractly of life, liberty, and the inherent dignity of persons, but their lists of rights contain specific norms addressed to familiar political, legal, or economic problems.
In deciding which specific rights are human rights it is possible to make either too little or too much of international documents such as the UDHR and the ECHR. One makes too little of them by proceeding as if drawing up a list of important rights were a new question, never before addressed, and as if there were no practical wisdom to be found in the choices of rights that went into the historic documents. And one makes too much of them by presuming that those documents tell us everything we need to know about human rights. This approach involves a kind of fundamentalism: it holds that if a right is on the official lists of human rights that settles its status as a human right ("If it's in the book that's all I need to know.") But the process of listing human rights in the United Nations and elsewhere was a political process with plenty of imperfections. There is little reason to take international diplomats as the most authoritative guides to which human rights there are. Further, even if a treaty could settle the issue of whether a certain right is a human right within international law, such a treaty cannot settle its weight. It may claim that the right is supported by weighty considerations, but it cannot make this so. If an international treaty enacted a right to visit national parks without charge as a human right, the ratification of that treaty would make free access to national parks a "human right" within international law. But it would not be able to make us believe that the right to visit national parks without charge was sufficiently important to be a real human right.
Once one takes seriously the question of whether some norms that are now counted as human rights do not merit that status (Griffin, 2001a and 2001b) and whether some norms that are not currently accepted as human rights should be upgraded, there are many possible ways to proceed. One approach that should be avoided puts a lot of weight on whether the norm in question really is, or could be, a right in a strict sense. This approach might yield arguments that human rights cannot include children's rights since young children cannot exercise their rights by invoking, claiming, or waiving (Hart 1955, Wellman 1995, Achard 2002). This approach begs the question of whether human rights are rights in a strict sense rather than a fairly loose one. The human rights movement and its purposes are not well served by being forced into a narrow conceptual framework. The most basic idea of the human rights movement is not that of a right, but the idea of regulating the behavior of governments through international norms. And when we look at human rights documents we find that they use a variety of normative concepts. Sometimes they speak of rights, as when the UDHR says that "Everyone has the right to freedom of movement…" (Article 13). Sometimes these documents issue prohibitions, as when the UDHR says that "No one shall be subjected to arbitrary arrest, detention, or exile" (Article 9). And at other times they express general principles, as illustrated by the UDHR's declaration that "All are equal before the law…" (Article 7).
A better way to evaluate a norm that is nominated for the status of human right is to consider whether it is compatible with the general idea of human rights that we find in international human rights documents. If the general idea of human rights suggested above is correct, it requires affirmative answers to questions such as whether this norm could have governments as its primary addressees, whether it ensures that people can have minimally good lives, whether it has high priority, and whether it can be supported by strong reasons that make plausible its universality and high priority.
The last question plays an especially important role. It leads to further questions such as: First, are very important human interests, values, or norms are protected by the right against common threats? Second, are the duties or responsibilities imposed by the norm on its addressees (such as governments, citizens, or international agencies) ones that are justifiable? And third, does the right make feasible demands? For the right against torture, for example, it is possible to give satisfactory answers to these questions. Torture is all too common even though it is very harmful to people's lives, health, and liberty. Duties to refrain from torture are appropriately imposed on all agents, but particularly on governments. Duties to protect people from torture are appropriately imposed on governments and international agencies. And these are duties that most countries are in a position to fulfill. Stopping torture may not be easy, but most countries can do it.
Questions about which rights are human rights arise in regard to many families of human rights. Discussed below are (1) civil and political rights; (2) economic and social rights; (3) minority and group rights; and (4) environmental rights.
Everyone has the right to freedom of thought and expression. This right includes freedom to seek, receive, and impart information and ideas of all kinds, regardless of frontiers, either orally, in writing, in print, in the form of art, or through any other medium of one's choice. (American Convention on Human Rights, Article 13.1)These rights fit the general idea of human rights suggested above (see 1. The General Idea of Human Rights). First, they are political norms that primarily impose responsibilities on governments and international organizations. Second, they are minimal norms in that they protect against the worst things that happen in political society rather than setting out standards of excellence in government. Third, they are international norms establishing standards for all countries -- and that have been accepted by more than 140 of the world's countries. Finally, it is plausible to make claims of high priority on their behalf, and to support these claims of importance with strong reasons. Consider the right to freedom of movement. One approach to justifying this right and its high priority would argue the importance of free movement to being able to find the necessities of life, to pursuing plans, projects, and commitments, and to maintaining ties to family and friends. A related approach argues that it is impossible to make use of other human rights if one cannot move freely. The right to political participation is undermined if a person is not permitted to go to political rallies or to the polls.
Everyone has the right to freedom of peaceful assembly and to freedom of association with others, including the right to form and to join trade unions for the protection of his interests (ECHR, Article 11).
Every citizen shall have the right to participate freely in the government of his country, either directly or through freely chosen representatives in accordance with the provisions of the law. 2. Every citizen shall have the right of equal access to the public service of his country. 3. Every individual shall have the right of access to public property and services in strict equality of all persons before the law (African Charter, Article 13).
Civil and political rights are not absolute, and they may sometimes be suspended. Some civil and political rights can be restricted by public and private property rights, by restraining orders related to domestic violence, and by legal punishments. Further, after a disaster such as a hurricane or earthquake free movement is often appropriately suspended to keep out the curious, to permit access of emergency vehicles and equipment, and to prevent looting. The ICCPR permits rights to be suspended during times "of public emergency which threatens the life of the nation" (Article 4). But it excludes some rights from suspension including the right to life, the prohibition of torture, the prohibition of slavery, the prohibition of ex post facto criminal laws, and freedom of thought and religion.
Some standard individual rights are especially important to ethnic and religious minorities, including rights to freedom of association, freedom of assembly, freedom of religion, and freedom from discrimination. Human rights documents also include rights that refer to minorities explicitly and give them special protections. For example, the ICCPR in Article 27 says that persons belonging to ethnic, religious, or linguistic minorities "shall not be denied the right, in community with other members of their group, to enjoy their own culture, to profess and practice their own religion, or to use their own language."
Minority groups are often targets of violence and human rights norms call upon governments to refrain from such violence and to provide protections against it. This work is partly done by the right to life, which is a standard individual right. But the right against genocide protects groups from attempts to destroy or decimate them. The Genocide Convention was one of the first human rights treaties after World War II. It says:
…genocide means any of the following acts committed with intent to destroy, in whole or in part, a national, ethnical, racial, or religious group, as such: (a) Killing members of the group; (b) Causing serious bodily or mental harm to members of the group; (c) Deliberately inflicting on the group conditions of life calculated to bring about its physical destruction in whole or in part; (d) Imposing measures intended to prevent births within the group; (e) Forcibly transferring children of the group to another group.
The right against genocide seems to be a group right. It is held by groups and provides protection to groups as groups. It is largely negative in the sense that it requires governments and other agencies to refrain from destroying groups; but it also requires that legal and other protections be implemented for this purpose.
Can a group right fit the general idea of human rights proposed earlier? It can if we broaden the conception of who can hold human rights to include ethnic and religious groups. This can be made more palatable, perhaps, by recognizing that the beneficiaries of the right against genocide are individual humans who enjoy greater security against attempts to destroy the group to which they belong (Kymlicka 1989).
The right to a safe environment can be sculpted to fit the general idea of human rights suggested above by conceiving it as primarily imposing duties on governments and international organizations. It calls on them to regulate the activities of both governmental and nongovernmental agents to ensure that environmental safety is maintained. Citizens are secondary addressees. This right sets out a minimal environmental standard, safety for humans, rather than calling for higher and broader standards of environmental protection. (Countries that are able to implement higher standards are of course free to enact those standards in their law or bill of rights.)
A justification for this right must show that environmental problems pose serious threats to fundamental human interests, values, or norms; that governments may appropriately be burdened with the responsibility of protecting people against these threats; and that most governments actually have the ability to do this. This last requirement -- feasibility -- may be the most difficult. Environmental protection is expensive and difficult, and many governments will be unable to do very much of it while meeting other important responsibilities. The problem of feasibility in poorer countries might be addressed here in the same way that it was in the ICESCR. That treaty commits governments not to the immediate realization of economic and social rights for all, but rather to making the realization of such rights a high-priority goal and beginning to take steps towards its fulfillment.
In thinking about adding new rights to the list of human rights it is important to recognize that implementing a right is an activity with opportunity costs. As a rough illustration, if nine rights are already implemented and we add another, and if each right costs about the same amount to implement, then each of the original nine will get about ten percent less resources because of the addition of the tenth. Rights are not magical sources of supply (Nickel 1987, Chapter 7; Holmes and Sunstein 1999).
A human rights treaty usually contains three parts: (1) a list of rights; (2) a specification of what the parties are agreeing to do in regard to this list; and (3) a system to monitor and promote compliance with the agreement. The ICESCR's list of rights includes nondiscrimination and equality for women in the economic and social area (Articles 2 and 3), freedom to work and opportunities to work (Article 4), fair pay and decent conditions of work (Article 7), the right to form trade unions and to strike (Article 8), social security (Article 9), special protections for mothers and children (Article 10), the right to adequate food, clothing, and housing (Article 11), the right to basic health services (Article 12), the right to education (Article 13), and the right to participate in cultural life and scientific progress (Article 15).
Article 2.1 of the ICESCR sets out what the parties commit themselves to do about this list, namely to "take steps, individually and through international assistance and co-operation…to the maximum of its available resources, with a view to achieving progressively the full realization of the rights recognized in the present Covenant…." In contrast, the ICCPR simply commits its signatories to "respect and to ensure to all individuals within its territory…the rights recognized in the present Covenant…" (Article 2.1). The contrast between these two levels of commitment is one of the things that has led some people to suspect that economic and social rights are really just goals.
The system to monitor and promote compliance with the ICESCR is weak since it merely requires participating countries to make periodic reports on measures taken to comply with the treaty. Countries agree "to submit…reports on the measures which they have adopted and the progress made in achieving the observance of the rights recognized herein" (Article 16). A committee of experts, created by the Economic and Social Council in 1987, is given the job of looking at the progress reports from the participating countries. This body, the Committee on Economic, Social and Cultural Rights, studies the reports, discusses them with representatives of the governments reporting, and issues interpretive statements (called "General Comments") on the requirements of the treaty. Since 1991 it has issued more than a dozen of these interpretive statements (United Nations 1991). ICESCR has no system for receiving complaints of violations of economic and social rights.
Why did the ICESCR opt for progressive implementation and thereby treat its rights as being somewhat like goals? The main reason, I think, is that more than half of the world's countries were in no position, in terms of economic, institutional, and human resources, to realize these standards fully or even largely. For many countries, noncompliance due to inability would have been certain if these standards had been treated as immediately binding. We will return to this topic below.
Opponents of welfare rights often deny them the status of human rights, restricting that standing to civil and political rights. Familiar objections to welfare rights include the following: (1) welfare rights do not serve truly fundamental interests; (2) welfare rights are too burdensome on governments and taxpayers; and (3) welfare rights are not feasible in less-developed countries (Beetham 1995).
Let's first address the issue of importance. Human rights, such as rights to freedom from torture or to fair trials in criminal and civil cases, set out minimal but extremely important standards that governments everywhere should meet. One might object that welfare rights do not meet this standard of great importance. Perhaps they identify valuable goods, but not extremely valuable goods. If this objection is that some formulations of welfare rights in international human rights documents are too expansive and go beyond what is necessary to a minimally good life it can be conceded and those formulations rejected. For example, the UDHR included a putative right to holidays with pay (Article 24), and such a right pertains to a good life, not to a minimally good life. It is far from the case, however, that all or most welfare rights pertain to superficial interests. To discuss the issue of importance I will use two welfare rights as examples: the right to an adequate standard of living, and the right to free public education. These rights require governments to try to remedy widespread and serious evils such as hunger and ignorance.
The importance of food and other basic material conditions of life is easy to show. These goods are essential to people's ability to live, function, and flourish. Without adequate access to these goods, interests in life, health, and liberty are endangered and serious illness and death are probable. The connection between having the goods the right guarantees and having a minimally good life is direct and obvious -- something that is not always true with other human rights (Orend 2002, 115).
In the contemporary world lack of access to educational opportunities typically limits (both absolutely and comparatively) people's abilities to participate fully and effectively in the political and economic life of their country (Hodgson 1998). Lack of education increases the likelihood of unemployment and underemployment.
Another way to support the importance of welfare rights is to show their importance to the full implementation of civil and political rights. If a government succeeds in eliminating hunger and providing education to everyone this promotes people's abilities to know, use, and enjoy their liberties, due process rights, and rights of political participation. This is easiest to see in regard to education. Ignorance is a barrier to the realization of civil and political rights because uneducated people often do not know what rights they have and what they can do to use and defend them. It is also easy to see in the area of democratic participation. Education and a minimum income make it easier for people at the bottom economically to follow politics, participate in political campaigns, and to spend the time and money needed to go to the polls and vote.
The second objection is that welfare rights are too burdensome. It is very expensive to guarantee to everyone basic education and minimal material conditions of life. Perhaps welfare rights are too expensive or burdensome to be justified even in rich countries. Frequently the claim that welfare rights are too burdensome uses other, less controversial human rights as a standard of comparison, and suggests that welfare rights are substantially more burdensome or expensive than liberty rights. Suppose that we use as a basis of comparison liberty rights such as freedom of communication, association, and movement. These rights require both respect and protection from governments. And people cannot be adequately protected in their enjoyment of liberties such as these unless they also have security and due process rights. The costs of liberty, as it were, include the costs of law and criminal justice. Once we see this, liberties start to look a lot more costly. To provide effective liberties to communicate, associate, and move it is not enough for a society to make a prohibition of interference with these activities part of its law and accepted morality. An effective system of provision for these liberties will require a legal scheme that defines personal and property rights and protects these rights against invasions while ensuring due process to those accused of crimes. Providing such legal protection in the form of legislatures, police, courts, and prisons is extremely expensive.
Further, we should not think of welfare rights as simply giving everyone a free supply of the goods these rights protect. Guarantees of things like food and housing will be intolerably expensive and will undermine productivity if everyone simply receives a free supply. A viable system of welfare rights will require most people to provide these goods for themselves and their families through work as long as they are given the necessary opportunities, education, and infrastructure. Government-implemented welfare rights provide guarantees of availability (or "secure access"), but governments should have to supply the requisite goods in only a small fraction of cases. Note that primary education is often an exception to this since many countries provide free public education irrespective of ability to pay.
Countries that do not accept and implement welfare rights still have to bear somehow the costs of providing for the needy since these countries -- particularly if they recognize democratic rights of political participation -- are unlikely to find it tolerable to allow sizeable parts of the population to starve and be homeless. If government does not supply food, clothing, and shelter to those unable to provide for themselves, then families, friends, and communities will have to shoulder this burden. It is only in the last century that government-sponsored welfare rights have taken over a substantial part of the burden of providing for the needy. The taxes associated with welfare rights are partial replacements for other burdensome duties, namely the duties of families and communities to provide adequate care for the unemployed, sick, disabled, and aged. Deciding whether to implement welfare rights is not a matter of deciding whether to bear such burdens, but rather of deciding whether to continue with total reliance on a system of informal provision that distributes benefits in a very spotty way and whose costs fall very unevenly on families, friends, and communities.
Once we recognize that liberty rights are also carry high costs, that intelligent systems of provision for welfare rights supply the requisite goods to people in only a small minority of cases, and that these systems are substitutes for other, more local ways of providing for the needy, the difference between the burdensomeness of liberty rights and the burdensomeness of welfare rights ceases to seem so large.
Even if the burdens imposed by economic and social rights are not excessive, they might still be wrong to impose on individuals. Libertarians object to welfare rights as requiring impermissible taxation. Nozick, for example, says that "Taxation of earnings from labor is on a par with forced labor" (Nozick 1974, 169). This view is vulnerable to an attack asserting two things. First, taxation is permissible when used to discharge the duties of taxpayers, when, for example, it is used to support government-organized systems of humanitarian assistance that fulfill more effectively duties of assistance that all individuals have (Beetham 1995, 53). Second, property rights are not so strong that they can never be outweighed by the requirements of meeting other rights.
The third objection to welfare rights is that they are not feasible in many countries. It is very expensive to provide guarantees of subsistence, minimal public health measures, and basic education. As we saw above, the ICESCR dealt with the issue of feasibility by calling for progressive implementation, that is, implementation as financial and other resources permit. Does this view of implementation turn welfare rights into high-priority goals? If so, is that a bad thing?
Standards that outrun the abilities of many of their addressees are good candidates for normative treatment as goals. Treating such standards as goals, which allows us to view them as largely aspirational rather than as imposing immediate duties, avoids massive problems of inability-based noncompliance. One may worry, however, that this is too much of a demotion. Goals seem much weaker than rights. But goals can be formulated in ways that make them more like rights. Goals can be assigned addressees (the party who is to pursue the goal), beneficiaries, scopes that define the objective to be pursued, and a high level of priority. Strong reasons for the importance of these goals can be provided. And supervisory bodies can monitor levels of progress and pressure low-performing addressees to attend to and work on their goals.
Treating very demanding rights as goals has several advantages. One is that proposed goals that exceed one's abilities are not as farcical as proposed duties that exceed one's abilities. Creating grand lists of human rights that many countries cannot realize seems fraudulent to many people, and perhaps this fraudulence is reduced if we understand that these "rights" are really goals that countries should promote. Goals are inherently ability-calibrated. What you should do now about your goals depends on your abilities and other commitments. Goals coexist happily with low levels of ability to achieve them. Another advantage is that goals are flexible; addressees with different levels of ability can choose ways of pursuing the goals that suit their circumstances and means. Because of these attractions of goals, it will be worth exploring ways to transform very demanding human rights into goals. The transformation may be full or partial.
A standard right together with its supporting reasons might be divided into two parts. One part, call it the "demand side," sets out the rightholder's claim and the reasons why it is very valuable or important that this claim be fulfilled. If the right is the right to a fair trial when one is arrested and accused of a crime, the demand side would set out the rightholder's claim to a fair trial and the reasons why that claim is very valuable or important. The other part, the "supply side," would set out the addressees' responsibilities in regard to the rightholder's claim. It would explain why this claim to a fair trial is a matter of duty, what the duties are, and why it is these particular addressees rather than other possible addressees that have the duty (Feinberg 1973).
A goal that is similar to a right could also be divided into these two parts. The demand side would set out the beneficiary's claim or demand and the reasons why it is very desirable or important that this demand be fulfilled. For example, the demand side might set out the reasons why it is desirable for the beneficiary to have access to employment. And the supply side would set out the addressee's responsibility in regard to the beneficiary's demand. It would explain why promoting access to employment for the beneficiary should be a goal for the addressee. It does not impose duties on the addressee, but it shows that the addressee has good reasons for acting to satisfy the demand.
Since even a goal that is supported by good reasons imposes no duties -- that is, fails to be mandatory in character -- we may think that such goals are poor substitutes for rights and should not be called "rights." But it is possible to create right-goal mixtures that contain some mandatory elements and that therefore seem more like real rights. A minimal right-goal mixture would include a duty to try to realize the goal as quickly as possible. Here the demand side would set out the beneficiary's demand or claim and the reasons why it is very desirable or important that this demand be fulfilled. And the supply side would explain not only why the addressee has good reasons to pursue this goal, but also explain why the addressee has a duty to try to realize this goal with all deliberate speed. The economic and social rights in the ICESCR seem to fit this model. The countries ratifying the ICESCR agree to make it a matter of government duty to realize the list of rights as soon as possible. As we saw earlier, the ICESCR's signatories agree to "take steps, individually and through international assistance and co-operation…to the maximum of its available resources, with a view to achieving progressively the full realization of the rights recognized in the present Covenant…." The signatories agree, on this interpretation, to make it a matter of duty to realize the listed rights as soon and as far as resources permit.
A problem with such a right-goal mixture is that it allows the addressee great discretion concerning when to do something about the right and how much to do. A body supervising compliance with a human rights treaty may wish to remove some of this discretion by requiring that the addressees at least take some significant and good faith steps immediately and regularly and that these steps be documented. Duties to try are less vaporous if they are combined with duties that require specific concrete steps as part of one's effort and duties that require performance and outcomes be monitored. To promote action countries may be required to act in certain ways (e.g., make a good faith effort and be prepared to demonstrate that they have done so), set specific benchmarks and timetables, establish agencies to work on the goals, provide them with budgets, and use expert assistance from international agencies. To facilitate the monitoring of compliance the country may be required to collect data continuously concerning realization of the goals, make periodic reports, and allow its citizens to complain to the monitoring body about failures to pursue the goals energetically(United Nations 1991).
Article 14 of ICESCR imposes a conditional duty in regard to the right to education declared in Article 13. It says that countries that "have not been able to secure" compulsory primary education, free of charge, "undertake, within two years, to work out and adopt a detailed plan of action for the progressive implementation, within a reasonable number of years, to be fixed in the plan, of the principle of compulsory education free of charge for all." Compliance with this requirement, which is only present for the right to education, involves planning and setting timetables. Instead of, or in addition to, requiring plans and timetables a goal-right mixture could require immediate compliance with minimal standards. The idea is that minimal provision might be within the capacity of all addressees. For example, countries could be required very soon to provide all children with reading and writing instruction.
These ways of creating right-goal mixtures allow us to see that some rights can be goals while still having enough mandatory elements to be counted as rights in a meaningful sense.
A complementary approach to implementing welfare rights (and other demanding rights as well) in developing countries emphasizes ability enhancement rather than burden reduction. It seeks to increase the ability of developing countries to implement rights effectively. Possible strategies include using aid to increase the resources available for this purpose, providing education to current and future officials, offering technical assistance concerning the mechanisms of implementation, and battling corruption. Human rights theory needs better accounts of how the rights, e.g., of a Haitian create (moral and legal) duties not just for the Haitian government but also for (1) other governments, (2) international organizations, (3) individuals resident in Haiti, and (4) individuals resident in other countries.
John Rawls has proposed a duty of liberal democratic countries to aid poor or "burdened" countries. Rawls defines "burdened societies" as ones that "lack the political and cultural traditions, the human capital and know-how and, often, the material and technological resources needed to be well-ordered" (Rawls 1999). Rawls holds that well-off liberal countries have a moral duty to assist burdened societies. Unfortunately Rawls does not provide much justification for this claim. In particular he does not use his idea of an international "original position" to work out how the justification for such a duty would go and what objections it would need to overcome.
A good defense of a duty of well-off governments to assist poor countries in realizing human rights would not automatically impose that duty on the citizens of those well-off countries. But perhaps citizens should share somehow in duties of international aid. One approach to explaining how and why citizens share in these duties involves viewing the citizens of a democratic country as having ultimate responsibility for the human rights duties of their government. If their government has a duty to respect or implement the right to a fair trial, or a duty to aid poor countries, its citizens share in that duty. They are required as voters, political agents, and taxpayers to try to promote and support their government's compliance with its human rights duties. This principle of shared duty is particularly attractive in democratic societies where the citizens are the ultimate source of political authority. This view makes individuals back-up addressees for the duties of their governments.
Thomas Pogge has taken a related but slightly different approach to
generating individual duties from human rights that have governments
as their primary addressees. Pogge emphasizes UDHR Article 28 which
says that "Everyone is entitled to a social and international order in
which this the rights and freedoms set forth in this Declaration can
be fully realized." Pogge sees in this article a plausible norm,
namely that both countries and individuals have negative duties not to
be complicit in an international order that unfairly disadvantages
poor countries and the people in them. A coercive political order,
whether national or international, "must not avoidably restrict the
freedom of some so as to render their access to basic necessities
insecure--especially through official denial or deprivation. If it
does, then all human agents have a negative duty, correlative to the
postulated social and economic human rights, not to cooperate in
upholding it unless they compensate for their cooperation by
protecting its victims or by working for its reform. Those violating
this duty share responsibility for the harms (insecure access to basic
necessities) produced by the unjust institutional order in question"
(Pogge 2002, 67).