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Notes to Medieval Theories of Relations


1. For the record, the other categories are action, passion, time, place, position, and habit.

2. In medieval philosophy, “similar to” (or “similis” followed by the dative case) just means same in quality as.

3. In Categories 7, Aristotle makes it clear that he thinks the relating properties must be accidents, for according to him no substance is a relation. See Categories 7, 8a14f.

4. Metaphysics V, 15, 1021a30. All translations of Aristotle are taken, with slight modification, from The Complete Works of Aristotle.

5. Augustine discusses both types of theological consideration in De Trinitate V, especially pp. 208-215. This text exercises enormous influence on the subsequent medieval treatment of relational situations.

6. Boethius sets the precedent here. In his commentary on the Categories, which introduced medieval philosophers to all three terms, he not only alternates among them but explicitly denies that there is any difference in meaning between two of them, namely, “toward something” and “relative”: “Whether we say toward something or relatives makes no difference.” Boethius, In Categorias Aristotelis, p. 217.

7. Liber de praedicamentis, p. 225b.

8. Categories 7, 6a36-6b.

9. Medievals rely on context (rather than quotation marks) to distinguish use and mention, and hence employ the same terms to refer both to relations and to the predicates by means of which they are introduced.

10. Categories 7, 8a29-35.

11. ST I, q. 13, a. 7, ad 1.

12. Categories 7, 8b22-24.

13. In Categorias Aristotelis, p. 238.

14. Cf. Weinberg 1965, esp. pp. 61-63.

15. Cf. Albert the Great, Liber de praedicamentis, p. 241a-241b; Aquinas ST I, q. 28, a. 4, obj. 5; and the texts of Harclay cited below.

16. See Physics III, 202b11-15.

17. Scriptum super Primum Sententiarum, fols. 318va-b. See Henninger 1989, pp. 153-4, n. 12, for the Latin text.

18. Scriptum super Primum Sententiarum, fols. 318va-b.

19. Cf. Categories 1, 1a20-1b6.

20. Though following Boethius, medievals argue vigorously for this claim in the context of their discussions of universals. For Boethius's defense of this claim and consequent rejection of realism about substance universals, see Spade 1994, pp. 21-22. For a reconstruction of Boethius's argument and discussion of its historical significance, see Klima 2000 and the texts cited in his notes.

21. 1SN, d. 27, q. 1, a. 1, ad 2.

22. Cf. Tractatus de quantitate q. 3 (in Opera Theologica x, p. 104).  There is some debate about how exactly Ockham's ‘razor-type’ claims are to be interpreted. For relevant discussion, see Boler 1985 and the notes cited in his article; cf. also Spade 1999, pp. 100-117.

23. Liber de praedicamentis, 222b. For further discussion, see Brower 2001.

24. Scriptum super Primum Sententiarum, fols. 318va-b. For useful discussion of Aureoli's views, see Henninger 1989, pp. 150-173.

25. In the early modern period, philosophers habitually speak of relations as the “products of comparison” or “results of thought”, while at the same time allowing for things to be related apart from the activity of any mind. See, e.g., Locke, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, bk. 2, chap. 2; Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, bk. 1, pt. 1, sec. 5; and Leibniz, Philosophische Schriften, vol. 2, p. 486. Cf. also Henninger 1989, pp. 184-186; Olson 1987, pp.37-43; and Cover and O'Leary-Hawthorne 1999, pp. 58-86.

26. See Liber de praedicamentis, 222b-223a.

27. Cf. ST I, q. 28, a. 2, corpus; cf. also Veckley 1965, pp. 28-9.

28. In his commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics, Avicenna suggests that most of his contemporaries endorse a form of anti-realism. For a translation and discussion of the relevant texts, see Marmura 1975. On the Mutakallimūn, cf. Weinberg 1965, 89-91.

29. Part of Aureoli's innovation consists in the way he tries to accommodate this intuition. See Henninger, 1989, pp. 166-68.

30. Ordinatio I, d. 30, q. 1 (in Opera Theologica iv, pp. 316-317).  Cf. also Scotus, Ordinatio II , d. 1, q. 5, n. 224 (in Opera Omnia); Aquinas, De potentia, q. 7, a. 9.

31. De potentia, q. 7, a. 9.

32. Cf., e.g., Aquinas, ST I, q. 28, a. 1 and De potentia q. 8, a.1.

33. This summary provides what I take to be the point of Albert's difficult discussion in Liber de praedicamentis, 224a-224b. For a detailed defense of this interpretation, and its contemporary relevance, see Brower 2001.

34. Summa Logica   I, c. 51 (in Opera Philosophica i, p. 171); cf. Loux, 1974, p. 171.

35. In Categorias Aristotelis, p. 217.

36. See, e.g., Abelard, Logica ‘ingredientibus’, pp. 80-95; and Albert the Great, Liber de praedicamentis, p. 22.

37. For discussion of Harclay's two views, and their relationship to Scotus's and Ockham's, see Henninger 1989, pp. 98-118.,

38. For a good example of this approach, see Abelard's discussion of universals in his Logica ‘ingredientibus’, pp. 7-32. For an English translation of this discussion, see Spade 1994, pp. 26-56.

39. Ordinatio I, d. 30, q. 2 (in Opera Theologica iv, p. 322). Cf. also n. 20 above.

40. Abelard justifies this interpretation on the basis of an analogy to good-making characteristics: just as certain attributes (say, being red, juicy, and sweet) make certain things good, so too, he suggests, certain attributes (such as being-six-feet-tall and five-feet-ten) make certain things to be relative (or related). See Logica ‘ingredientibus’, pp. 216-17. For further discussion, see Brower 1998.

41. Summa logicae I, c. 49 (in Opera Philosophica i, p. 154).  Cf. Henninger 1989, p. 120.

42. During the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, this intuitive view of relational change was often discussed in a connection with an authoritative passage from the Physics, where Aristotle says “There is no motion in respect of relation: for it may happen that when one correlative changes, the other can truly be said not to change at all, so that in these cases the motion is accidental”. Cf. Physics V, 2, 225b11-13.

43. Ockham, Ordinatio I, d. 30, q. 3 (in Opera Theologica iv, p. 347); cf. also the other texts cited in Henninger 1989, p. 129, n. 31.

44. In passing, however, it should be mentioned that reductive realists also appealed to various forms of an infinite regress argument to support their position. This sort of argument is now typically associated with the absolute idealist, F. H. Bradley, but it was known to philosophers during the Middle Ages and taken by many (including, Ockham and the later Harclay) to show that relations cannot be really distinct from their foundations. Cf. Henninger 1989, pp. 110-112, 121-122 and Adams 1987, vol. 1, pp. 215-250. Again, reductive realists also relied on various forms of what is sometimes called the separation argument. After certain events in the late thirteenth century, including the condemnations of 1277, it was generally agreed that a real distinction between two or more items implies that either can exist in separation from the other—at least by God's power. As the reductive realists were quick to point out, however, this tells against non-reductive realism. For if relations are really distinct from their foundations, then it follows that God can create the foundations without the corresponding relations—and hence (absurdly) that, say, two white things could exist without being similar, or two quantified things without being either equal or unequal. Cf. Harclay, “Utrum Dei ad creaturam sit relatio realis” (hereafter abbreviated “Utrum Dei”), n. 18f. For further references and discussion, cf. also Menn 1997.   For a variation of the separation argument, sometimes used against reductive realism, see Klima's discussion of Psuedo-Campsall vs. Ockham in Spade 1999, esp. pp. 123-127.

45. Ockham, however, leans toward this sort of view in several of his Quodlibetal questions, where he entertains the idea that abstract relative terms, such as ‘similitude’, function as collective names, and hence like other such terms (‘people’, ‘army’, ‘crowd’, ‘company’) refer to several things taken jointly (conjunctim). Cf. Quodl. VI, q. 8 (in Opera Theologica ix, pp. 616-617) and q. 25 (pp. 681-682).

46. “Utrum Dei”, n. 46. All translations of Harclay are adopted, with slight modification, from MacDonald (forthcoming).

47. “Utrum Dei”, n. 47.

48. Harclay's discussion is complicated and my interpretation is by no means uncontroversial. For an alternative interpretation of this discussion, see Henninger 1989, pp. 112-117.

49. Again, the idea here is that, by itself, Simmias's height is merely potentially relative-making, and it only becomes actually relative-making in the presence of another height, including Socrates's. 

50. Cf. Armstrong's description of his own view in Crane 1996, esp. pp. 39-41.

51. For a formal reconstruction of this sort of view, see Klima 1991.

52. “Utrum Dei,” n. 43.

53. Quodl. VI, q. 25 (in Opera Theologica ix, p. 679).

54. Metaphysica, p. 266a.

55. Harclay uses the term “toward-ness” (aditas) in his question on relations (see “Utrum Dei,” n. 50), whereas Aquinas often uses “disposition” (habitudo) or “relative disposition” (relativa habitudo), and eventually comes to prefer “order” (ordinatio). For a helpful discussion of some of the terms used by medieval philosophers to signify relations, see Schmidt 1986, esp. pp. 133-40.

56. Especially worth mentioning in this context is Addis 1989 (see esp. pp. 27-46).  Addis identifies several other contemporary or near-contemporary philosophers who hold this sort of view (including Meinong, Husserl, Bergmann, and Searle), but anyone holding a form of the so-called adverbial theory of consciousness would also appear to be a candidate.

57. Harclay explicitly addresses this sort of non-reductivist line in “Utrum Dei,” n. 10f.

58. Cf. Metaphysica, 266b-267a, ad 1.

59. Metaphysica, 267a, ad. 3.

60. In V Phys., lect. 3, n. 8.

61. In V Phys., lect. 3, n. 8.

62. For this interpretation of Aquinas, see Henninger 1989, pp. 13-28.

63. Thus, according to Henninger, the proper description of Aquinas's view about relations and their foundations will vary depending on which criteria one uses for identity and real distinction. See Henninger 1989, 29-31.

64. Augustine, De Trinitate, pp. 224-27.

65. De Trinitate, p. 226. (“…quamvis temporaliter incipiat dici, non tamen ipsi substantiae dei accidisse intelligatur sed illi creaturae ad quam dicitur”)

66. De Trinitate, p. 226. Augustine introduces the example of the coin in the course of defending his views about of creation.  Thus, he says, if a coin can change its relations solely in virtue of changes in the properties of something else, “how much easier ought we to accept this of the unchangeable substance of God?” (ibid).

67. Boethius's example actually involves a man walking up beside another, stationary human being. See De Trinitate 5. Medieval philosophers, however, prefer to use the example of a man and an immobile column, and over time come to speak as if this were Boethius's own example. Thus, as Harclay says at one point: “Boethius offers the example of a column's being to the right at the end of De Trinitate.”  See “Utrum Dei,” n. 72.

68. Peter Lombard (c. 1095-1160) discusses the relationship between God and creatures in the first book of his Sentences, an influential summary of Christian doctrine. From the mid-thirteenth through the mid-fourteenth century, every student who earned a baccalaureate in theology was required to lecture and comment on Peter's text. As a result, commentaries on the first book of this text (around distinction 30) become the locus classicus for medieval discussions of relations. Cf. Henninger 1989, p. 8.

69. This way of thinking about relations derives from a late 12th-century work of unknown authorship (but traditionally ascribed to Gilbert of Poitiers) called Liber sex principiorum. This work distinguishes the first four Aristotelian categories (substance, quantity, quality, and relation) as intrinsic and the last six categories as extrinsic. For a representative treatment of the categories which follows this division, see Aquinas's discussion in In V Met., lect. 9, n. 892; cf. also the commentary in Wippel 1987. Even Aquinas, however, sometimes allows for extrinsic denomination in the case of relations. Cf. 1SN d. 40, q. 1, a. 1.

70. Cf., e.g., Aquinas, De potentia q. 1, a. 1, ad 10.

71. Cf. Metaphysics IV, 1 (esp. 1003a32-b11) and V, 7 (esp. 1017a31-35).

72. Ordinatio I, d. 30, q. 5 (in Opera Theologica iv, pp. 385-86). For a discussion of Ockham's distinction between real relations and relations of reason, see Henninger 1989, 136-40.

73. Cf. Henninger 1989.

74. In one of his early works, Super Dionysium De divinis nominibus, Albert the Great identifies all relations acquired as a result of mere Cambridge changes as relations of reason—apparently overlooking the possibility of acquiring real relations in the same way (as in the case of Socrates's becoming shorter than Simmias as result of Simmias's growth). For the relevant texts of Albert, and helpful discussion, see MacDonald 1991, pp. 31-55 (esp. 42-47).  No other medieval philosopher I know of makes this sort of identification, and Albert himself comes to reject it in some of his later works. Thus, as I indicated in section 4b above, in his Metaphysica Albert explicitly allows for cases in which a substance can acquire real relations without undergoing any real change, and uses the distinction between relations and relational accidents to explain how this is possible.

75. In Monologium c. 25, Anselm distinguishes those accidents which require a change in their subject from those that do not, and suggests that even God may have accidents of the latter sort (though as he goes on to explain, ‘accidents’ of this latter sort are accidents only according to an improper way of speaking). In “Utrum Dei,” Harclay develops this distinction between two types of accident at greater length, and attempts to connect it not only with Anselm but also with Augustine and Boethius (cf. esp. nn. 110-120).

76. De veritate, q. 1, a. 5, ad 15.

77. ST I, q. 13, a. 7, corpus.

78. Interestingly, this same line of reasoning leads some philosophers to deny that self-identity is a relation at all. Consider, for example, the following passage from Harclay's “Utrum Dei,” n. 32: “real identity is not a real relation, because it lacks one condition that is necessary for being a relation (and which it is impossible for something that is identical and that to which it is identical to satisfy), namely, real distinctness of relata. This condition is satisfied in the case of distinct things but not in the case of something that is one and the same [as itself]. For that reason, distinctness is a relation but identity is not.”

79. De potentia, q. 7, a. 11, obj. 4.

80. De Potentia q. 7, a. 11, ad 3-5.

81. What Aquinas here refers to as ‘cause’ he elsewhere refers to as the ‘foundation in reality (fundamentum in re)’ of a being of reason (cf., e.g., SN1 d. 19, q. 5, a. 1). In the case at hand, therefore, the relevant causes are just the extramental  foundations of the relations.

82. Medieval philosophers often apply this consequence to cases involving privations, such as blindness. For privations involve negation, which is typically regarded as a being of reason. Thus, it is commonly said that Homer would lack sight, even if Homer's blindness did not exist. For the truth of the latter claim depends for its existence on the activity of the mind. For further discussion and references, see Klima 1993.

83. Ockham does, however, want to maintain (with Aristotle) that relation is a real category or genus generalissimum. He does this by identifying a loose sense in which relations can be said to exist outside the mind, and indeed interprets Aristotle's own way of speaking along these lines: “according to the Philosopher's view, ‘relation’ is a category of the real not in the sense that it signifies things outside [the mind] … but rather in the sense that its species [i.e., specific relational concepts] signify such things [outside the mind].”  See Quodl. VI, q. 22 (in Opera Theologica ix, p. 669); cf. Freddoso and Kelly 1991, p. 564 and Henninger 1989, p. 133.

84. Quodl. VI, q. 22 (in Opera Theologica ix, p. 669).

85. ST I, q. 28, a. 1, sed contra. Although this passage occurs in the sed contra, it is clear from other works that it represents Aquinas's own views. Cf. De potentia, q. 8, a. 1.

86. ST I, q. 28, a. 2, corpus.

87. Cf. ST I, q. 28, a. 2, corpus.

88. The Commentaries on Boethius by Gilbert of Poitiers, p. 79.  Gilbert's division of the intellectual disciplines follows Boethius's discussion in De Trinitate 2.

89. Cf. The Commentaries on Boethius by Gilbert of Poitiers, pp. 193, 223, and 227. For an excellent discussion of the relevant texts, to which my own discussion is indebted, see MacDonald 1999.

90. Quodl. V, q. 27 (in Opera Theologica ix, p. 685).

91. One of Ockham's most influential followers, John Buridan (d. 1358/61) even goes so far as to say that everything is a relation (relativum, though not relatio, which like Ockham he construes as a second intention). For everything can be conceived of in terms of a relative concept, since everything is identical with itself and distinct from everything else. Cf. Summulae de Dialectica, 3.4.1.

92. I say “harmless” because, like other medieval realists, Ockham and his followers think many judgments of the form ‘aRb’ are true independently of the mind.  Nonetheless, because they deny that the term “relation” refers to anything in extramental reality, and hence that strictly speaking relations are concepts or beings of reason, there is a sense in which their view qualifies as anti-realist.

93. For an excellent account of these broader historical developments, see Ashworth 1974; cf. also Klima 2000, and the exchange between Jack Zupko and Gyula Klima (in Klima 1998).

Copyright © 2001
Jeffrey Brower

Notes to Medieval Theories of Relations
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy