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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
It will be useful to begin this entry with a general introduction to the medieval discussion of relations, highlighting some of the main historical developments to be treated at more length in subsequent sections.
All theorizing about relations in the Middle Ages begins with Aristotle's short treatise, the Categories. Due to historical circumstances, this Aristotelian text was one of the very few pieces of ancient Greek philosophy available in the Latin west between the seventh and twelfth centuries, and the only one to contain a systematic philosophical treatment of relations. In the Categories, Aristotle identifies relations as one of the ten highest kinds or categories, one of the so-called summa genera, and he devotes an entire chapter -- the seventh chapter of the treatise -- to distinguishing the members of this category from those of the other categories (most notably, substance, quantity, and quality). On the standard medieval interpretation of this chapter, Aristotle is attempting to distinguish relations at least partly on the basis of semantic or logical considerations -- that is, on the basis of the differences between statements containing relational (or ‘relative’) terms and those containing only non-relational (or ‘absolute’) terms. This approach to characterizing relations helps to shape the way medieval philosophers understand them, and, as we shall see, it gives rise to a common medieval distinction between things that qualify as relations merely according to speech (relationes secundum dici) and things that qualify as relations in accordance with their nature or being (relationes secundum esse).
In addition to discussing the proper characterization of relations, Aristotle also suggests in the Categories a general model or paradigm for analyzing relational situations. According to this analysis, whenever two substances are related, what relates them is a pair of monadic properties or accidents. Thus, if Socrates is similar to Theaetetus (i.e., resembles him with respect to some quality), this is not to be explained by an entity to which Socrates and Theaetetus are somehow jointly attached (namely, the dyadic or two-place property, being-similar-to). Rather, it is to be explained by a pair of monadic properties or accidents, one of which inheres in Socrates and relates him to Theaetetus, and the other of which inheres in Theaetetus and relates him to Socrates.
This Aristotelian analysis exercises enormous influence during the Middle Ages, and until at least the fourteenth century, medieval philosophers develop their own analysis of relational situations in terms of it. In the context of this analysis the most important debate that arises concerns the precise nature of the properties or accidents that relate particular substances. Some philosophers, such as Peter Abelard and William Ockham, adopt a form of reductivism, according to which the properties in question are accidents falling under categories other than relation. Thus, according to Abelard and Ockham, when Socrates is similar to Theaetetus, this is to be explained in terms of particular qualities, say, their respective colors. Other philosophers, however, such as Albert the Great and John Duns Scotus, reject this form of reductivism, maintaining instead that relations are accidents of a sui generis type. Thus, according to Albert and Scotus, when Socrates is similar to Theaetetus, this is to be explained not by their respective colors, but by a pair of accidents whose members are distinct from, and irreducible to, these colors.
Although the analysis of relational situations that Aristotle suggests in the Categories appears to be perfectly general, it is clear from his later writings that he does not think all relational situations conform to it. Thus, in the Metaphysics he claims that there are relational situations, such as Simmias's thinking about Socrates, in which two substances are related not by virtue of a pair of accidents, but in virtue of a single accident possessed by only one of them. Thus, he says “the object of thought [say, Socrates] is said to be related because something else [say, Simmias] is related to it.” Some relational situations, in other words, are grounded in a single property or accident of a single relatum.
As is well known, Aristotle's Metaphysics did not become available to philosophers in the Latin west until the mid-twelfth century, and it did not circulate widely before the thirteenth. Nonetheless, medieval philosophers were independently motivated -- largely on the basis of theological considerations -- to allow for relational situations that fail to conform to the paradigm suggested in the Categories. Thus, on the basis of considerations having to do with the doctrine of creation, they were led to acknowledge the existence of situations in which two substances are related by a single property or accident. Similarly, on the basis of considerations having to do with the Christian doctrine of the Trinity, they were led to admit relational situations in which substances themselves qualify as relations. Prior to the fourteenth century, however, relational situations such as these are regarded by most philosophers as special cases or exceptions to the general rule. Indeed, philosophers from this period work hard to make even these sorts of cases conform, at least to some extent, to the paradigm of the Categories. This effort, as we shall see, helps to explain the pervasiveness in medieval philosophy of the distinction between the so-called real relations (relationes reales) and relations of reason (relationes rationis).
The fourteenth century marks an important turning point in the medieval discussion of relations. After this point, there is a noticeable shift away from the Aristotelian paradigm, with the result that many philosophers come to regard those situations in which substances are related by virtue of their accidents as the exception rather than the rule. Part of the explanation is due, perhaps, to a gradual waning of Aristotle's influence, but part of it is also due to substantive doctrinal changes. By the fourteenth century, for example, it is common to deny the existence of any real distinction between a substance and most of accidents, and consequently, philosophers are increasingly willing to say that substances themselves provide the ontological grounding for relational situations. Again, due to important semantic innovations around the same time, and the subsequent emergence of late-medieval nominalism, philosophers begin to depart also from the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations. Thus, instead of thinking of relations as the items responsible for relating two or more substances, they now begin to think of them as items existing only in the mind -- that is, as mere beings of reason or concepts. With respect to both of these developments, as we shall see, Ockham is an important transitional figure.
Although Aristotle discusses relations at various places in his work, his discussion in the Categories is the most important for understanding the development of medieval views about relations. Part of the reason, as I have already indicated, is that until the twelfth century, the Categories is medieval philosophers' sole direct source for Aristotle's views about relations. But part of the reason is also theoretical in nature: in the Categories Aristotle develops a basic account of relations that is presupposed by his other discussions. Thus, even when some of these other discussions -- such as those in the Physics and Metaphysics -- become available, medieval philosophers interpret them in light of their understanding of the Categories.
Aristotle's discussion in the Categories influences the development of medieval views about relations in several ways. First of all, it introduces the basic framework and terminology that comes to dominate all medieval theorizing about relations. Second, and perhaps most importantly, it articulates the main claims in response to which medieval philosophers develop their own views. Indeed, as we shall see, medieval views about relations can be distinguished largely by the extent to which they agree with three claims commonly associated with Aristotle's discussion in the Categories: (1) relations are the items that relate substances, (2) the items that relate substances are accidents, and (3) no substance is a relation. Finally, the details of Aristotle's discussion in the Categories, especially in chapter 7, give rise to a number of important medieval debates, as well as to the traditional distinction between relations merely according to speech (secundum dici) vs. relations according to being (secundum esse). In order to understand the development of medieval views about relations, therefore, we must begin with some account of Aristotle's discussion in the Categories.
Throughout the Categories Aristotle assumes that relations comprise one of the accidental categories, and hence that they must be understood as items inhering in particular substances. This helps to explain why, unlike contemporary philosophers who speak of relations as holding between two or more things, Aristotle prefers to say that relations inhere in one thing and somehow point toward (pros) another. Indeed, Aristotle's preferred name for relations just is “things toward something” (ta pros ti).
During the Middle Ages, it is customary for philosophers to refer to relations using not only Aristotle's term, “toward something” (or ad aliquid, the verbatim Latin equivalent of pros ti), but two others as well: “relative” (relativum) and “relation” (relatio). In the early Middle Ages, philosophers often move freely among these terms without paying much attention to their various senses. Over time, however, they come to emphasize their differences, sometimes giving elaborate explanations as to why one of the three terms is more appropriate than the others. To give just one example, consider the following passage by Albert the Great:
Now the most general genus in the arrangement of this predicable is toward something (ad aliquid), or relative (relativum), or less properly speaking, relation (relatio), as some people say. But it must be recognized that the most general genus is signified most clearly by the name “toward something”, which is a preposition together with [the term] “something” in [the accusative] case. For this name conveys the two things that are in a relative, namely: [i] diversity, which the preposition indicates through its taking an object (transitionem), and [ii] the direction of the comparison, which the accusative case indicates when something is called toward something.
Whatever their disagreements about the appropriateness of these terms, it was generally agreed that the terms “toward something” and “relative” are related to the term “relation” in the way that a concrete term (such as “white”) is related to its abstract counterpart (such as “whiteness”).
Since “relation” is the term most familiar to us, in what follows I shall rely on it whenever possible. It is important to recognize, however, that medieval philosophers introduce a number of other abstract terms more or less synonymous with “relation” (relatio) whose connotations they often regard as more informative than any of those discussed so far. A partial list of such terms includes: “comparison” (comparatio), which has psychological overtones, and so is often (though not exclusively) used by conceptualists; “outward-looking-ness” (respectus), which draws on a visual metaphor to suggest that relations are that in virtue of which a substance “looks out toward something” (respicit ad aliquid); “disposition” (habitudo) or “relative disposition” (habitudo relativa), which suggests that relations account for the way a thing “holds itself toward something” (se habere ad aliquid); and “order” (ordo), “ordering” (ordinatio), and “directionality” or “toward-ness” (aditas), which are used to indicate that relations account for the order or structure we find in the world.
Although Aristotle makes scattered remarks about relations throughout the Categories, it is only in chapter 7 that he singles them out for detailed independent consideration. Because the discussion in this chapter is important for understanding the development of the medieval debate, it will be useful to consider how it was commonly understood by philosophers from this period.
Aristotle's discussion in Categories 7 opens rather abruptly with the statement of a particular definition or account of relations. According to this definition, which medieval philosophers attribute to Plato, relations are things spoken of in a certain way. Whether or not this definition is really Plato's, it certainly appears to be well entrenched by Aristotle's time -- as is indicated by the fact that Aristotle says we are at least prepared to call something a relation just in case it satisfies the conditions specified by this definition:
We call the following sorts of things toward something: all those things said to be just what they are of or than something, or toward something in some other way (any other way whatsoever). Thus, what is larger is said to be what it is than another (it is said to be larger than something); and a double is said to be just what it is of another (it is said to be double of something); similarly with all other such cases.
As the medievals often interpret it, this definition identifies relations in terms of the predicates by means of which they are signified or “spoken of”. Medievals refer to the predicates in question as “relative terms” (ad aliquid or relativa), and understand them, roughly speaking, as those terms whose true predication requires a comparison to something other than the subject of which they are predicated. Thus, “taller” (maius) is a relative term, they say, because when we assert of something that it is “taller” -- that is, when we predicate the term “taller” of it -- we necessarily do so in comparison to something else. We don't say merely that Simmias is taller; we say that he is taller than Socrates, or Theaetetus, or the average man. Similar remarks apply, they say, to “double”. Borrowing on the medievals' behalf the notation of first-order logic, we can make this characterization of relative terms precise by saying that a term F is relative just in case a predication of the form “Fx” is more perspicuously represented as a predication of the form “Rxy”. Medievals refer to a term as absolute just in case it is not relative.
As the medievals understand it, therefore, the preliminary definition characterizes relations as the items signified by relative terms -- or what we would nowadays call polyadic or many-place predicates. This characterization seems initially promising, and medieval philosophers often employ it in their writings. In the end, however, they think it must be rejected -- or at least modified. For according to them, not everything we are prepared to call a relation actually is a relation. In rejecting the first or Platonic definition, the medievals take themselves to be following Aristotle, who rejects the definition on the grounds that it allows certain substances (namely, heads and hands) to qualify as relations. As Aristotle himself says:
If the [first] definition of things toward something was adequately assigned, then it is exceedingly difficult, or impossible, to reach the conclusion that no substance is toward something. But if, on the other hand, it was not adequately assigned, and things toward something are rather [defined as] those things for which this is their very being: to be toward another in a certain way, then perhaps something may be said about the problem [of heads and hands].
In rejecting the first definition of relations, medieval philosophers take Aristotle to be calling our attention to the fact that some relative terms do not signify relations. Terms such as “head” and “hand” clearly count as relative, since statements of the form “x is a head” and “x is a hand” are more perspicuously represented as of the form “x is a head of y” and “x is a hand of y”. Nonetheless, what these terms signify, the medievals say, are not relations but parts of substances. On the basis of these and other such examples, therefore, they conclude that relations must be identified not with the items signified by relative terms, but with a proper subset of them.
Now at this point we are still left with the question of how to identify the members of the relevant subset. Here medieval philosophers think that Aristotle's second definition -- which I have italicized in the passage quoted above -- can be of some help. The purpose of this definition, as it is commonly interpreted, is to provide a characterization of relations in terms of their metaphysical function or role. On this interpretation, relations are the items that actually serve to relate two (or more) things -- that is, the items in virtue of which things are related. Read in this way, Aristotle's definition provides a clear explanation for why heads and hands fail to qualify as relations. The items signified by the terms “head” and “hand” do not relate anything. On the contrary, they are things standing in relations.
The distinction between what actually serves to relate (or has the disposition to relate) and what merely stands in some relation is often used by medieval philosophers to explain the difference between the two definitions in Categories 7. This understanding of the definitions, moreover, gives rise to the common medieval distinction between things that qualify as relations merely according to speech (relationes secundum dici) and things that qualify as relations in accordance with their nature or being (relationes secundum esse), as the following passage from Aquinas's Summa Theologiae nicely illustrates:
Some relative terms -- such as “master” and “slave”, “father” and “son” -- are imposed to signify relative dispositions themselves (ipsas habitudines relativas); these terms express things relative secundum esse. But other relative terms -- such as “mover” and “moved”, “head” and “headed”, and terms of this sort -- are imposed to signify things on which certain relations follow; these terms express things relative secundum dici.
The intuition behind this common distinction is that every relative term must somehow be associated with a relation, otherwise there would be no basis for the comparison involved in its predication. Nonetheless, since only certain relative terms such as “father” and “son” actually signify relations, others such as “head” and “hand” must signify non-relational things via their relations (such as being a part or being a whole).
Although medieval philosophers typically agree that there is a distinction to be drawn between relations secundum dici and relations secundum esse, and that heads and hands and other body parts should be included in the former class, there is often disagreement about which class certain other examples (most notably, knowledge and perception) should be included in. As the medievals recognize, terms such as “knowledge” and “perception” are relative (for statements of the form “x is knowledge” or “x is a perception” are more perspicuously represented by statements of the form “x is knowledge of y” and “x is a perception of y”). They disagree among themselves, however, about whether the items signified by these terms are relations secundum dici (i.e., things on which certain relations follow) or relations secundum esse (i.e., things which actually serve to relate two or more things). Near the end of Categories 7, Aristotle suggests an epistemic criterion for deciding in particular cases whether something qualifies as a genuine relation. But because this criterion is extremely difficult to understand, it does not provide any clear resolution to the original disagreement. Indeed, debate about how to distinguish between relations secundum esse and dici continues throughout the Middle Ages.
Aristotle ends Categories 7 almost as abruptly as he began it. Having indicated his own position, he leaves us with the following cautionary remarks:
It is perhaps hard to make firm statements on such questions without having examined them many times. Still, to have gone through the various difficulties is not unprofitable.
Medieval philosophers take Aristotle's reticence here as an invitation to refine and improve on his own account of relations and to develop it in their own ways. As Boethius, whose Latin translation is responsible for transmitting these words to the Middle Ages, says in his commentary on this passage of Aristotle:
He would never have said this if he were not prompting us to further reflection and to even greater exercise of subtlety. Because of his exhortation, we shall not hesitate in the least to raise [further] questions and offer [our own] solutions to them in other places.
Aristotle's discussion in Categories 7, at least as it is understood by his medieval commentators, presupposes a certain view about the nature and ontological status of relations, and hence is not primarily metaphysical in nature but definitional. Thus, Aristotle's discussion begins with the assumption that relations are a certain type of accident, and then proceeds to inquire after their proper characterization, eventually arriving at the view that all and only those accidents that are both signified by a relative term and actually serve to relate their subjects qualify as relations. Medieval philosophers, by contrast, tend to adopt Aristotle's characterization of relations, but not his assumptions about their nature and ontological status. That is to say, they begin with the view that relations are a proper subset of the items signified by relative terms -- namely, all and only those items that actually serve to relate things -- and then proceed to ask about the nature and ontological status of these items, in particular whether in every case they must be identified with an Aristotelian accident.
There are two reasons why medievals think they are entitled to adopt Aristotle's final characterization of relations without also adopting his views about the nature of the entities so characterized. First of all, Aristotle's preferred characterization of relations, as they see it, is ontologically neutral. Although it may be tempting, within a substance-accident framework, to assume that only accidents can both be signified by relative terms and relate substances, they think there is no reason in principle why a substance cannot also play these roles. Secondly, and perhaps more importantly, the medievals think there are at least some cases in which relations cannot be identified with accidents. The most common examples are, of course, theological in nature. On the Christian view of the Trinity, for example, the divine persons stand in various relations, both to one another and to things distinct from God. Nonetheless, the medievals argue, there are no accidents in God. In order to accommodate cases such as these, therefore, the medievals think that Aristotle's account must be extended to allow for relations that are not accidents.
Most medieval philosophers, therefore, think they can accept Aristotle's second definition of relations without begging any substantive metaphysical questions as to their nature or ontological status. And this in turn allows for the possibility of identifying relations in different situations with entities of different ontological types. Before turning to the different types of entity with which medieval philosophers actually identify relations, it is worth noting that there is at least one type of entity with which they think relations can never be identifed, namely, the type we would nowadays refer to as polyadic or many-place property. Despite their differences, medieval philosophers appear to be unanimously agreed that no entities of this type exist in extramental reality.
Historians of philosophy sometimes speak as if medievals lacked the very concept of a polyadic property -- indeed as if this concept only became possible in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries with the advent of a formal logic of relations and multiple quantification. But this is surely mistaken. What advances in formal logic have made possible is not the concept of a polyadic property, but merely its representation within a formal system. And in any case, we have already seen that the notion of a polyadic predicate, from which our own concept of a polyadic property is derived, has a direct analogue in the medieval notion of a relative term.
There is, moreover, explicit textual evidence to support the claim that the medievals conceived of relations as polyadic properties. Medieval philosophers often compare relations to a road (via) that runs between two cities, or to a palisade running between two watchtowers (inter-vallum). In drawing these sorts of analogies, medieval philosophers take themselves merely to be developing a suggestion of Aristotle's in the Physics. By the time of Peter Aureoli (d. 1322), however, reference to Aristotle (or indeed any authority) for conceiving of relations in this way comes to seem almost otiose. As Aureoli himself says at one point:
In the third book of his commentary on the Physics, comment twenty, the Commentator [= Averroes] says that a relation is a disposition (dispositio) existing between two things. But even apart from him it is clear that fatherhood is conceived of as if it were a kind of medium connecting a father with his son. And the same is true of other relations.
This passage makes it clear that the standard way of conceiving of relations is as polyadic entities.
Despite the fact that medieval philosophers conceive of relations in this way, they explicitly deny that anything in extramental reality exactly corresponds to this conception. Returning to the passage from Aureoli, we can see that, immediately after pointing out that relations are conceived of as a sort of ‘interval’ (intervallum), he goes on to deny the existence of any such intervals in extramental reality:
It appears that a single thing that must be imagined as some sort of interval (intervallum) existing between two things cannot exist in extramental reality, but only in the intellect. [This appears to be the case] not only because nature does not produce such intervals, but also because a medium or interval of this sort does not appear to be in either of the two things [it relates] as in a subject, but rather between them where it is clear that there is nothing which can serve as its subject.
As this passage from Aureoli makes clear, the root of the medievals' objection to polyadic properties is ontological in nature, and has to do with the relationship of subjects to their attributes. From Aristotle, the medievals inherit a division of real beings into substances and accidents, and they typically take this division to be both exclusive and exhaustive (since it is given in terms of a contradictory pair of properties, namely, being in a subject vs. not being in a subject). Like Aristotle, moreover, the medievals think of individual substances as the primary subjects of predication and divide their attributes into two main kinds, essential and accidental. Now in the case of individual substances, it is perhaps clear that they are not polyadic in nature. But medievals think the same is also true of their attributes. For attributes, as they see it, are to be conceived of as constituents, or in a broad sense as ‘parts’ of substances, and hence as incapable of belonging to more than one substance at a time. In the case of essential attributes, they think this is so obvious as to barely merit mentioning in the context of relations. But they are fond of pointing this out in the case of accidents. To take just one particularly striking example, consider how Aquinas responds in his Sentences commentary to the question whether it is possible for “numerically one and the same relation” to belong to belong to two subjects at a time: “This cannot be, for one accident cannot belong to two subjects”.
Although the medieval objection to polyadic properties stems in large part from ontological considerations, medieval philosophers also offer other reasons for rejecting them. Sometimes the reasons are grounded in an appeal to theoretical parsimony: all other things being equal, the ontology that postulates the fewest types of entity is to be preferred. Thus, as Ockham is so fond of saying: “It is futile to do with more [entities] what can be done with fewer”. Again, the reasons are sometimes grounded in phenomenological or epistemological considerations: we are not presented in experience with anything but individuals and their so-called absolute attributes -- that is, substances and their quantities and qualities. Albert the Great, for example, mentions this sort of objection and traces it to certain Muslim philosophers: “Some fairly recent philosophers such as Avicenna and Alfarabi . . . say that no form that is a being (ens) belongs to a thing unless it is absolute as far the being (esse) it has in itself is concerned -- as is clear from looking at cases of what is hot, cold, white, black, and all other things.”
The rejection of polyadic properties might seem to commit one to a form of anti-realism about relations. This was, in fact, the position of Peter Aureoli. If there are no polyadic properties or ‘intervals’, he argues, then there is nothing in extramental reality to correspond to our relational concepts. Reasoning from the common medieval assumption that relations are items corresponding to our relational concepts, he concludes that “a relation cannot be posited except in apprehension alone”. Thus, relations do exist, on his view, but only as the contents of certain concepts or apprehensions -- or as what he elsewhere describes as beings of reason (entia rationis). Strictly speaking, therefore, Aureoli does not want to deny that things can be related, but only that they can be related apart from the activity of the mind.
Given the current state of medieval research, it is difficult to know how widespread this (or any other) form of anti-realism was during the Middle Ages. Shortly after Aureoli's death, certain aspects of his conceptualism appear to have met with considerable success. Ockham and his followers, for example, accept Aureoli's view that relations are concepts or beings of reason, though unlike Aureoli, as we shall see, they think this is compatible with saying that things are related independently of the activity of the mind. And one can find echoes of the same sorts of view throughout the writings of early modern philosophers. Prior to the fourteenth century, however, it is difficult to identify any unambiguous representatives of anti-realism, at least in the Latin west. Albert the Great claims to find something akin to Aureoli's argument in the writings of Alfarabi (d. 950) and Avicenna (d. 1037), but he does not say whether either of these figures endorses the argument or merely presents it for consideration. Again, Aquinas suggests that a similar view can be found in the writings of Gilbert of Poitiers and his followers, the so-called Porretani, but the suggestion is controversial, and in any case Aquinas reports that Gilbert later retracted the view in the face of theological controversy. Unless further research alters the current picture, therefore, it would appear that, although anti-realism may have had something of a foothold in the Arabic speaking world, most notably among the members of a group of orthodox Muslim theologians known as the Mutakallimūn, in its more radical forms it was always a minority position in the Latin west.
Thus, if we take anti-realism to be the view that (a) nothing in extramental reality corresponds to our relational concepts and (b) nothing is related independently of the activity of the mind, it appears that most medieval philosophers would reject it. Nor is it hard to see why. Like most of us, the medievals recognize the implausibility of saying that facts like Simmias's being taller than Socrates are somehow dependent on the activity of the mind. Indeed, they often argue that such an anti-realist view about relations cannot account for even such basic facts as the real structure of the universe, the existence of real composition, causality, spatial proximity, or even the objectivity of mathematical knowledge. Thus, Ockham speaks for the majority when he asserts in his Ordinatio:
The intellect does nothing to bring it about that the universe is one, or that a whole is composed [of its parts], or that causes in spatial proximity [to their effects actually] cause [their effects], or that a triangle has three [angles], etc. . . .any more than [the intellect] brings it about that Socrates is white or that fire is hot or water cold.
Again, realism about relations seems to be implied by a standard medieval interpretation of the Aristotelian categories. “For nothing is placed in a category” says Aquinas “unless it is something existing outside the soul”. Thus, if realism is false, there should not even be a category of relation
In addition to philosophical objections to anti-realism, medieval philosophers also had theological grounds for opposing it. Christian doctrines such as the Trinity were often thought to require realism about certain theological relations. Indeed, the existence of real relations in God is affirmed at the Council of Rheims in 1148, and shortly thereafter it becomes customary to say that the denial of this entails a form of heresy known as Sabellianism.
But if there is general consensus among medieval philosophers that anti-realism ought to be rejected in favor of what we might call realism without polyadic properties, what is to be said about arguments such Aureoli's, which in effect deny the possibility of relations without polyadic properties? Here I think it is useful to consider the reply given by Albert the Great. Although he writes a generation before Aureoli, he explicitly addresses this sort of argument, and the reply he offers appears to be perfectly standard. According to Albert, the problem with arguments of this type is that they rely on the assumption that if there are no polyadic forms or properties, then there is nothing in extramental reality corresponding to our relational concepts. This assumption would be true, he suggests, only if our conceptual framework displayed an exact isomorphism to the structure of the world. But as Albert sees it, there is no reason in principle why a polyadic concept should not have something non-polyadic in extramental reality corresponding to it. In making this sort of reply, Albert aligns himself with a medieval tradition of rejecting the view that for every distinct type of concept there is a distinct type of entity. This view is often associated in medieval philosophy with Plato and his followers, and by the time of Ockham it is regarded, perhaps somewhat hyperbolically, as the source or root (radix) of the greatest errors in philosophy. As Ockham himself says at one point: “to multiply beings according to the multiplicity of terms . . . is erroneous and leads far away from the truth”.
For most medieval philosophers, therefore, the question is not whether there are any things in extramental reality corresponding to our relational concepts, but what these things are in themselves. But having ruled out the possibility of their being polyadic in nature, the medievals are not left with many options. Because they accept a form of realism, they are committed to saying that, at least in many cases, there is something in extramental reality grounding these concepts. But because they also accept a form of realism without polyadic properties, and are committed to a broadly Aristotelian ontology, they have no choice but to identify these extramental grounds with either individual substances or their monadic properties (whether they be accidental or essential).
Throughout the medieval period philosophers are attracted to the view that Aristotle suggests in the Categories, namely, that relations (or the items grounding our relational concepts) are accidents. For reasons I have already mentioned, no medieval can allow this account to hold for all relations, since there are cases, especially theological ones, in which involve relations but no accidents. Nonetheless, until the fourteenth century, this account is taken to apply so widely that there emerges a kind of paradigmatic analysis of relational situations. According to this analysis, if a judgment of the form ‘aRb’ is true, what makes it true is a pair of individuals, a and b, and a pair of accidents, F and G. Thus, if it is true that Simmias is taller than Socrates, this is to be explained by a pair of monadic properties, one of which inheres in Simmias and relates him to Socrates as taller and the other of which inheres in Socrates and relates him to Simmias as shorter. According to this analysis, moreover, it is the particular accidents that correspond to, and thus ground, relational concepts such as ‘taller than’ and ‘shorter than’.
As we shall see in the next section, it is within the context of this paradigmatic analysis of relational situations that one of the most hotly disputed and intractable debates of all the Middle Ages arises. In order to facilitate my discussion of this debate, I shall hereafter refer to situations that conform to this analysis as paradigmatic relational situations and to the pairs of properties or accidents involved in them as paradigmatic relations.
Before turning to the details of this debate, it is worth emphasizing that most medieval philosophers, at least those living prior to the fourteenth century, regard what I have been calling the paradigmatic analysis of relational situations as the analysis provided by Aristotle's discussion in the Categories. Aristotle does not explicitly speak of relations there as items corresponding to relational concepts, though this way of speaking would seem to be justified on the basis of his semantic characterization. Nonetheless, he does explicitly identify relations in the Categories with accidents and speaks of them as if they always come in pairs. Indeed, as Boethius points out in his commentary, whenever Aristotle refers to the category of relations he refers to it in the plural (“things toward something”), thereby departing from his usual practice of referring to categories in the singular (“substance”, “quantity”, “quality”, etc.). According to Boethius, Aristotle speaks of the category in this way because its members are unique among categorial beings in that they cannot be understood to exist by themselves:
Things toward something [i.e., relations] cannot be grasped by the intellect by themselves or individually, so that we could say that things toward something exist individually. Whatever is known regarding the nature of a relation must be considered together with something else. For example, when I speak of a master, this by itself means nothing if there is no slave. The naming of one relative immediately brings with it another thing toward something.
Following Boethius, medieval commentators often take Aristotle's use of the plural to indicate that the category of relations is comprised by pairs of correlatives or converse relational accidents. Simmias cannot be taller than Socrates unless Socrates is shorter than Simmias. Thus, if Simmias is taller than Socrates, it appears that a pair of accidents is needed to explain the situation, one of which is identified with Simmias's tallness (and hence corresponds to the concept ‘taller than’) and the other of which is identified with Socrates's shortness (and hence corresponds to the concept ‘shorter than’).
As the medievals recognize, there are a number of questions that arise about the precise nature and ontological status of these paradigmatic relations. What sort of monadic properties or accidents are they, and how are we to think of them? As the medievals see it, there are two main positions one can take. For convenience, I shall label them, respectively, reductive and non-reductive realism (without polyadic properties).
According to reductive realism, which is the simplest or most ontologically parsimonious form of realism without polyadic properties, paradigmatic relations are to be identified with ordinary, non-relational accidents -- that is to say, with accidents that fall under Aristotelian categories other than relation. Thus, if Simmias is taller than Socrates, the reductive realist will explain this by appealing to their respective heights, which fall under the category of quantity. Again, if Simmias is similar to Socrates (i.e., resembles him in color, say), the reductive realist will explain this by appealing to Simmias's and Socrates's particular colors, which fall under the category of quality. And so on for other paradigmatic relations.
According to non-reductive realism, by contrast, these relations are to be identified not with ordinary, non-relational accidents, but rather with accidents of a sui generis type. Thus, if Simmias is taller than Socrates, this is to be explained by appealing to a pair of sui generis accidents that are distinct from, but nonetheless necessitated by, Simmias's and Socrates's heights. Again, the accidents relating Simmias and Socrates as similar are not their colors, according to the non-reductive realist, but a pair of sui generis accidents necessitated by them. And so on for the relations involved in other paradigmatic relational situations.
In the medieval discussion of relations, it is this difference -- the difference between reductive and non-reductive realism -- that constitutes the greatest divide among philosophers, and representatives of both positions can be found throughout the medieval period. Peter Abelard (d. 1142) and Albert the Great (d. 1280) are, perhaps, the best representatives of reductive and non-reductive realism (respectively) in the early and high Middle Ages, whereas William Ockham (d. 1347) and John Duns Scotus (d. 1308) are among the best known examples of these positions in the later Middle Ages. Again, some philosophers appear to have held different positions at different stages of their career. Henry Harclay (d. 1317), for example, began his career as a staunch defender of Scotus's non-reductive realism, but by the end of it gravitated towards a position that is much closer to, and in many ways anticipates, Ockham's specific form of reductive realism.
Beginning in the mid-thirteenth century, the debate between reductive and non-reductive realists is often carried out in the context of the discussion whether relations are identical to their foundations. (This is the context, for example, in which Scotus and Ockham develop their positions.) By the mid-thirteenth century, moreover, it is customary to admit at least a conceptual distinction between relations (such as Simmias's tallness and Socrates's shortness) and the non-relational accidents in virtue of which these relations hold (such as Simmias's and Socrates's heights). The relevant non-relational accidents, in turn, are referred to as foundations or grounds (fundamenta) of relations, since their possession is thought to necessitate the holding of relations. In this context, therefore, the important question is whether the distinction between relations and their foundations is merely conceptual.
We might expect that reductive realists would always answer this question in the affirmative, whereas non-reductive realists would always answer it in the negative. It turns out, however, this is not the case. For reasons to be explained below, there are some reductive realists who, in spite of rejecting that relations comprise a sui generis type of monadic property, nonetheless maintain that relations are in an important sense distinct from their foundations. In light of this complication, I shall continue to cast the medieval debate about the nature paradigmatic relations in terms of reductive and non-reductive realism rather than in terms of the identity or distinctness of relations and their foundations.
As I mentioned above, on the simplest or most ontologically parsimonious form of realism without polyadic properties, what I am calling reductive realism, paradigmatic relations are identified with ordinary, non-relational monadic properties or accidents. Now we might expect this form of realism to appeal to anyone committed to realism without polyadic properties. After all, failure to reduce such relations to such accidents threatens to make them mysterious. If paradigmatic relations are monadic properties, but not ordinary, non-relational accidents, then how are we to understand them? On this count, however, the position of the reductive realist is perfectly intelligible. According to it, if Simmias is taller than Socrates, the holding of the relation will be explained by the possession of a pair of ordinary heights -- say, being-six-feet-tall in the case of Simmias and being-five-feet-ten-inches-tall in the case of Socrates.
These sorts of considerations certainly play a role in the debate between medieval reductive and non-reductive realists. As we shall see, non-reductive realists typically recognize that the chief difficulty for their view lies in providing a principled motivation for, and then explaining the precise nature of, the sui generis monadic properties that they identify with relations. Reductive realists, by contrast, often rely on considerations of theoretical parsimony to motivate their own views. This is certainly true in the case of Abelard and Ockham, whom I earlier identified as reductive realists. In the case of Abelard, these considerations are not explicitly formulated, though they are part-and-parcel of his general approach to metaphysics and philosophy of language. In the case of Ockham, the appeal to parsimony is much more explicit, often taking the form of what has come to be known as Ockham's razor: “Plurality should not be assumed without necessity”.
Another consideration that plays an important role in the debate between reductive and non-reductive realists has to do with the proper interpretation of authoritative texts. Since medieval philosophers develop their theories of relations in the course of reflecting on Aristotle's Categories, they often present their views as the one actually suggested by the text itself. This is especially true in the early Middle Ages. Abelard, for example, suggests that his reductive theory is a direct consequence of Aristotle's second definition of relations. Thus, when Aristotle characterizes relations in Categories 7 as “those things for which this is their very being: being toward something in a certain way”, Abelard argues that this should be interpreted to mean that relations are items that make other things to be relative or related -- that is to say, that they are what we might call relative-making characteristics. Textual considerations and direct appeals to Aristotle's authority play a much bigger role in early medieval debates than they do in the high and later Middle Ages, when literal commentary was no longer the dominant form of philosophical literature. Nonetheless, these sorts of considerations continue to be important throughout the Middle Ages. Even Ockham, in his Summa logicae, addresses the issue of whether Aristotle should be interpreted as holding some form of non-reductive realism. “There are many theologians of this opinion,” he says “and at one time even I believed it to have been Aristotle's opinion. Now, however, it seems to me that the contrary opinion follows from his principles.”
One final argument used by reductive realists to motivate their position is worth mentioning here. This argument has to do with the nature of relational change. Almost all medievals accept the intuitively plausible view that things can acquire (and lose) relations without undergoing any real (as opposed to what is nowadays called a merely Cambridge) change. Thus, when Simmias comes to be taller than Socrates, Socrates acquires the relation of being shorter than Simmias. But it would seem that Socrates can acquire this relation without undergoing any real change in himself (say, if he acquires it solely in virtue of a change in Simmias's height). As reductive realists such as Ockham often point out, this fact about relational change admits of a ready explanation on their position. For according to the reductive realist, Socrates's relation of being shorter is nothing over and above Simmias's and Socrates's heights, the latter of which remains unaltered. The same fact, however, appears to pose a serious challenge for the non-reductive realist. For if Socrates's relation is something distinct from Simmias's and Socrates's heights, then apparently Socrates acquires something when Simmias's height increases. But then, contrary to the original intuition, the non-reductive realist must say that Socrates undergoes a real change after all.
These considerations are not the only ones that reductive realists appeal to, but they are among the most important for understanding their position, and I shall rely on them in what follows to motivate and clarify the alternative position of the non-reductive realists.
Before leaving the topic of reductive realism, however, I need to take account of a slight complication. In my discussion to this point, I have allowed myself to speak as if reductive realists intend to identify individual paradigmatic relations such as tallness or shortness with pairs of monadic properties taken jointly. I have done this because, at least initially, this seems to be the most natural way to make sense of their position. After all, it is not Simmias's height taken by itself that necessitates his being taller than anyone. On the contrary, it is only when his height is taken together with that of another, say Socrates's, that the relation comes to hold of him. But even if this seems initially to be the most natural way to construe reductive realism, it is not the way medieval philosophers typically understand it. As I indicated earlier, medieval philosophers typically identify relations such as tallness or shortness, not with pairs of monadic properties taken jointly, but with the individual members of such pairs. Thus, even if a pair of monadic properties is required to explain a relational situation such as Simmias's being taller than Socrates, medieval philosophers typically want to say that only one of these properties is to be identified with Simmias's tallness (and hence to correspond to the concept ‘taller than’), whereas the other is to be identified with Socrates's shortness (and hence to correspond to the concept ‘shorter than’). But how is this possible, especially if the properties in question are supposed to be just ordinary heights?
To begin, let us note that medievals do recognize the worry associated with identifying relations with ordinary monadic properties taken individually. In fact, this recognition sometimes leads them to consider developing reductive realism in just the way suggested above. Thus, in a particularly striking passage from one of Henry Harclay's later works it is suggested that, although the similarity between two white things cannot plausibly be identified with the whiteness of either one, it might nonetheless be identified with the pair of whitenesses taken jointly. Indeed, he even draws on common medieval views about number to make the suggestion plausible:
A relation is clearly a reality distinct from one foundation, but not a reality distinct from both foundations. For when one white thing [such as Simmias] is posited and then another white thing [such as Socrates] is posited, there is a relation beginning at that point. Thus, the similarity is not a [single] whiteness, but two whitenesses existing at once. Indeed, the two whitenesses can be sufficient to constitute a single species in the genus of relation. Just as two discrete unities of whatever magnitude are sufficient for producing a single species of number, so too the same thing holds for the case at hand. Again, just as plurality or multitude is not a reality different from the constituents of the plurality or multitude, neither is the similarity [of the white things] different [from their whitenesses].
As this passage clearly indicates, medieval philosophers do consider the possibility of identifying relations with pairs of monadic properties or accidents. Having considered this sort of identification, however, they do not typically endorse it. Thus Harclay, who certainly seems to be attracted to a form of reductive realism, proceeds immediately to reject such an identification on the grounds that it would lead to certain absurdities. Citing Avicenna as his authority, he says:
Avicenna argues against this on the basis of relations involving inferiority and superiority, for it is clearer in those cases than it is for other relations, such as those involving equals. For fatherhood is in the father alone and not in the son . . . and the same thing holds of sonship. Therefore one must hold that there are two relations [here]. And in this case it is clear that the relation is not the same reality as [the two] foundations because the relation is not in everything in which the foundation of the relatum is. This is the case, too, for relations involving equals, even if it is not as clear.
In this passage, Harclay calls our attention to one of the consequences of identifying relations such as fatherhood and sonship with pairs of properties or accidents. If a relation such as fatherhood just is a pair of accidents, then it would follow that fatherhood is partly in the father and partly in the son (since the pair is such that one of its members inheres in the father, the other in the son). But this, says Harclay, is absurd. Fatherhood is an asymmetrical relation (or as Harclay prefers to put it, a relation involving superiority and inferiority) -- that is to say, if an individual a has fatherhood in respect of another individual, b, b cannot have fatherhood in respect of a. Harclay takes this to show that “fatherhood is in the father alone and not in the son”. And the same is true, he thinks, of its converse, sonship, as well as for all other relations, including symmetrical relations or “relations involving equals, even if it is not as clear”.
In this passage, Harclay makes explicit views that appear to be taken for granted by medieval philosophers generally. But if relations are not to be identified with pairs of accidents, how can reductive realists think of them in terms of ordinary, non-relational accidents? After all, the only other option seems to be identifying them with ordinary accidents taken individually -- which as we have seen is problematic. For it is not an ordinary accident such as Simmias's height that necessitates Simmias's being taller, but only this height taken together with that of another. Indeed, it was precisely this point that led us to conclude that “relative-making” is a description best reserved for pairs of ordinary properties taken jointly.
At this point, it seems to me that the reductive realist should respond by saying that, although Simmias's height is not by itself relative-making, it is nonetheless potentially relative-making. For if Simmias's height is by itself potentially relative-making, then apparently we are entitled to say that in the presence of another height, such as Socrates's, it becomes actually relative-making -- that is to say, it actually comes to relate Simmias to Socrates. This suggests a third option for reductive realists: to maintain that relations are to be identified with ordinary, non-relational accidents in certain circumstances.
In fact, it is this last sort of view that I think most reductive realists during the medieval period actually hold. Thus, as I interpret Harclay, this is precisely the view he goes on to develop in the discussion we have been following. Simmias's being taller than Socrates is to be identified, on his view, not with Simmias's height tout court, but with Simmias's height in certain circumstances -- including the circumstance that Socrates is five-feet-ten. (One is put in mind here of attempts by certain contemporary philosophers to identify dispositions, such as brittleness or solubility, with their categorical basis in certain circumstances -- namely, the circumstance that the appropriate laws of nature obtain.) To put Harclay's view in a slightly different way, one which will help to bring out its semantic consequences, we might say that in a world in which Simmias exists by himself a judgment of the form ‘Simmias is taller than Socrates’ will be false, and hence nothing will correspond to the relational concept ‘taller than’. But in a world in which Simmias is six-feet-tall while Socrates is five-feet-ten, a judgment of the same form will be true, and in this world there will be something corresponding to ‘taller’, namely, Simmias's height. In such a world, medieval philosophers would say that ‘taller’ primarily signifies Simmias's height, but indirectly signifies or connotes the height of Socrates.
Now as it turns out, it is not only the reductive realists, but the non-reductive realists as well that speak of relations as accidents of single subjects -- that is, of Simmias's tallness as something belonging only to him, of Socrates's shortness as something belonging only to him, and so on for all other particular relations. In light of what has just been said, therefore, we can clarify our understanding of the paradigmatic analysis of relational situations generally. As indicated earlier, this analysis requires that when a judgment of the form ‘aRb’ is true, what makes it true is a pair of individuals, a and b, and a pair of monadic properties or accidents, F and G. Reductive realists, as we have just seen, identify F and G with ordinary categorial accidents, whereas non-reductive realists, as we shall see in the next section, identify F and G with accidents of a sui generis type. But however they construe the nature of these accidents, they both deny that it is the pair of accidents -- that is, F and G taken jointly -- that corresponds to our relational concepts. On the contrary, they say, F directly corresponds to one of our relational concepts, whereas G directly corresponds to its converse. Thus, when Simmias is taller than Socrates, reductivists and non-reductivists are agreed that it is an accident of Simmias that directly corresponds to (or as they would prefer to say, is primarily signified by) the concept ‘taller than’, and an accident of Socrates that is primarily signified by the concept ‘shorter than’. To the extent they disagree, therefore, their disagreement concerns only whether the accidents primarily signified by relational concepts can also be signified by ordinary non-relational concepts (and if so, precisely how and under what circumstances).
With these clarifications in mind, I now turn to considerations that lead some medieval philosophers to reject reductive realism in favor of a form of non-reductivism.
Of all the considerations favoring non-reductive realism, perhaps none is more compelling than the intuition that relations have a different nature or ‘quiddity’ from that of ordinary categorial accidents. As we have seen, medieval philosophers recognize that predications involving relative terms (such as “x is taller”) are incomplete in a way that monadic or absolute predications (such as “x is white”) are not. They also recognize, moreover, that unlike absolute terms relative terms come in pairs or sets. Every relative term has a correlative, and the meaning of the one (say, “taller”) cannot be understood in isolation from the meaning of the other (“shorter”). These facts about relative terms and predication are often thought to show that the items signified by them have a distinct nature or quiddity from that of their foundations -- the ordinary, absolute accidents. Here again it is useful to quote Harclay:
Avicenna (Metaphysics III, the chapter on relation) says that a relation has its own quiddity distinct from the quiddity of its foundation. Therefore it is a distinct reality. Moreover, in the Categories Aristotle says that the being associated with relatives is being-toward-something-else (ad aliud se habere). But it is not the case that the being of a foundation is being-toward-something-else. Therefore they are not the same.”
A reductive realist can, of course, explain the uniqueness of relative terms and predications without introducing relations over and above their foundations. For such a realist can always assert that relative terms are associated with concepts whose content is distinct from that of any non-relational or absolute concepts, and insist that this is all that is required to explain the peculiar nature of relative terms and predications. Even so, there is a question that remains for the reductive realist. Why, it must be asked, if Simmias's being taller than Socrates is nothing ontologically over and above Simmias's and Socrates's heights, do we represent this relation as if it were? At this point, it would seem that the reductive realist can only appeal to our psychological make-up. We simply do (or at lest can) represent one and the same situation in two very different ways. As Ockham says in one of his Quodlibetal questions, using a slightly different example:
Socrates is similar to Plato by the very fact that Socrates is white and Plato is white . . . Yet, despite this, the intellect can express these many absolute things by means of concepts in diverse ways: in one way, by means of an absolute concept, as when one says simply ‘Socrates is white’ or ‘Plato is white’; in a second way, by means of a relative concept, as when one says ‘Socrates is similar to Plato with respect to whiteness’.
Even if one does not find this sort of appeal to psychology implausible, the non-reductive realist would seem to have a more satisfying reply to the original question -- namely, “Why do we represent Simmias's being taller than Socrates as distinct from Simmias's being six-feet-tall while Socrates is five-feet-ten?” For according to the non-reductive realist, we represent these two situations as distinct because they are distinct. Indeed, the non-reductive realist can say that the logical incompleteness of predicates such as “taller” (and its correlative, “shorter”) calls our attention to precisely what makes these situations distinct -- namely, the sui generis accidents that are possessed by Simmias and Socrates in addition to their respective heights.
Now as most non-reductive realists recognize, there is a difficulty posed by their position -- namely, that of giving a perspicuous account of the nature of paradigmatic relations or relational accidents. They often attribute this difficulty, however, to the fact that the nature in question is sui generis. As Albert the Great says, when he turns to the discussion of relations in his commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics: “It is difficult for us to speak about [the category of] toward something or relation because it has a nature and being altogether different from the genera of being which have been considered so far [namely, substance, quantity, and quality].” Given that non-reductivists construe the nature of paradigmatic relations as sui generis, it is not surprising that they feel the need to resort to metaphors to describe it. Albert himself appeals most often to a visual metaphor of outward-looking-ness (respectus), and describes individual relations as that in virtue of which a subject ‘looks out toward’ (respicit ad) another. Other philosophers, however, rely on other metaphors and variously describe the nature of relations as ‘directionality’ or ‘toward-ness’ (aditas), as a certain kind of disposition or way of holding oneself (habitudo or relativa habitudo), or again as the principle of ‘structure’ or ‘order’ (ordinatio).
Of all these metaphors, the ones involving directionality -- or intentionality -- are likely to be the most helpful to us. For there are some contemporary philosophers who characterize intentionality, not in terms of a polyadic or many-place property, but as a sui generis type of monadic property. According to these philosophers, intentionality is a property whose intrinsic nature is such that, when it is exemplified by a subject in appropriate circumstances, which include the presence of an appropriate object, it relates its subject to the object in question -- in particular, it relates the subject to it as thinker to object thought. This analogy is useful, I think, because non-reductive realists typically regard intentionality as a special case (or type) of relation. According to non-reductivists, all paradigmatic relations (or at least all those that qualify as sui generis accidents) are properties whose intrinsic nature is such that their exemplification in the appropriate circumstances will relate their subjects to something else. It is just that in certain cases, these properties relate their subjects specifically as thinkers to objects thought.
In the end, therefore, it would appear that the non-reductive realists do have something to say in response to the reductivists' worries about the mysterious nature of relations and their appeals to considerations of theoretical parsimony. But what about the phenomenon of relational change? As we have seen, the reductive realists have a natural explanation of it. But is there anything that the non-reductive realists can say about it?
As I said earlier, medieval philosophers share the intuition that the acquisition (or loss) of relations by a subject can occur without any real change taking place on the part of this subject -- that is, solely in virtue of a so-called Cambridge change. To explain this intuition, some non-reductivists think it is enough to say that a relation can be acquired (or lost) without its subject undergoing any real change with respect to its absolute accidents. Thus, the example of Socrates's coming to be shorter than Simmias is sometimes glossed by saying that, with respect to absolute accidents, it is true that Socrates comes to be shorter than Simmias solely in virtue of a real change in Simmias. Nonetheless, if we consider Socrates's relative accidents as well, such non-reductivists will say that Socrates has, in fact, undergone a real ‘relative’ change -- that is, a real change with respect to one of his relations. 
But non-reductivists need not take this line. Some, more sympathetic to the reductive realist position on relational change, take cases like that involving Simmias and Socrates as an opportunity to further clarify the nature of relations. Albert the Great, for example, argues that relational accidents are so closely tied to their foundations that they are acquired along with them. Thus, if Socrates comes into existence in a world all by himself at a height of five-feet-ten-inches-tall, he will not only possess a certain quantity (namely, his height), but in virtue of possessing it, he will also possess a sui generis relational accident. Now, in such a world, the relational accident will not actually relate Socrates to anyone or anything. In virtue of possessing it, however, he will be potentially related. Suppose, however, that Simmias now comes into existence at six-feet-tall. Socrates's relational accident will come actually to relate him to Simmias as shorter. In doing so, however, Albert insists that Socrates will not undergo any real change whatsoever, absolute or otherwise. Not surprisingly this sort of view leads Albert to distinguish sharply between relational accidents and relations (which are just relational accidents in certain circumstances), and to suggests that strictly speaking we should think of the relevant category as comprised, not of relations, but of relational accidents. This, too, helps to explain why in referring to the members of this category Albert prefers the concrete terms “toward something” (ad aliquid) and “relative” (relativum) to the abstract term “relation” (relatio) -- for relational accidents are ‘toward something’ or outwardly directed even if they are not actually relating their subject to anything.
Like Albert, Aquinas too suggests that there is a close connection between relational accidents and their foundations. Following Albert's terminology, he suggests that in virtue of possessing a specific height or quantity, an individual such as Socrates is potentially equal to all those who have the same height, and potentially unequal to -- that is, potentially shorter or taller than -- all those with a different height. Like Albert, moreover, Aquinas says that such an individual can come to be actually equal (or unequal) to another solely in virtue of a change in that other, and concludes from this that relations must be in their foundations as in a root (in radice).  On some interpretations, this is to be explained by saying that although relations and their foundations differ formally -- that is, involve different accidental forms or properties -- nonetheless their act of being (esse) is identical. Thus, when Socrates comes to be shorter than Simmias as a result of Simmias's growth, Socrates does not undergo a change properly speaking, since he does not acquire any new act of being. Rather, the ‘old’ act of being of his height (sometimes referred to as the ‘esse-in’ of the relation) merely acquires a new determination (sometimes referred to as the ‘esse-ad’ of the relation), in this case to Simmias.
We have seen enough, I think, to appreciate the main ontological differences that divide reductive and non-reductive realists, and even some of the differences that divide non-reductivists among themselves. As I indicated earlier, in the later Middle Ages these differences tend to emerge in the context of the debate over whether relations are identical with their foundations. As I also indicated, however, we have to be careful not to assume that how a given philosopher answers this question is an infallible guide to his position. For although reductivists typically affirm that relations are identical to their foundations, and non-reductivists typically deny it, there are some reductivists who side, at least verbally, with the non-reductivists on this question. Thus, the later Harclay, as I interpret him, is a reductive realist -- for he not only rejects the existence of sui generis relational properties, but also maintains that in paradigmatic relational situations, substances are related by their ordinary, non-relational accidents. Nonetheless, Harclay denies that relations are identical with their foundations, since he thinks this would amount to saying that relations can be straightforwardly identified either with ordinary accidents taken by themselves or with pairs of such accidents taken jointly. Again, as I shall point out in the next section, a number of later medieval reductivists, including Ockham, eventually come to reject the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations as items that relate substances in favor of the view that relations are items existing only in the mind (as concepts). As we shall see, this does not mean that Ockham and others deny that there are extramental grounds for our relational concepts or even that things can be related by their foundations independently of the mind. On the contrary, it means only that, unlike their predecessors, they refuse to call anything that grounds a relational concept a relation. The fact that these reductivists regard relations as concepts, however, explains why they too are willing to deny the identity of relations and their foundations: for the relevant foundations, according to these philosophers, are ordinary, extramental accidents, and obviously no concept (or act of the mind) could be identical with them.
Finally, it must be noted that even the notions of identity and real distinction come to be the subject of controversy during the high and later Middle Ages, and this too has the result of complicating the debate over whether relations are identical to their foundations. For all these reasons, therefore, we must be careful not to identify too closely the debate between reductive and non-reductive realists with the debate over whether relations are identical to their foundations.
So far we have been focusing only on the medieval discussion of paradigmatic relational situations -- that is, relational situations conforming to the analysis suggested in Aristotle's Categories. According to this analysis, as we have seen, when a judgment of the form ‘aRb’ is true, what makes it true is nothing but a and b and a pair of accidents inhering in them, F and G, which correspond, respectively, to the concepts ‘R’ and, its converse, ‘R-1’. Although this analysis is suggested by Aristotle's discussion in the Categories, it is clear from some of his later works, most notably the Metaphysics, that Aristotle does not think all relational situations can be made to conform to it. Thus, in Metaphysics V, he suggests that there are some relational situations in which substances are related, not by a pair of accidents, but by a single accident belonging to just one of them. Here he cites the example of intentional relations. Thus, if it is true that Simmias is thinking about Socrates, what makes this true is nothing but Simmias, Socrates, and an accident of Simmias. For the sake of convenience, let us hereafter refer to relational situations that do not conform to the paradigm of the Categories as non-paradigmatic relational situations.
Although medieval philosophers did not have direct access to Aristotle's Metaphysics until the mid-twelfth century, they did feel pressure from other, largely theological sources to admit something like his non-paradigmatic relational situations. On the standard medieval conception of deity, God is an absolutely perfect being, where this is taken to imply that God not does not have any accidents, is immutable, and hence cannot undergo any real change. On this conception of deity, however, it is difficult to explain God's relational features. As Augustine points out in book V of his De Trinitate, the difficulty can be expressed in a particularly acute form with respect to the Christian doctrine of creation, according to which God freely created the universe. This doctrine suggests that at one time God lacks, and at a later time acquires, a contingent or accidental relation -- namely, that of being creator. But then does it not also require that in creating the universe God underwent a real change? And what about the claim that there are no accidents in God?
Augustine's solution, which is taken up and developed by medieval philosophers, is to say that when God acquires a new relation, this is not to be explained in terms of any properties or accidents of him, but is rather to be explained in terms of properties or accidents of the things to which he is related. Thus, in the case of creation Augustine says:
Even though [God's substance] begins to be [truly] spoken of [as related to a creature] at some time, still nothing is to be understood to have happened to the divine substance itself, but only to the creature in relation to whom it is spoken of.
On the basis of theological considerations, therefore, Augustine is led to something like Aristotle's non-paradigmatic relational situations. For according to him what makes it true that God is related to his creatures is nothing but God, the creatures, and a monadic property or accident of the latter.
Interestingly, Augustine does not think that the case of God is unique, but also suggests that there are non-theological cases in which things are related solely in virtue of the properties or accidents of other things. Thus, a coin, he says can increase or decrease in value solely in virtue of the intentional states of human beings. Boethius, in a treatise also known as De Trinitate, discusses these same sorts of issues and in the course of doing so adds yet another non-theological example -- a variation of which comes to be the standard medieval example of a non-paradigmatic relational situation. Consider a man who walks up beside a stationary column. In this sort of case, medieval philosophers like to say, the column comes to be to the right of the man, but solely in virtue of a property of the man.
Thus, even before medieval philosophers had direct access to Aristotle's Metaphysics they were led to acknowledge the existence of the type of relational situations mentioned there. Of course, once the relevant texts of Aristotle became available, the medievals worked hard to connect their discussions with these texts. Indeed, when the issue of God's relation to his creatures is taken up in the thirteenth century -- an issue that becomes one of the foci of medieval discussions of relations generally -- medieval philosophers often made direct appeals to Aristotle's discussion in Metaphysics V.
So far, then, we have seen that medieval philosophers are committed to recognizing at least one type of non-paradigmatic relational situation -- namely, those involving a pair of substances and a single accident inhering in just one them. As we might expect, medieval philosophers disagree about the precise nature of the accidents involved in these situations. Reductive realists, of course, identify them with ordinary, non-relational accidents, whereas non-reductive realists identify them with accidents of a sui generis type. Thus, when Simmias is thinking of Socrates, the reductive realist will appeal to nothing more than a quality of Simmias, whereas the non-reductive realist will also postulate an accident distinct from, but necessitated by Simmias's quality.
For our purposes, however, what is most interesting about the type of relational situation in question is the complication it presents for both reductive and non-reductive realists. In paradigmatic relational situations, as we have seen, there is always a distinct property or accident corresponding to each member of the relevant pair of converse relational concepts. Thus, when Simmias is taller than Socrates, there is one accident corresponding to the concept ‘taller than’ (namely, an accident of Simmias) and one accident corresponding to the concept ‘shorter than’ (namely, an accident of Socrates). But now consider a situation such as Simmias's thinking about Socrates, or God's being related to a creature -- that is, a situation where two substances are related by a property or accident inhering in only one of the relata. What is to be said about the relationship between the relevant property and concepts in situations of this sort? Obviously, this is a question that arises regardless of how one analyzes the nature of the accident itself.
Initially, we might expect medievals to respond to this by saying that, in such situations, there is a single accident corresponding to both members of the relevant pair of relational concepts. Thus, if Simmias is thinking about Socrates, one and the same thing corresponds to both the concepts ‘thinking of’ and ‘thought about’, namely, an accident of Simmias. The problem with this suggestion, however, is that it leads to the same sort of difficulties we encountered earlier for identifying relations with pairs of accidents taken jointly. Socrates's being thought about appears to be in Socrates and Socrates alone. But if we identify this relation with an accident of Simmias, then we shall have to say that Socrates's being thought about is not in Socrates after all, but only in Simmias. Although medievals do allow for cases of what they call extrinsic denomination -- that is, cases where a property or accident of one thing is predicated of something else -- they typically do not allow for this in the case of relations. That is to say, relations are typically regarded as intrinsic to the subjects of which their corresponding terms or concepts are predicated. Evidently, therefore, the relevant accident of Simmias can correspond to the concept ‘thinking of’, but not to the concept ‘thought about’. But, then, we still need to know what corresponds to this latter concept.
Now perhaps it will be suggested that, in the absence of any property or accident of Socrates to correspond to the concept ‘thought about’, Socrates himself can serve as the correspondent. In that case, however, we should have to admit that an individual substance is a relation (for according to the standard medieval characterization of relations, whatever corresponds to a relational concept is a relation). But such an admission goes against deep-seated intuitions deriving from the Categories. As we have seen, Aristotle not only identifies relations with accidents in the Categories, but intentionally characterizes relations in such a way as to exclude substances from this category. But then we still lack a solution to our problem. If there is no property or accident of Socrates to correspond to the concept ‘thought about’, and neither Socrates nor a property of anything else can correspond to it, then what, if anything, can?
It is at this point that the medieval notion of a relation of reason (relatio rationis) becomes important. Medieval philosophers often say that even if there are relational situations involving only a single accident, nonetheless we must still conceive of these situations as if they involved a pair of accidents, one belonging to each of the related things. Like Boethius, the medievals accept the view that relations cannot be understood to exist by themselves or apart from their correlatives. Relations, they say, always come in pairs. Perhaps this is because they think our understanding of relational situations in general is based on our understanding of the paradigmatic cases, which always do involve pairs of accidents. In any case, medieval philosophers take the fact that relations always come in pairs to show that even if there is no real or extramental property in Socrates that accounts for his being thought about by Simmias, we must nonetheless conceive of this situation as if there were one and, as it were, project this property onto Socrates. Since such projections depend for their existence on the activity of the mind, medieval philosophers refer to them as beings of reason (entia rationis). And their suggestion is that we take these beings of reason to be the items corresponding to or signified by concepts such as ‘thought about’.
The notion of a being of reason, or more specifically the notion of a relation of reason, does not appear to have been invoked in the Latin west before the thirteenth century, when Aristotle's Metaphysics and certain Muslim philosophical commentaries and treatises derived from it began to circulate widely. The notion of a relation of reason is not to be found explicitly in the works of Aristotle, though in the Metaphysics he does distinguish real beings from beings of reason. Relations of reason are, however, explicitly invoked by certain Muslim philosophers, most notably Avicenna (d. 1037), and it may well be that the distinction between real relations and relations of reason makes its way into the Latin west because of them.
However that may be, once the distinction is introduced in the Latin west, it becomes pervasive -- so pervasive, in fact, that even philosophers, such as Ockham, who complain that such a distinction is “not to be found in the writings of Aristotle” and that “‘relation of reason’ is not a philosophical term”, nevertheless feel compelled to give some account of it in order to preserve common usage. The pervasiveness of this distinction is explained at least partly by the fact that medieval philosophers think it can be used to clarify and explain a number of troublesome non-paradigmatic relational situations. Thus, by the end of thirteenth century, most philosophers explain the doctrine of creation in terms of this distinction, saying that creatures are related to God by a real relation, but God is related to them by a mere relation of reason. Again, they often use the distinction to clarify certain cases of relational change. Thus, when a substance acquires a new relation without undergoing any real change this is often explained by saying that the substance acquired a mere relation of reason. Finally, some medieval philosophers use relations of reason to identify a sense in which God can have accidents after all. Since relations of reason are mere projections (i.e., properties a thing has by virtue of the activity of some mind), it is possible to conceive of them as accidents in a broad sense -- that is, as properties or features that a thing can both acquire and lose. But since the acquisition or loss of these properties does not require a subject to undergo any real change, it is sometimes said that there is no reason in principle why even God should not have accidents of this sort.
The distinction between real relations and relations of reason has a number of important consequences for the development of medieval discussions of relations. For one thing, it enables philosophers to develop a number of further refinements and distinctions within the category of relations. By the mid-thirteenth century, for example, it becomes common to say that the category of relations is unique in allowing mere beings of reason among the things signified by its terms. To quote from Aquinas who is representative in this regard:
The other genera, by virtue of what they are, posit something in extramental reality. Thus, quantity by virtue of the fact that it is quantity posits something. But relation alone is such that, by virtue of what it is, it does not posit anything in extramental reality, for it does not predicate something but toward something. Hence we find certain relations that do not posit anything in extramental reality, but only in reason.
Again, Aquinas and others appeal to this special feature of the category of relations (namely, that the things signified by its terms can either be real beings or mere beings of reason) to provide a systematic division of relations or pairs of correlatives into three different types, depending on whether the members of these pairs are both real, both conceptual, or mixed (i.e., one member is real, the other conceptual). To quote again from Aquinas:
It must be known that, since a relation requires two relata, there are three ways in which it can be something real or conceptual:
 Sometimes it is a mere being of reason on the part of both relata, namely, when the order or [relative] disposition cannot exist between things except in virtue of the apprehension of reason alone. For example, when we say that something is identical to itself. For in virtue of the fact that reason apprehends one thing twice, it regards it as two; and in this way it apprehends a certain [relative] disposition of a thing to itself. And the same thing is true of all relations between being and non-being, which reason forms insofar as it apprehends a non-being as a certain relatum. Again, the same is true of all relations that follow upon the activity of reason, such as genus and species, and the like.
 Now there are other relations that are real as regards both relata, namely, whenever there is a [relative] disposition between two things in virtue of something really belonging to each of them -- as is clear from all relations that follow on quantity, such as large and small, double and half, and things of this sort. For there is a quantity in both relata. And the same is true of relations that follow on action and passion, such as mover and movable, father and son, and the like.
 Sometimes, however, a relation is something real in one of the relata and a mere being of reason in the other. And this happens whenever the two relata do not belong to a single order. For example, sense perception and knowledge are related to things that are sensible and intelligible. But insofar as the latter are things existing in extramental reality, they are outside the order of sensible and intelligible being. And so there is a real relation in the knowledge and sense perception in virtue of the fact that they are [really] ordered to things that can be known or sensed. However, things [that can be known or sensed] are outside this sort of order [when] considered in themselves, and hence there is not really a relation in them to knowledge or sense perception. On the contrary, there is only a relation in them in accordance with reason, insofar as the intellect apprehends them as terms of the relations of knowledge and sense perception. This is why the Philosopher says in Metaphysics V that they are spoken of relatively, not because they are related to other things, but because other things are related to them. Similarly, being to the right is not said of a column unless it is placed to the right of some animal. Hence a relation of this sort is not really in the column but in the animal.
In this passage, Aquinas contrasts the relations involved in paradigmatic relational situations -- namely, relations of the second type -- with the relations involved in two different sorts of non-paradigmatic relational situation. We are already familiar with relations of the third or ‘mixed’ type -- which are comprised by pairs of accidents only one of whose members is real -- from our discussion of creation and intentional relations. Moreover, we can see that Aquinas's discussion of these relations follows the common practice of connecting them with both Aristotle's discussion in the Metaphysics and the Boethius-inspired example of the column. We have yet, however, to encounter relations of the first type. These are relations comprised by pairs of properties or accidents both of whose members are beings of reason. As an example of this type of relation, Aquinas gives self-identity. And his view is that when we conceive of a situation involving this sort of relation -- say Socrates's being identical to himself -- we conceive of it both as if it involved two things (“a relation requires two relata” and hence “reason apprehends the one thing twice”), and as if the two things were ordered to each other by a pair of properties (or “[relative] dispositions”). Obviously, however, there are not two distinct things in extramental reality to serve as the relata of the relation of self-identity, much less two properties by which such relata are related. Like many other medievals, therefore, Aquinas concludes that in this case the relations (or relative dispositions) are not real, but mere beings of reason.
Initially the claim that self-identity is a relation of reason might seem worrisome. For insofar as relations of reason depend for their existence on the activity of the mind, it would seem to follow that something's being self-identical is dependent on the activity of the mind. But that seems absurd. As medieval philosophers recognize, this sort of worry is perfectly generalizable, and so can be raised not only for situations involving pairs of relations of reason, but also for situations involving a single relation of reason. Thus, as Aquinas points out in one of his disputed questions, it might even lead one to doubt whether God's relation to his creatures can be considered a relation of reason:
For if there were no created intellect in existence, God would still be Lord and Creator. But if there were no created intellect in existence, there would not be any beings of reason. Hence “Creator”, “Lord”, and terms of this sort, do not express relations of reason.
This sort of worry about relations of reason helps to explain what is perhaps their most significant effect on the medieval discussion of relations -- namely, a gradual shift away from the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations. On this characterization, as we saw earlier, relations are identified in terms of their metaphysical function -- that is to say, they are characterized as the items that actually serve to relate things. But in order to maintain that things can be self-identical apart from the activity of any mind, while at the same time maintaining that self-identity is a relation of reason, medieval philosophers have little choice but to move away from the traditional characterization. And of course the same thing is true in the case of God's relation to his creatures. Thus, as Aquinas says in reply to abovementioned doubt:
A man is really (and not merely conceptually) identical to himself, even though his relation [of self-identity] is a being of reason. And the explanation for this is that the cause of his relation is real -- namely, the unity of his substance, which our intellect considers under the aspect of a relation. In the same way, the power to compel subjects is really in God, and our intellect considers this power as ordered to the subjects because of the subjects' order to God. It is for this reason that he is really said to be Lord, even though his relation is a mere being of reason. And for the same reason it is evident that he would be Lord [Creator, etc.] even if there were no created intellect in existence.
In this passage, Aquinas makes it clear that in cases involving relations such as self-identity or God's relation to the world the relata are related, not by their relations (since these are mere beings of reason and hence dependent on the activity of the mind), but by what he refers to here as the cause of their relations. Now, in the case of a man's being self-identical, Aquinas says the cause is just “the unity of his substance”, where by this he seems to mean that what makes a man identical to himself is just the man himself. Again, in the case of God's being Lord he says that the cause is “the power to compel subjects”. In the case of God, however, Aquinas does not think the power to compel subjects is distinct from its subject, namely, the divine nature. Hence, he maintains that what makes it true that God is Lord is nothing but God, his creatures, and some property or attribute of the creatures, namely, their dependence for their existence on God.
In effect, therefore, reflection on relations of reason brings about a shift away from the conception of relations as items that relate, and thus forces medieval philosophers to fall back on what they might otherwise have thought of as an equivalent characterization, namely, the view that relations are items corresponding to or signified by our relational concepts. Thus, even if self-identity or God's relation to the world is a mere being of reason, and hence does not actually relate its subject to anything, nonetheless it can still be regarded as a relation on the grounds that it is signified by a relational concept. Now obviously this shift away from the traditional Aristotelian conception has the awkward consequence that things can be related even if their relations do not exist. Thus, Socrates can be identical to himself even if there is no self-identity, God can be Lord of creation even if his relation of Lordship does not exist, and more generally, a judgment of the form ‘aRb’ can be true, even when no judgment of form ‘R-ness exists’ is true. Of course, there is nothing ultimately incoherent about this consequence, provided we keep in mind that the relations in such cases are mere beings of reason. Nonetheless, accepting this consequence does force medieval philosophers to deny what at least initially appears to be a truth of reason, and at any rate is part of common sense -- namely, that things are related by their relations.
Some philosophers, such as Aquinas, assume that the departure from the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations is required only in non-paradigmatic relational situations. By the end of the Middle Ages, however, this sort of departure is so common and familiar that philosophers no longer feel the need to regard it as exceptional. Thus, Ockham eventually adopts a view according to which all relations depend for their existence on the activity of the mind. Indeed, things are so changed by the time of Ockham that he feels free not only to reject the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations, but also to modify the standard medieval alternative to it. Thus, on his preferred characterization, relations are the items corresponding, not to all of our relational concepts, but to just one of them -- namely, the concept ‘relation’. As Ockham sees it, moreover, the concept ‘relation’ is a term of second intention -- that is to say, a term to which only concepts correspond. Thus, even though Ockham insists that many judgments of the form ‘aRb’ are true independently of the mind, he nonetheless maintains that properly speaking relations exist only in the mind as concepts. This helps to explain why he often expresses his view using formulas such as: “This white thing really is similar, even though similarity is not really in this white thing.”
Although relations of reason force a shift away from the Aristotelian characterization of relations, it is important to recall that they were originally invoked to preserve the deep-seated Aristotelian conviction that no substance is a relation. Thus, as we saw, in order to avoid saying that Socrates is signified by the concept ‘thought about’, when he is being thought about by Simmias, medieval philosophers invoke the notion of a relation of reason: it is not Socrates, but a relation of reason, they say, that corresponds to the concept in question, and in this way avoid the consequence that a substance such as Socrates is a relation. And of course the same sort of invocation is needed to avoid saying that Socrates corresponds to the concept of ‘self-identical’ or that God corresponds to the concepts ‘Lord’ or ‘Creator’. Given the lengths to which medieval philosophers are willing to go, in situations such as these, to preserve the thesis that no substance is a relation, it is all the more interesting that there is at least one case -- namely, the Christian doctrine of the Trinity -- in which they are forced to admit that even this Aristotelian thesis cannot be upheld.
According to the Christian doctrine of the Trinity, God exists in three persons: Father, Son, and Holy Spirit. As this doctrine was typically understood during the Middle Ages, it implies not only that God possesses certain relations -- such as fatherhood and sonship -- but also that he possess them independently of the activity of any mind. As Aquinas says in his Summa Theologiae:
Someone is said to be a father only by virtue of his fatherhood, and someone is said to be a son only by virtue of his sonship. Therefore, if [the relations of] fatherhood and sonship are not really in God, it follows that God is not a Father or Son really, but merely according to a concept of the mind -- which is the Sabellian heresy.
Now when the claim that there are real relations in God is combined with another doctrine that was ubiquitous in the Middle Ages, namely the doctrine of divine simplicity, the conclusion that God (and hence at least one substance) is a relation seems to follow necessarily. For as the doctrine of divine simplicity is typically understood, there is no real distinction to be drawn between God and any of his attributes. Thus, if God is good, he is identical to his goodness; if he is wise, he is identical to his wisdom. By parity of reasoning, therefore, if God is a father or son, he must be identical to his fatherhood and sonship. Again, Aquinas is perfectly representative in this regard: “Whatever is in God is his nature . . . It is thus clear that a relation really existing in God is identical to his nature according to reality, and does not differ from it except according to a concept of the mind.”
The doctrine of the Trinity, therefore, brings us to what is perhaps the medievals' greatest departure from Aristotle. Some medievals, however, see the Trinity not as providing a counterexample to Aristotle's thesis that no substance is a relation, but rather as calling our attention to a restriction on its range of applicability. Aquinas, for example, appears to think that the thesis was specifically formulated to apply only to the case of creatures, and to some extent this is plausible, since obviously Aristotle was not thinking about theological examples such as the Trinity when he formulated it. Interestingly, however, other philosophers think that the thesis does not hold even in the case of all creatures. Thus, Gilbert of Poitiers (d. 1154), in a discussion of Boethius's De hebdomadibus, suggests that creaturely goodness is a relation, indeed, just the relation of being created by God. As I read him, moreover, Gilbert takes this relation to be nothing over and above the creature itself, so that in the case of creatures it is individual substances that correspond to the concept ‘created by’ and hence qualify as relations. Like Aquinas, however, Gilbert appears to think of these sorts of cases, not as providing counterexamples to Aristotle's thesis, but rather as telling us something about the scope of its applicability. According to Gilbert, there is a distinction to be drawn between natural philosophy, which he says deals with natural things, and other areas of intellectual inquiry, including theology and ethics, which he says deal with a broader scope of things. And Gilbert's suggestion is that if we restrict our attention to natural philosophy, as no doubt Aristotle did, then like him we will be led to the conclusion that no substance is a relation.
Although Gilbert and Aquinas work hard to preserve, at least in non-theological contexts, something like the Aristotelian thesis that no substance is a relation, not all medieval philosophers feel the need to do so. Indeed, as Middle Ages progress, there appears to be a gradual shift, even in non-theological contexts, towards allowing substances to be relations, or at least towards allowing them to be the primary significata of our relational concepts. Here again Ockham appears to be an important transitional figure. Thus, he breaks with tradition in allowing that even self-identity is a real relation, or at least that it is “real . . . in the same way that similarity and equality are”. Indeed, on Ockham's view, which becomes influential in the generations following him, it turns out that substances are signified by most of our relational concepts. For apart from some species of quality, Ockham thinks there is no real distinction to be drawn between substances and any of there accidents. According to him, therefore, relational situations do not typically involve anything more than individual substances.
We are now in a position to appreciate, I think, the main types of views that medievals developed concerning the nature and ontological status of relations, as well as the main historical and dialectical considerations that helped to shape them. As we have seen, with the exception of thinkers such as Peter Aureoli, medievals appear to have been drawn (almost to a person) to a form of realism about relations, one according to which at least some judgments of the form ‘aRb’ are true independently of the mind. There is some disagreement as to the precise analysis of the situations that makes these sorts of judgments true, but even here the medievals work out their views from within a common framework provided by Aristotle's Categories. Thus, it is generally agreed that relational situations do not include anything corresponding to the notion of a polyadic property, but instead include only substances and their monadic properties or accidents. The main disagreements, therefore, are best characterized as disagreements about the extent to which the proper analysis ought to conform to the paradigm suggested by the Categories. Prior to the fourteenth century, as we have seen, medievals tended to follow Aristotle in claiming that things are related by their accidents, and hence that relational situations typically involve not only pairs of substances, but pairs of monadic properties or accidents as well. As a result, one of the most pressing questions during this period concerns the precise nature of the accidents involved in relational situations. Reductive realists, as we have seen, identify them with ordinary, non-relational accidents such as quantities or qualities, whereas non-reductive realists identify them with monadic properties of a sui generis type.
With the advent of the fourteenth century, however, important changes begin to take place in the medieval discussion of relations. Philosophers and theologians continue, of course, to allow for situations in which substances are related by their accidents, and hence to worry about the precise nature of the accidents involved in these situations. But at this point there is a decided shift toward regarding such situations as exceptional. As we have seen, there was always strong theological pressure to allow for at least some departures from the Aristotelian paradigm. But what appears to have happened over time is that these departures come to seem less and less peculiar to medievals, and eventually the departures themselves provide the basis for a new analysis of relational situations -- one according to which substances are the items responsible for relating. Around this same time, moreover, Ockham and his followers, most notably John Buridan, institute another sort of change, namely, a shift away from a standard medieval semantic characterization of relations. Prior to the fourteenth century, philosophers and theologians typically assume that the term “relation” signifies whatever it is in a relational situation that does the relating -- though here again theological considerations force them to allow for certain exceptions. By the time of Ockham, however, we get a complete break with this standard characterization. Thus, whereas earlier philosophers and theologians would allow the term “relation” to signify a being of reason in certain cases, such as creation, Ockham and his followers maintain that “relation” is a term of second intention, and so strictly speaking always signifies beings of reason. With Ockham, therefore, we have not only a complete severing of the connection between relations and those items in relational situations that actually do the relating, but also the advent of a new -- and, I might add, fairly harmless -- form of anti-realism.
In the end, therefore, I think it is fair to say that the fourteenth century marks a shifting of medieval paradigms both with respect to the proper analysis of relational situations and with respect to the proper characterization of relations. I hasten to add, however, that these shifts cannot be fully explained in terms of developments within the medieval discussion of relations, but are instead part-and-parcel of broader theoretical shifts in medieval accounts of the relationship between mind, language, and reality -- shifts which are closely associated with the rise of late-medieval nominalism generally.
[Note: This bibliography contains only items referred to in the notes and a few other selected items of interest. Further discussion of medieval theories of relations, as well as further bibliographical references, can be found in Henninger 1989, Olson 1987, and Weinberg 1965. For a contemporary defense of the view I have been calling “realism without polyadic properties”, see Campbell 1990 and Fisk 1973.]