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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Quantum Logic and Quantum Probability


1. A few qualifications are in order already: In a more general formulation, one considers the lattice of projections of a von Neumann algebra. Only in the context of non-relativistic quantum mechanics, and then only absent superselection rules, is this algebra a type I factor. For the expository purposes of this paper, we restrict our discussion to this context.

2. Throughout this paper, I use the term "logic" rather narrowly to refer to the algebraic and order-theoretic aspect of propositional logic. There exists a substantial technical literature devoted to non-classical formal deductive systems that are intended to stand to quantum propositional logics rather as classical deductive systems stand to Boolean algebras. A good reference for this material is Kalmbach [1983].

3. It is important to note here that even in classical mechanics, only subsets of the state-space that are measurable (in the sense of measure theory) are regarded as representing observable properties of the system, and only these are assigned probabilities. The difference is that in the classical case, the observable properties form a sub-Boolean algebra of the power set of S, while in the quantum case, they do not.

4. The first explicit formulation of this interpretation seems to have been given by Jauch and Piron [1969].

5. So-called modal interpretations of quantum mechanics do not attempt to assign actual values (or ranges of values) to all observables. Rather, they identify (in various different ways) a privileged observable or class of observables as having "definite values", and thereby avoid the various no-go theorems for hidden variables. For references and further details, see the entry on modal interpretations of Quantum Mechanics.

6. Of course, another possible response to such a question is to dismiss it, perhaps with the observation that mathematical models of natural phenomena evolve, more or less organically, to fit the facts, and require no a priori justification. Or, to put it differently, we can insist that quantum logic has the structure that it does just because the world has that structure.

7. These include, besides Mackey's original formalism, that of Piron [1976], the approach based on partial Boolean algebras of Kochen and Specker [1965, 1967], and various approaches emphasizing the convex structure of the set of (statistical) states of a system, e.g., [Holevo 1982, Ludwig 1983, Pitowsky 1989].

8. Even at this point, a couple of remarks are in order. First, notice that E need not be the set of outcomes of any humanly executable, let alone repeatable, measurement or experiment. Any exhaustive set of mutually exclusive alternatives will serve, at least as long as some sense can be attached to the terms “occurrence” and "realization" (even as terms of art). Secondly, notice that every standard interpretation of probability theory, whether relative-frequentist, propensity, subjective or what-have-you, represents probability weights mathematically in the same way.  Thus, the framework just sketched is agnostic among these interpretations.

9. It is worth remarking that all approaches to a generalized probability theory contain some mechanism for identifying outcomes of distinct measurements or values of distinct observables, though this mechanism varies from author to author . The most common approaches are to identify outcomes that are equi-probable in every state (as in the work of Mackey), or to identify outcomes that are certain (i.e., have probability 1) in exactly the same states (as in the work of Piron). Both of these prescriptions become problematic in the context of sequential measurements --- see, e.g., [Cooke and Hilgevoord, 1979]. The Foulis-Randall theory has the advantage of remaining neutral as to the precise mechanism whereby outcomes are identified.

10. The approach taken here is modeled on, but somewhat less general than, that of Foulis, Piron and Randall [1983]. See also [Foulis and Randall, 1987]

11. Indeed, the pair (S, F) is an adjunction between (X) and () -- that is, for any () and any J (X), we have S() J if and only if F(J). It follows that the mappings

F(S()) and J S(F(J))

are respectively a closure operator on () and an interior operator on (X). The collection of closed subsets of and the collection of open subsets of X (which are exactly the ranges of the mappings F and S) are complete lattices, closed under intersection and union respectively, and are mapped isomorphically onto one another by S and F. (See Supplement 2 for further details.)

12. In the case where is a convex set of states the closed subsets of are faces of ; that is, F(J) is itself convex, and if a convex combination of states lies in F(J), then those states themselves lie in F(J). The faces of any convex set , ordered by inclusion, form a complete lattice, closed under intersection. Thus, in this context, the property lattice is a complete sublattice of the face lattice of the state-space. This is the starting point for a number of approaches to generalized probability theory. Note that if is a simplex, as it is for classical models, then the face lattice of is a Boolean algebra.

13. This condition fails for the projection lattice modeling a quantum-mechanical system with superselection rules, but continues to hold for the lattices associated with each superselection sector.

14. The first such examples were obtained by H. Keller. Recently, M. P. Soler has shown that if a generalized Hilbert space contains any infinite orthonormal set, it must in fact be a classical Hilbert space --- i.e., the division ring D must be the field of real numbers, the field of complex numbers, or the ring of quaternions. See Holland [1995] for references and further discussion.

15. For a development of this idea in a more general context, see Wilce [2000].

16. Interesting recent work of Mayers [1999] and Clifton and Kent [2000] shows that the quantum test space F(H) contains a dense semi-classical sub-test space. A detailed hidden-variables model along these lines has not been seriously entertained (and would presumably be otherwise problematic), but these results do suggest that experiments having finite precision can not rule out non-contextual hidden variables.

Copyright © 2002
Alexander Wilce

Notes to Quantum Logic and Probability Theory
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy