This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. 
version 
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

last substantive content change

The dynamics and the postulate of collapse are flatly in contradiction with one another ... the postulate of collapse seems to be right about what happens when we make measurements, and the dynamics seems to be bizarrely wrong about what happens when we make measurements, and yet the dynamics seems to be right about what happens whenever we aren't making measurements. (Albert 1992, 79)This has come to be known as "the measurement problem" and in what follows, we study the details and examine some of the implications of this problem.
The measurement problem is not just an interpretational problem internal to QM. It raises broader issues as well, such more general philosophical debates between, on the one hand, Cartesian and Lockean accounts of observation as the creation of "inner reflections" and, on the other, neoKantean conceptions of observation as a quasiexternalized physiological process. In this article I trace the history of these debates, and indicate some of the interpretative strategies that they stimulated.
(P) If a quantity Q is measured in system S at time t then Q has a particular value in S at t.^{[1]}
But, instead of taking the dependence of properties upon experimental conditions to be causal in nature, he proposed an analogy with the dependence of relations of simultaneity upon frames of reference postulated by special relativity theory: "The theory of relativity reminds us of the subjective [observer dependent] character of all physical phenomena, a character which depends essentially upon the state of motion of the observer" (Bohr 1929, 73). In general terms, then, Bohr proposed that, like temporal relations in special relativity, properties in QM exhibit a hidden relationalism  "hidden", that is, from a classical, Newtonian point of view. Paul Feyerabend gave a clear exposition of this Bohrian position in his "Problems of Microphysics" essay (Feyerabend, 1962). It can also be found in earlier commentaries upon Bohr by Vladimir Fock and Philip Frank (Jammer 1974, section 6.5).
Many of Bohr's colleagues, including his young protege Werner Heisenberg, misunderstood or rejected the relationalist metaphysics underpinning Bohr's endorsement of (P). Instead, they favored the positivistic, antimetaphysical approach expressed in Heisenberg's influential book, The Physical Principles of the Quantum Theory (Heisenberg 1930): "It seems necessary to demand that no concept enter a theory which has not been experimentally verified at least to the same degree of accuracy as the experiments to be explained by the theory" (1).^{[2]} On this view, (P) may be strengthened to the principle (P):
(P) It is meaningless to assign Q a value q for S at t unless Q is measured to have value q for S at t.
Heisenberg's approach, as presented in The Physical Principles of the Quantum Theory, quickly became a popular way of reading (or misreading, as Bohr would claim) the philosophically more forbidding complexities of the Copenhagen interpretation. As Max Jammer points out: "It would be difficult to find a textbook of the period [19301950] which denied that the numerical value of a physical quantity has no meaning whatsoever until an observation has been performed" (Jammer 1974, 246).
Bohr disagreed with Heisenberg's extreme positivistic gloss of the Copenhagen interpretation that reduced questions of "definability to measurability" (Jammer 1974, 69). The disagreement was no casual matter. Heisenberg reports a discussion that arose while preparing his 1927 Zeitschrift für Physik paper in the following terms: "I remember that it ended with my breaking out in tears because I just couldn't stand this pressure from Bohr" (Jammer 1974, 65). Nevertheless, the two men agreed in broad terms that ways of describing quantum systems depended upon experimental conditions. This agreement was sufficient to create at least the appearance of a unified Copenhagen position.^{[3]}
The assumptions that framed the BohrHeisenberg interpretation were, in turn, rejected by Albert Einstein (Jammer 1974, chap.5; see too Bohr 1949). Einstein's disagreement with the Copenhagen school came to a head in the famous exchange with Bohr at the fifth Solvay conference (1927) and in the no less famous Einstein, Podolski, Rosen paper of 1935. Arguing from what might be called a "realist" position, Einstein contended that under ideal conditions observations (and measurements more generally) function like "mirrors" (or, as Crary argues, camera obscura) reflecting an independently existing reality (Crary 1995, 48). In particular, in the Einstein, Podolski, Rosen paper, we find the following criterion for the existence of physical reality: "If without in any way disturbing a system we can predict with certainty...the value of a physical quantity, then there exists an element of physical reality corresponding to this physical quantity" (Einstein et al 1935, 778). This criterion characterizes physical reality in terms of objectivity, meaning its independence from any direct measurement. By implication, then, when a direct measurement of physical reality occurs it merely passively reflects rather than actively constituting that which is observed.
Einstein's position has roots in Cartesian as well as empiricist, and specifically Lockean, notions of perception. This realist position opposes the Kantian metaphor of the "veil of perception" that pictures the apparatus of observation as like a pair of spectacles through which a highly mediated sight of the world can be glimpsed. To be specific, according to Kant, rather than simply reflecting an independently existing reality, "appearances" are constituted through the act of perception in a way that conforms them to the fundamental categories of sensible intuition. As Kant made the point in the Transcendental Aesthetic: "Not only are the drops of rain mere appearances, but...even their round shape, and even the space in which they fall, are nothing in themselves, but merely modifications of fundamental forms of our sensible intuition, and...the transcendental object remains unknown to us" (Kant 1973, 85).
By contrast, the realism that I am associating with Einstein takes the point of view that, insofar as they are real, when we observe rain drops under ideal conditions we are seeing objects "in themselves", that is, as they exist independently of being perceived. In other words, not only do the rain drops exist independently of our observations but also, in observing them, what we see reflects how they really are. In William Blake's succinct formulation, "As the eye [sees], such the object [is]" (Crary 1995, 70). According to this "realist" point of view, ideal observations not only reflect the way things are during but also immediately before and after observation.^{[4]}
Such realism was opposed by both Bohr and Heisenberg.^{[5]} Bohr took a position that, by taking acts of observation and measurement more generally as constitutive of phenomena, aligned him more closely with a Kantian point of view. To be specific, Bohr took it that "measurement has an essential [by which I take him to mean constitutive] influence on the conditions on which the very definition of the physical quantities in question rests" (Bohr 1935, 1025).
As Henry Folse points out, however, it is misleading to take the parallel between Bohr and Kant too far (Folse 1985, 49 and 217221). Bohr strongly opposed the Kantian position that "space and time as well as cause and effect had to be taken as a priori categories for the comprehension of all knowledge" (Folse 1985, 218). This opposition between Bohr and Kant reflected a deeper division. Whereas for Kant "concepts played their role prior to experience and give form to what is experienced" (Folse, 220), for Bohr it was the other way around, that is, objective reality, in particular conditions of observation, determine the applicability of concepts. Thus, although for Bohr no less than for Kant, observation took on a role in determining the forms that structure the world of visible objects, the two men conceived the way in which that role is discharged quite differently. For Kant subjective experience was structured in terms of certain prior forms, whereas Bohr argued for a hidden relationalism in the domain of appearances, contending that the properties in terms of which a system is described are relative to the conditions of measurement.
This difference between Bohr and Kant may be seen as an aspect, indeed radicalization, of a more general shift in nineteenth century conceptions of vision, exemplified in Johannes Müller's compendious summary of current physiology, Handbuch der Physiologie des Menschen (1833). Müller (a mentor of the influential physicist Hermann von Helmholtz) may be seen as physiologizing the Kantian conception of observation. As Jonathon Crary makes the point:
His [Müller's] work, in spite of his praise of Kant, implies something quite different. Far from being apodictic or universal in nature, like the ‘spectacles’ of time and space, our physiological apparatus is again and again shown to be defective, inconsistent, prey to illusion, and, in a crucial manner, susceptible to external procedures of manipulation and stimulation that have the essential capacity to produce experience for the subject.(Crary 1995, 92)Crary implies here that during the nineteenth century observation, and specifically vision, were both reconceptualized not as a Kantian universal faculty but rather as physiological processes. In particular, it was assumed that observable phenomena were conditioned, not by universal forms of sensible intuition, but rather by the sorts of external physical factors that affected bodily and specifically physiological processes in general.
Bohr extended the nineteenth century concept by proposing that the "external procedures" that influence vision affect not only how we see but also the scientific concepts in terms of which what we see should be described. Even more radically, Bohr proposed that the "external procedures" that affect sensible intuitions include the processes of observation themselves. Thus Bohr stood at the end of a long historical trajectory. Both Kant and Descartes conceived the apparatus of observation as an inner mental faculty, analogous to a pair of spectacles (Kant) or a camera obscura (Descartes) mobilizing the perceptions of some inner Eye. In the nineteenth century, vision was projected outwards, reconceived as a bodily, and specifically physiological process (Müller, Helmholtz, and Johann Friedrich Herbart, Kant's successor at Königsberg). Bohr, then, completed the process of externalization by severing observation from the body, including it as one among many "external procedures" that affect accounts of what we see.^{[6]}
Like Bohr, Heisenberg opposed Einstein's "realism". But whereas Bohr's opposition was rooted in a neoKantian relationalism that reversed Kant by externalizing the inner mental faculties, Heisenberg opposed Einstein from a more straightforwardly positivistic standpoint that disagreed not only with Einstein but also with Bohr.^{[7]}
To be specific, Heisenberg took as meaningless the sorts of metaphysical speculations about the "true nature of reality" that preoccupied both Einstein and Bohr, speculations that, according to Heisenberg, betrayed their metaphysical nature by divorcing questions of truth from more concrete issues of what is observed:
It is possible to ask whether there is still concealed behind the statistical universe of perception a ‘true’ universe in which the law of causality would be valid. But such speculation seems to us to be without value and meaningless, for physics must confine itself to the description of the relationship between perceptions.(Heisenberg 1927, 197)
Von Neumann also intervened decisively into the measurement problem. Summarizing earlier work, he argued that a measurement on a quantum system involves two distinct processes that may be thought of as temporally contiguous stages (417418).^{[8]} In the first stage, the measured quantum system S interacts with M, a macroscopic measuring apparatus for the physical quantity Q. This interaction is governed by the linear, deterministic Schrödinger equation, and is represented in the following terms: at time t, when the measurement begins, S, the measured system, is in a state represented by a Hilbert space vector f that, like any vector in the Hilbert space of possible state vectors, is decomposable into a weighted sum  a "linear superposition"  of the set of socalled "eigenvectors" {f_{i}} belonging to Q. In other words, f = c_{i}f_{i}, for some set {c_{i}} of complex numbers. f_{i}, the eigenvector of Q corresponding to possible value q_{i}, is that state of S at t for which, when S is in that state, there is unit probability that Q has value q_{i}.^{[9]} M, the measuring apparatus, is taken to be in a "ready" state g at time t when the measurement begins. According to the laws of QM, this entails that S+M at t is in the "tensor product" state c_{i}f_{i} g.
By applying the Schrödinger equation to this product state, we deduce that at time t, when the first stage of the measurement terminates, the state of S+M is c_{i}f_{i} g_{i}, where g_{i} is a state in which M registers the value q_{i}.^{[10]} Such states, represented by a linear combination of products of the form f_{i} g_{i}, have been dubbed "entangled states".^{[11]}
After the first stage of the measurement process, a second nonlinear, indeterministic process takes place, the "reduction of the wave packet", that involves S+M "jumping" (the famous "quantum leap") from the entangled state c_{i}f_{i} g_{i} into the state f_{i} g_{i} for some i. This, in turn (according to the laws of QM) means that S is in state f_{i} and M is in the state g_{i}, where g_{i}, it is assumed, is the state in which M registers the value q_{i}. Let t denote the time when this second and final stage of the measurement is finished.^{[12]} It follows that at t, when the measurement as a whole terminates, M registers the value q_{i}. Since the reduction of the wavepacket is indeterministic, there is no possibility of predicting which value M will register at t. We can conclude only that M will register some value.
The second stage of the measurement, with its radical, nonlinear discontinuities, was from its introduction the source of many of the philosophical difficulties that plagued QM, including what von Neumann referred to as its "peculiar dual nature" (417). As Schrödinger was moved to say during a visit to Bohr's institute during September 1926: "If all this damned quantum jumping [verdamnte Quantenspringerei] were really to stay, I should be sorry I ever got involved with quantum theory" (Jammer 1974, 57)
QM has nothing else definite to say about the measurement process. To be specific, from within the resources of QM there is no way of predicting what value of Q will be registered. QM does, however, give us some additional statistical information, via the so called Born statistical interpretation:
The probability of q_{i} being registered is c_{i}^{2}, where _{i} is the coefficient of f_{i} (the eigenvector of Q corresponding to value q_{i}) when the initial measured state of S is expressed as a linear superposition of eigenvectors of Q.In short, QM does not predict what the measured value will be but does at least tells us the probability distribution over various possible measured values.
The measurement problem was exacerbated by another paradox that arose in the context of the EinsteinBohr debate: what has come to be called the EPR (EinsteinPodolskiRosen) paradox (Einstein, Podolski, Rosen 1935). It should be stressed that in their original article EPR presented their argument as proof of the incompleteness rather than inconsistency of QM. Nevertheless, in the subsequent literature their argument quickly took on the role of a paradox, one that is most perspicuously presented in terms of the formalism developed by Bohm and Aharanov (Bohm and Aharanov 1957). Consider a pair of electrons S_{1}, S_{2} at time t when they are in a socalled singlet state, represented by the vector
{(f_{x+} g_{x}) + (f_{x} g_{x+})}/2,where f_{x+} and f_{x} represent the two possible eigenstates of the xdirected spin of S_{1} corresponding to the two possible spin values +1/2 and 1/2 respectively; g_{x} and g_{x+} represent the corresponding eigenstates for S_{2}. From the Born statistical interpretation it is easy to deduce that when S_{1}+S_{2} is in the singlet state, the xspin values of S_{1} and S_{2} are anticorrelated, that is, the conditional probability of measuring the xspin of S_{1} to have value +1/2 given that the xspin of S_{2} is measured to have value 1/2 is 1, and vise versa. It is also a theorem of QM that the linear decomposition of the singlet state vector is invariant under rotation and in particular invariant under interchange of x and y:
(f_{x+} g_{x}) + (f_{x} g_{x+}) = (f_{y+} g_{y}) + (f_{y} g_{y+})Now suppose that S_{1} and S_{2} have been allowed to drift out of each other's spheres of influence, so that a disturbance of S_{1} can have no simultaneous effect upon S_{2}. Suppose too that we measure the xspin of S_{1} just before t, and that the value revealed by measurement is +1/2. In that case, the anticorrelation between the xspin values for S_{1} and S_{2} makes it possible to predict with certainty that, in the event that the xspin of S_{2} is measured just before t, the value revealed by measurement is 1/2. The possibility of making this prediction means that the xspin measurement on S_{1} also counts as an xspin measurement on S_{2}, albeit an indirect measurement since it is carried out in a region of space remote from S_{2}. By applying the reduction of the wavepacket postulate to this indirect measurement, we conclude that, at time t immediately after the measurement, the state of S_{2} is g_{x}, the eigenvector of xspin for value 1/2.
But now assume that a second measurement has been carried out just before t, one that directly measures the spin of S_{2} in the y direction. There is no difficulty in simultaneously conducting both of these measurements since, because they take place in different regions of space, they cannot interfere with each other. By applying the reduction of the wavepacket postulate to this second measurement, we conclude that the state of S_{2} immediately postmeasurement is either g_{y} or g_{y+}, depending on whether the measured value for yspin is 1/2 or +1/2. Thus we arrive at a direct contradiction, since the state of S_{2} postmeasurement cannot be both g_{x} and one of g_{y} or g_{y+}. Here, then, lies the nub of the EPR paradox, showing that QM is inconsistent with the reduction of the wavepacket postulate. (In its original form the EPR argument merely showed that without the reduction of the wavepacket postulate, QM is incomplete.^{[13]})
It seems, then, that a solution to the measurement problem is within easy reach. We simply interpret the state of S when S+M is in the entangled state c_{i}f_{i} g_{i} as a new sort of "mixed" state in which there really is probability c_{i}^{2} that S is in the state f_{i}, for i = 1,2,.... The probability in question is not merely a subjective measure of ignorance (otherwise the state is really a pure state, as defined in the previous endnote) but instead is an "intrinsic" property of the system S, in particular, it may be thought of as an objective measure of a propensity of S at t to be in the state f_{i} (Jauch 1968, 173174). This, in turn, means that, already at the end of the first stage of the measurement, there is probability c_{i}^{2} that Q has value q_{i} in S (as above I am taking f_{i} as the eigenvector of Q corresponding to value q_{i}). By parity of reasoning, at the end of the first stage of the measurement, there is probability c_{i}^{2} of M being in state g_{i} and hence of registering the value q_{i} for Q. Thus, it seems, the "reduction of the wave packet" is redundant, since already at the end of the first stage measurement the measuring apparatus registers the appropriate possible values with probabilities in agreement with the Born statistical interpretation. As such, those paradoxes of QM, such as EPR and Schrödinger's cat, that depend upon the reduction of the wave packet simply disappear.^{[15]}
But a difficulty remains. The state of S+M at the end of measurement is still an entangled state for which, it seems, we cannot say that Q has value q_{i} with probability c_{i}^{2}. Indeed, from the perspective of that combined state, it seems that the value of Q is indeterminate, suspended between the various possible values q_{1}, q_{2}, and so on. More seriously, it seems that the measuring apparatus suffers from a similar indeterminacy: that is, it is indeterminate which value it registers. In short, it seems that, from the point of view of the combined measuring and measured system, Schrödinger's cat paradox (although not his cat) survives unscathed.^{[16]}
The Italian School of Daneri, Loinger, Prosperi, et al responded to this problem by advancing what has come to be called a "phase wash out" theory (Daneri, Loinger and Prosperi 1962). They showed that in virtue of statistical thermodynamic features of the measuring apparatus, the state of S+M at t (the end of the first stage of measurement) approximates a mixed state  also called the "reduced state"  in which there is probability c_{i}^{2} that S+M is in the state represented by the product vector f_{i} g_{i}, for all the various i = 1,2,..... In this reduced state the nagging indeterminacy effects vanish.
A serious difficulty remains, however. It may well be true that S+M is approximately in a mixed state. But this does not solve the cat paradox. That is, although it may be true that to a good approximation Schrödinger's cat is either dead or alive, the air of paradox remains if, when we examine in detail the microcorrelations between the measured and measuring systems, we see that the cat is in a zombie like deadandalive state.
The "phase wash out" approach and Jauch's approach more generally suffer another drawback, one they share with hidden variable interpretations of QM (for a discussion of the latter interpretations, see Belinfante 1973). In the special situation described by the EPR paradox, for which the density operator of the measured system is an identity operator, these interpretations assign determinate values to all physical quantities for a particular quantum system.^{[17]} Thus they fall prey to a new generation of paradoxes that depend upon Gleason's theorem and the related Kochen and Specker theorem.^{[18]}
The paradoxes and questions raised by the measurement problem have spawned a host of interpretations of QM, including hidden variable theories that continue Einstein's search for a "complete" account of physical reality, and the EverettWheeler "many worlds interpretation" (Wheeler and Zureck 1983, II.3 and III.3; Bell 1987, chapters 4 and 20). Most physicists bypass these philosophical resolutions of the interpretative difficulties of QM, and revert instead to some version of the Bohr interpretation. Often that version is related closely to the early Heisenberg's positivistic, antimetaphysical approach. It is as if the long history of failure to resolve the acrimonious disputes surrounding the interpretation of QM has led quantum physicists to become disenchanted with the garden of metaphysical delights. As John S. Bell has made the point, despite more than seventy years of interpreting QM and resolving the measurement problem, the Bohr interpretation in its more pragmatic, less metaphysical forms remains the "working philosophy" for the average physicist (Bell 1987, 189).^{[19]}
Henry Krips krips+@pitt.edu 