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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
The possibility that the physical content of an empirically successful physical theory could be debated should not surprise: examples abound in the history of science. For instance, the great scientific revolution was fueled by the grand debate on whether the effectiveness of the Copernican system could be taken as an indication that the Earth was not in fact at the center of the universe. In more recent times, Einstein's celebrated first major theoretical success, special relativity, consisted to a large extent just in understanding the physical meaning (simultaneity is relative) of an already existing effective mathematical formalism (the Lorentz transformations). In these cases, as in the case of quantum mechanics, a very strictly empiricist position could have circumvented the problem altogether, by reducing the content of the theory to a list of predicted numbers. But perhaps science can offer us more than such a list; and certainly science needs more than such a list to find its ways.
The difficulty in the interpretation of quantum mechanics derives from the fact that the theory was first constructed for describing microscopic systems (atoms, electrons, photons) and the way these interact with macroscopic apparatuses built to measure their properties. Such interactions are denoted as "measurements". The theory consists in a mathematical formalism, which allows probabilities of alternative outcomes of such measurements to be calculated. If used just for this purpose, the theory raises no difficulty. But we expect the macroscopic apparatuses themselves — in fact, any physical system in the world — to obey quantum theory, and this seems to raise contradictions in the theory.
The problem of the interpretation of quantum mechanics takes then different forms, depending on the relative ontological weight we choose to assign to the wave function Ψ or, respectively, to the sequence of the measurement outcomes q, q′, q″, …. If we take Ψ as the "real" entity which fully represents the actual state of affairs of the world, we encounter a number of difficulties. First, we have to understand how Ψ can change suddenly in the course of a measurement: if we describe the evolution of two interacting quantum systems in terms of the Schrödinger equation, no collapse happens. Furthermore, the collapse, seen as a physical process, seems to depend on arbitrary choices in our description and shows a disturbing amount of nonlocality. But even if we can circumvent the collapse problem, the more serious difficulty of this point of view is that it appears to be impossible to understand how specific observed values q, q′, q″, … can emerge from the same Ψ. A better alternative is to take the observed values q, q′, q″, … as the actual elements of reality, and view Ψ just as a bookkeeping device, determined by the actual values q, q′, q″, … that happened in past. From this perspective, the real events of the world are the "realization" (the "coming to reality", the "actualization") of the values q, q′, q″, … in the course of the interaction between physical systems. This actualization of a variable q in the course of an interaction can be denoted as the quantum event q. An exemple of a quantum event is the detection of an electron in a certain position. The position variable of the electron assumes a determined value in the course of the interaction between the electron and an external system and the quantum event is the "manifestation" of the electron in a certain position. Quantum events have an intrinsically discrete ("quantized") granular structure.
The difficulty of this second option is that if we take the quantum nature of all physical systems into account, the statement that a certain specific event q "has happened" (or, equivalently that a certain variable has or has not taken the value q) can be true and not-true at the same time. To clarify this key point, consider the case in which a system S interacts with another system (an apparatus) O, and exhibits a value q of one of its variables. Assume that the system O obeys the laws of quantum theory as well, and use the quantum theory of the combined system formed by O and S in order to predict the way this combined system can later interact with a third system O′. Then quantum mechanics forbids us to assume that q has happened. Indeed, as far as its later behavior is concerned, the combined system S+O may very well be in a quantum superposition of alternative possible values q, q′, q″, …. This "second observer" situation captures the core conceptual difficulty of the interpretation of quantum mechanics: reconciling the possibility of quantum superposition with the fact that the observed world is characterized by uniquely determined events q, q′, q″, …. More precisely, it shows that we cannot disentangle the two: according to the theory an observed quantity (q) can be at the same time determined and not determined. An event may have happened and at the same time may not have happened.
This relativisation of actuality is viable thanks to a remarkable property of the formalism of quantum mechanics. John von Neumann was the first to notice that the formalism of the theory treats the measured system (S ) and the measuring system (O) differently, but the theory is surprisingly flexible on the choice of where to put the boundary between the two. Different choices give different accounts of the state of the world (for instance, the collapse of the wave function happens at different times); but this does not affect the predictions on the final observations. Von Neumann only described a rather special situation, but this flexibility reflects a general structural property of quantum theory, which guarantees the consistency among all the distinct "accounts of the world" of the different observing systems. The manner in which this consistency is realized, however, is subtle.
What appears with respect to O as a measurement of the variable q (with a specific outcome), appears with respect to O′ simply as the establishing of a correlation between S and O (without any specific outcome). As far as the observer O is concerned, a quantum event has happened and a property q of a system S has taken a certain value. As far as the second observer O′ is concerned, the only relevant element of reality is that a correlation is established between S and O. This correlation will manifest itself only in any further observation that O′ would perform on the S+O system. Up to the time in which it physically interacts with S+O, the system O′ has no access to the actual outcomes of the measurements performed by O on S . This actual outcome is real only with respect to O (Rovelli 1996, pp. 1650-52). Consider for instance a two-state system O (say, a light-emitting diode, or l.e.d., which can be on or off) interacting with a two-state system S (say, the spin of an electron, which can be up or down). Assume the interaction is such that if the spin is up (down) the l.e.d. goes on (off). To start with, the electron can be in a superposition of its two states. In the account of the state of the electron that we can associate with the l.e.d., a quantum event happens in the interaction, the wave function of the electron collapses to one of two states, and the l.e.d. is then either on or off. But we can also consider the l.e.d./electron composite system as a quantum system and study the interactions of this composite system with another system O′. In the account associated to O′, there is no event and no collapse at the time of the interaction, and the composite system is still in the superposition of the two states [spin up/l.e.d. on] and [spin down/l.e.d. off] after the interaction. It is necessary to assume this superposition because it accounts for measurable interference effects between the two states: if quantum mechanics is correct, these interference effects are truly observable by O′. So, we have two discordant accounts of the same events. Can the two discord accounts be compared and does the comparison lead to contradiction? They can be compared, because the information on the first account is stored in the state of the l.e.d. and O′ has access to this information. Therefore O and O′ can compare their accounts of the state of the world.
However, the comparison does not lead to contradiction because the comparison is itself a physical process that must be understood in the context of quantum mechanics. Indeed, O′ can physically interact with the electron and then with the l.e.d. (or, equivalently, the other way around). If, for instance, he finds the spin of the electron up, quantum mechanics predicts that he will then consistently find the l.e.d. on (because in the first measurement the state of the composite system collapses on its [spin up/l.e.d. on] component). That is, the multiplicity of accounts leads to no contradiction precisely because the comparison between different accounts can only be a physical quantum interaction. This internal self-consistency of the quantum formalism is general, and it is perhaps its most remarkable aspect. This self consistency is taken in relational quantum mechanics as a strong indication of the relational nature of the world.
In fact, one may conjecture that this peculiar consistency between the observations of different observers is the missing ingredient for a reconstruction theorem of the Hilbert space formalism of quantum theory. Such a reconstruction theorem is still unavailable: On the basis of reasonable physical assumptions, one is able to derive the structure of an orthomodular lattice containing subsets that form Boolean algebras, which "almost", but not quite, implies the existence of a Hilbert space and its projectors' algebra (see the entry Quantum Logic and Quantum Probability.) Perhaps an appropriate algebraic formulation of the condition of consistency between subsystems could provide the missing hypothesis to complete the reconstruction theorem.
From a relational point of view, the properties of a system exists only in reference to another system. What about the properties of a system with respect to itself? Can a system measure itself? Is there any meaning of the correlations of a system with itself? Implicit in the relational point of view is the intuition that a complete self-measurement is impossible. It is this impossibility that forces all properties to be referred to another system. The issue of the self-measurement has been analyzed in details in two remarkable works, from very different perspectives, but with similar conclusions, by Marisa Dalla Chiara and by Thomas Breuer.
Marisa Dalla Chiara (1977) has addressed the logical aspect of the measurement problem. She observes that the problem of self-measurement in quantum mechanics is strictly related to the self-reference problem, which has an old tradition in logic. From a logical point of view the measurement problem of quantum mechanics can be described as a characteristic question of "semantical closure" of a theory. To what extent can quantum mechanics apply consistently to the objects and the concepts in terms of which its metatheory is expressed? Dalla Chiara shows that the duality in the description of state evolution, encoded in the ordinary (i.e. von Neumann's) approach to the measurement problem, can be given a purely logical interpretation: "If the apparatus observer O is an object of the theory, then O cannot realize the reduction of the wave function. This is possible only to another O′, which is ‘external’ with respect to the universe of the theory. In other words, any apparatus, as a particular physical system, can be an object of the theory. Nevertheless, any apparatus which realizes the reduction of the wave function is necessarily only a metatheoretical object " (Dalla Chiara 1977, p. 340). This observation is remarkably consistent with the way in which the state vector reduction is justified within the relational interpretation of quantum mechanics. When the system S+O is considered from the point of view of O′, the measurement can be seen as an interaction whose dynamics is fully unitary, whereas by the point of view of O the measurement breaks the unitarity of the evolution of S. The unitary evolution does not break down through mysterious physical jumps, due to unknown effects, but simply because O is not giving a full dynamical description of the interaction. O cannot have a full description of the interaction of S with himself (O), because his information is correlation information and there is no meaning in being correlated with oneself. If we include the observer into the system, then the evolution is still unitary, but we are now dealing with the description of a different observer.
As is well known, from a purely logical point of view self-reference properties in formal systems impose limitations on the descriptive power of the systems themselves. Thomas Breuer has shown that, from a physical point of view, this feature is expressed by the existence of limitations in the universal validity of physical theories, no matter whether classical or quantum (Breuer 1995). Breuer studies the possibility for an apparatus O to measure its own state. More precisely, of measuring the state of a system containing an apparatus O. He defines a map from the space of all sets of states of the apparatus to the space of all sets of states of the system. Such a map assigns to every set of apparatus states the set of system states that is compatible with the information that — after the measurement interaction — the apparatus is in one of these states. Under reasonable assumptions on this map, Breuer is able to prove a theorem stating that no such map can exist that can distinguish all the states of the system. An apparatus O cannot distinguish all the states of a system S containing O. This conclusion holds irrespective of the classical or quantum nature of the systems involved, but in the quantum context it implies that no quantum mechanical apparatus can measure all the quantum correlations between itself and an external system. These correlations are only measurable by a second external apparatus, observing both the system and the first apparatus.
A relational view of quantum mechanics has been proposed also by Gyula Bene (1997). Bene argues that quantum states are relative in the sense that they express a relation between a system to be described and a different system, containing the former as a subsystem and acting for it as a quantum reference system (here the system is contained in the reference system, while in Breuer's work the system contains the apparatus). Consider again a measuring system (O) that has become entangled with a measured system (S ) during a measurement. Once again, the difficulty of quantum theory is that there is an apparent contradiction between the fact that the quantity q of the system assumes an observed value in the measurement, while the composite S+O system still has to be considered in a superposition state, if we want to properly predict the outcome of measurements on the S+O system. This apparent contradiction is resolved by Bene by relativizing the state not to an observer, as in the relational quantum mechanics sketched in Section 2, but rather to a relevant composite system. That is: there is a state of the system S relative to S alone, and a state of the system S relative to the S+O composite system. (Similarly, there is a state of the system O relative to itself alone, and a state of the system O relative to the S+O ensemble.) The ensemble with respect to which the state is defined is called by Bene the quantum reference system . The state of a system with respect to a given quantum reference system correctly predicts the probability distributions of any measurement on the entire reference system. This dependence of the states of quantum systems from different quantum systems that act as reference systems is viewed as a fundamental property that holds no matter whether a system is observed or not.
Further approaches at least formally related to Kochen's have been proposed by Healey (1989), who also emphasises an interactive aspect of his approach, and by Dieks (1989). See also the entry on ’Modal Interpretations of Quantum Mechanics’.
However, it is different to say that something is relative to a system or that something is relative to a state of a system. Consider for instance the situation described in the example of Section 5: According to the relational interpretation, after the first measurement the quantity q has a given value and only one for O, while in Everettian terms the quantity q has a value for one state of O and a different value for another state of O, and the two are equally real. In Everett, there is an ontological multiplicity of realities, which is absent in the relational point of view, where physisical quantities are uniquely determined, once two systems are given.
The difference derives from a very general interpretational difference between Everettian accounts and the relational point of view. Everett (at least in its widespread version) takes the state Ψ as the basis of the ontology of quantum theory. The overall state Ψ includes different possible branches and different possible outcomes. On the other hand, the relational interpretation takes the quantum events q, that is, the actualizations of values of physical quantities, as the basic elements of reality (see Section 1.1 above) and such q's are assumed to be univocal. The relational view avoids the traditional difficulties in taking the q's as univocal simply by noticing that a q does not refer to a system, but rather to a pair of systems.
For a comparison between the relational interpretation and other current interpretations of quantum mechanics, see Rovelli 1996.
Also, the relational interpretation allows one to give a precise definition of the time (or, better, the probability distribution of the time) at which a measurement happens, in terms of the probability distribution of the correlation between system and apparatus, as measurable by a third observer (Rovelli 1998).
Finally, it has been suggested in (Rovelli 1997) that the relationalism at the core of quantum theory pointed out by the relational interpretations might be connected with the spatiotemporal relationalism that characterizes general relativity. Quantum mechanical relationalism is the observation that there are no absolute properties: properties of a system S are relative to another system O with which S is interacting. General relativistic relationalism is the well known observation that there is no absolute localization in spacetime: localization of an object S in spacetime is only relative to the gravitational field, or to any other object O, to which S is contiguous. There is a connection between the two, since interaction between S and O implies contiguity and contiguity between S and O can only be checked via some quantum interaction. However, because of the difficulty of developing a consistent and conceptually transparent theory of quantum gravity, so far this suggestion has not been developed beyond the stage of a simple intuition.
Werner Heisenberg first recognized that the electron does not have a well defined position when it is not interacting. Relational interpretations push this intuition further, by stating that, even when interacting, the position of the electron is only determined in relation to a certain observer, or to a certain quantum reference system, or similar.
In physics, the move of deepening our insight into the physical world by relativizing notions previously used as absolute has been applied repeatedly and very successfully. Here are a few examples. The notion of the velocity of an object has been recognized as meaningless, unless it is indexed with a reference body with respect to which the object is moving. With special relativity, simultaneity of two distant events has been recognized as meaningless, unless referred to a specific state of motion of something. (This something is usually denoted as "the observer" without, of course, any implication that the observer is human or has any other peculiar property besides having a state of motion. Similarly, the "observer system" O in quantum mechanics need not to be human or have any other property beside the possibility of interacting with the "observed" system S.) With general relativity, the position in space and time of an object has been recognized as meaningless, unless it is referred to the gravitational field, or to some other dynamical physical entity. The move proposed by the relational interpretations of quantum mechanics has strong analogies with these, but is, in a sense, a longer jump, since all physical events and the entirety of the contingent properties of any physical system are taken to be meaningful only as relative to a second physical system. The claim of the relational interpretations is that this is not an arbitrary move. Rather, it is a conclusion which is difficult to escape, following from the observation — explained above in the example of the "second observer" — that a variable (of a system S) can have a well determined value q for one observer (O) and at the same time fail to have a determined value for another observer (O′).
This way of thinking the world has certainly heavy philosophical implications. The claim of the relational interpretations is that it is nature itself that is forcing us to this way of thinking. If we want to understand nature, our task is not to frame nature into our philosophical prejudices, but rather to learn how to adjust our philosophical prejudices to what we learn from nature.