|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
In its essentials, logicism was first advocated in the late seventeenth century by Gottfried Leibniz. Later, the idea was defended in greater detail by Gottlob Frege. During the critical movement initiated in the 1820s, mathematicians such as Bernard Bolzano, Niels Abel, Louis Cauchy and Karl Weierstrass succeeded in eliminating much of the vagueness and many of the contradictions present in the mathematical theories of their day. By the late 1800s, William Hamilton had also introduced ordered couples of reals as the first step in supplying a logical basis for the complex numbers. In much the same spirit, Karl Weierstrass, Richard Dedekind and Georg Cantor had also all developed methods for founding the irrationals in terms of the rationals. Using work by H.G. Grassmann and Richard Dedekind, Guiseppe Peano had then gone on to develop a theory of the rationals based on his now famous axioms for the natural numbers. Thus, by Frege's day, it was generally recognized that a large portion of mathematics could be derived from a relatively small set of primitive notions.
Even so, it was not until 1879, when Frege developed the necessary logical apparatus, that the project of logicism could be said to have become technically plausible. Following another five years' work, Frege arrived at the definitions necessary for logicising arithmetic and, during the 1890s, he worked on many of the essential derivations. However, with the discovery of paradoxes such as Russell's paradox at the turn of the century, it appeared that additional resources would need to be postulated if logicism were to succeed.
By 1903, both Whitehead and Russell had reached this same conclusion. By this time, both men were in the initial stages of preparing second volumes to earlier books on related topics: Whitehead's 1898 A Treatise on Universal Algebra and Russell's 1903 The Principles of Mathematics. Since their research overlapped considerably, they began collaborating on what would eventually become Principia Mathematica. By agreement, Russell worked primarily on the philosophical parts of the project (including the philosophically rich Introduction, the theory of descriptions, and the no-class theory), while the two men collaborated on the technical derivations. Intially, it was thought that the project might take a year to complete.
Unfortunately, after almost a decade of difficult work on the part of both men, Cambridge University Press concluded that publishing Principia would result in an estimated loss of approximately 600 pounds. Although the press agreed to assume half this amount and the Royal Society agreed to donate another 200 pounds, that still left a 100-pound deficit. Only by each contributing 50 pounds were the authors able to see their work through to publication.
Today there is not a major academic library anywhere in the world that does not possess a copy of this landmark publication.
Despite these criticisms, Principia Mathematica proved to be remarkably influential in at least three other ways. First, it popularized modern mathematical logic to an extent undreamt of by its authors. By using a notation superior in many ways to that of Frege, Whitehead and Russell managed to convey the remarkable expressive power of modern predicate logic in a way that previous writers had been unable to achieve. Second, by exhibiting so clearly the deductive power of the new logic, Whitehead and Russell were able to show how powerful the modern idea of a formal system could be, thus opening up new work in what was soon to be called metalogic. Third, Principia Mathematica reaffirmed clear and interesting connections between logicism and two main branches of traditional philosophy, namely metaphysics and epistemology, thus initiating new and interesting work in both these and other areas.
Thus, not only did Principia introduce a wide range of philosophically rich notions (such as propositional function, logical construction, and type theory), it also set the stage for the discovery of classical metatheoretic results (such as those of Kurt Gödel and others) and initiated a tradition of common technical work in fields as diverse as philosophy, mathematics, linguistics, economics and computer science.
Today there remains controversy over the ultimate substantive contribution of Principia, with some authors holding that, with the appropriate modifications, logicism remains a feasible project. Others hold that the philosophical and technical underpinnings of the Whitehead/Russell project simply remain too weak or confused to be of much use to the logicist. Interested readers are encouraged to consult Hale and Wright (2001), Quine (1966a), Quine (1966b), Landini (1998) and Linsky (1999).
Volume 2 begins with a "Prefatory Statement of Symbolic Conventions." It then continues with Part III, entitled "Cardinal Arithmetic," which itself contains sections on "Definition and Logical Properties of Cardinal Numbers," "Addition, Multiplication and Exponentiation," and "Finite and Infinite"; Part IV, entitled Relation-Arithmetic," which contains sections on "Ordinal Similarity and Relation-Numbers," "Addition of Relations, and the Product of Two Relations," "The Principle of First Differences, and the Multiplication and Exponentiation of Relations," and "Arithmetic of Relation-Numbers"; and the first half of Part V, entitled "Series," which contains sections on "General Theory of Series," "On Sections, Segments, Stretches, and Derivatives," and "On Convergence, and the Limits of Functions."
Volume 3 continues Part V with sections on "Well-Ordered Series," "Finite and Infinite Series and Ordinals," and "Compact Series, Rational Series, and Continuous Series." It also contains Part VI, entitled "Quantity," which itself contains sections on "Generalization of Number," "Vector-Families," "Measurement," and "Cyclic Families."
A fourth volume was planned but never completed.
Contemporary readers (i.e., those who have learned logic in the second half of the twentieth century or later) will find the book's notation somewhat antiquated and clumsy. Even so, the book remains one of the great scientific documents of the twentieth century.
|A. D. Irvine