|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Plotinus (204/5 -- 270 C.E.), is generally regarded as the founder of Neoplatonism. He is one of the most influential philosophers in antiquity after Plato and Aristotle. The term ‘Neoplatonism’ is an invention of early 19th century European scholarship and indicates the penchant of historians for dividing ‘periods’ in history. In this case, the term was intended to indicate that Plotinus initiated a new phase in the development of the Platonic tradition. What this ‘newness’ amounted to, if anything, is controversial, largely because one’s assessment of it depends upon one's assessment of what Platonism is. In fact, Plotinus (like all his successors) regarded himself simply as a Platonist, that is, as an expositor and defender of the philosophical position whose greatest exponent was Plato himself. Originality was thus not held as a premium by Plotinus. Nevertheless, Plotinus realized that Plato needed to be interpreted. In addition, between Plato and himself, Plotinus found roughly 600 years of philosophical writing, much of it reflecting engagement with Plato and the tradition of philosophy he initiated. Consequently, there were at least two avenues for originality open to Plotinus, even if it was not his intention to say fundamentally new things. The first was in trying to say what Plato meant on the basis of what he wrote or said or what others reported him to have said. This was the task of exploring the philosophical position that we happen to call ‘Platonism’. The second was in defending Plato against those who, Plotinus thought, had misunderstood him and therefore unfairly criticized him. Plotinus found himself, especially as a teacher, taking up these two avenues. His originality must be sought for by following his path.
Owing to the unusually fulsome biography by Plotinus' disciple Porphyry, we know more about Plotinus' life than we do about most ancient philosophers'. The main facts are these.
Plotinus was born in Lycopolis, Egypt in 204 or 205 C.E. When he was 28, a growing interest in philosophy led him to the feet of one Ammonius Saccas in Alexandria. After ten or eleven years with this obscure though evidently dominating figure, Plotinus was moved to study Persian and Indian philosophy. In order to do so, he attached himself to the military expedition of Emperor Gordian III to Persia in 243. The expedition was aborted when Gordian was assassinated by his troops. Plotinus thereupon seems to have abandoned his plans, making his way to Rome in 245. There he remained until his death in 270 or 271.
Porphyry informs us that during the first ten years of his time in Rome, Plotinus lectured exclusively on the philosophy of Ammonius. During this time he also wrote nothing. Porphyry tells us that when he himself arrived in Rome in 263, the first 21 of Plotinus' treatises had already been written. The remainder of the 54 treatises constituting his Enneads were written in the last seven or eight years of his life.
Porphyry's biography reveals a man at once otherworldly and deeply practical. The former is hardly surprising in a philosopher but the latter deserves to be noted and is impressively indicated by the fact that a number of Plotinus' acquaintances appointed him as guardian to their children when they died.
Plotinus' writings were edited by Porphyry (there was perhaps another edition by Plotinus' physician, Eustochius, though all traces of it are lost). It is to Porphyry that we owe the somewhat artificial division of the writings into six groups of nine (hence the name Enneads from the Greek word for ‘nine’). In fact, there are somewhat fewer than 54 (Porphyry artificially divided some of them into separately numbered ‘treatises’), and the actual number of these is of no significance. The arrangement of the treatises is also owing to Porphyry and does evince an ordering principle. Ennead I contains, roughly, ethical discussions; Enneads II-III contain discussions of natural philosophy and cosmology (though III 4, 5, 7, 8 do not fit into this rubric so easily); Ennead IV is devoted to matters of psychology; Ennead V, to epistemological matters, especially the intellect; and Ennead VI, to numbers, being in general, and the One above intellect, the first principle of all. It is to be emphasized that the ordering is Porphyry's. The actual chronological ordering, which Porphyry also provides for us, does not correspond at all to the ordering in the edition. For example, Ennead I 1 is the 53rd treatise chronologically, one of the last things Plotinus wrote.
These works vary in size from a couple of pages to over a hundred. They seem to be occasional writings in the sense that they constitute written responses by Plotinus to questions and problems raised in his regular seminars. Sometimes these questions and problems guide the entire discussion, so that it is sometimes difficult to tell when Plotinus is writing in his own voice or expressing the views of someone else. Typically, Plotinus would at his seminars have read out passages from Platonic or Aristotelian commentators, it being assumed that the members of the seminar were already familiar with the primary texts. Then a discussion of the text along with the problems it raised occurred.
One must not suppose that the study of Aristotle at these seminars belonged to a separate ‘course’ on the great successor of Plato. After Plotinus, in fact Aristotle was studied on his own as preparation for studying Plato. But with Plotinus, Aristotle, it seems, was assumed to be himself one of the most effective expositors of Plato. Studying both Aristotle's own philosophy as explained by commentators such as Alexander of Aphrodisias (2nd -- early 3rd c. C.E.) and his explicit objections to Plato was a powerful aid in understanding the master's philosophy. In part, this was owing to the fact that Aristotle was assumed to know Plato's philosophy at first hand and to have recorded it, including Plato's ‘unwritten teachings’. In addition, later Greek historians of philosophy tell us that Plotinus' teacher, Ammonius Saccas, was among those Platonists who assumed that in some sense Aristotle's philosophy was in harmony with Platonism. This harmony did not preclude disagreements between Aristotle and Plato. Nor did it serve to prevent misunderstandings of Platonism on Aristotle's part. Nevertheless, Plotinus' wholesale adoption of many Aristotelian arguments and distinctions will seem less puzzling when we realize that he took these both as compatible with Platonism and as useful for articulating the Platonic position, especially in areas in which Plato was himself not explicit.
The three basic principles of Plotinus' metaphysics are called by him ‘the One’ (or, equivalently, ‘the Good’), Intellect, and Soul (see V 1; V 9.). These principles are both ultimate ontological realities and explanatory principles. Plotinus believed that they were recognized by Plato as such, as well as by the entire subsequent Platonic tradition.
The One is the absolutely simple first principle of all. It is both ‘self-caused’ and the cause of being for everything else in the universe. There are, according to Plotinus, various ways of showing the necessity of positing such a principle. These are all rooted in the Pre-Socratic philosophical/scientific tradition. A central axiom of that tradition was the connecting of explanation with reductionism or the derivation of the complex from the simple. That is, ultimate explanations of phenomena and of contingent entities can only rest in what itself requires no explanation. If what is actually sought is the explanation for something that is in one way or another complex, what grounds the explanation will be simple relative to the observed complexity. Thus, what grounds an explanation must be different from the sorts of things explained by it. According to this line of reasoning, explanantia that are themselves complex, perhaps in some way different from the sort of complexity of the explananda, will be in need of other types of explanation. In addition, a plethora of explanatory principles will themselves be in need of explanation. Taken to its logical conclusion, the explanatory path must finally lead to that which is unique and absolutely uncomplex.
The One is such a principle. Plotinus found it in Plato's Republic where it is named ‘the Idea of the Good’ and in his Parmenides where it is the subject of a series of deductions (137c ff.). The One or the Good, owing to its simplicity, is indescribable directly. We can only grasp it indirectly by deducing what it is not (see V 3. 14; VI 8; VI 9. 3). Even the names ‘One’ and ‘Good’ are fautes de mieux. Therefore, it is wrong to see the One as a principle of oneness or goodness, in the sense in which these are intelligible attributes. The name ‘One’ is least inappropriate because it best suggests absolute simplicity.
If the One is absolutely simple, how can it be the cause of the being of anything much less the cause of everything? The One is such a cause in the sense that it is virtually everything else (see III 8. 1; V 1. 7, 9; V 3. 15, 33; VI 9. 5, 36). This means that it stands to everything else as, for example, white light stands to the colors of the rainbow, or the way in which a properly functioning calculator may be said to contain all the answers to the questions that can be legitimately put to it. Similarly, an omniscient simple deity may be said to know virtually all that is knowable. In general, if A is virtually B, then A is both simpler in its existence than B and able to produce B.
The causality of the One was frequently explained in antiquity as an answer to the question, ‘How do we derive a many from the One?’ Although the answer provided by Plotinus and by other Neoplatonists is sometimes expressed in the language of ‘emanation’, it is very easy to mistake this for what it is not. It is not intended to indicate either a temporal process or the unpacking or separating of a potentially complex unity. Rather, the derivation was understood in terms of atemporal ontological dependence.
The first derivation from the One is Intellect. Intellect is the locus of the full array of Platonic Forms, those eternal and immutable entities that account for or explain the possibility of intelligible predication. Plotinus assumes that without such Forms, there would be no non-arbitrary justification for saying that anything had one property rather than another. Whatever properties things have, they have owing to there being Forms whose instances these properties are. But that still leaves us with the very good question of why an eternal and immutable Intellect is necessarily postulated along with these Forms.
The historical answer to this question is in part that Plotinus assumed that he was following Plato who, in Timaeus (30c; cf. Philebus 22c), claimed that the Form of Intelligible Animal was eternally contemplated by an intellect called ‘the Demiurge’. This contemplation Plotinus interpreted as cognitive identity, since if the Demiurge were contemplating something outside of itself, what would be inside of itself would be only an image or representation of eternal reality (see V 5) -- and so, it would not actually know what it contemplates, as that is in itself. ‘Cognitive identity’ then means that when Intellect is thinking, it is thinking itself. Further, Plotinus believed that Aristotle, in book 12 of his Metaphysics and in book 3 of his De Anima supported both the eternality of Intellect (in Aristotle represented as the Unmoved Mover) and the idea that cognitive identity characterized its operation.
Philosophically, Plotinus argued that postulating Forms without a superordinate principle, the One, which is virtually what all the Forms are, would leave the Forms in eternal disunity. If this were the case, then there could be no necessary truth, for all necessary truths, e.g., 3 + 5 = 8, express a virtual identity, as indicated here by the ‘=’ sign. Consider the analogy of three-dimensionality and solidity. Why are these necessarily connected in a body such that there could not be a body that had one without the other? The answer is that body is virtually three-dimensionality and virtually solidity. Both three-dimensionality and solidity express in different ways what a body is.
The role of Intellect is to account for the real distinctness of the plethora of Forms, virtually united in the One. Thus, in the above mathematical example, the fact that numbers are virtually united does not gainsay the fact that each has an identity. The way that identity is maintained is by each and every Form being thought by an eternal Intellect. And in this thinking, Intellect ‘attains’ the One in the only way it possibly can. It attains all that can be thought; hence, all that can be thought ‘about’ the One.
Intellect is the principle of essence or whatness or intelligibility as the One is the principle of being. Intellect is an eternal instrument of the One's causality (see V 4. 1, 1-4; VI 7. 42, 21-23). The dependence of anything ‘below’ Intellect is owing to the One's ultimate causality along with Intellect, which explains, via the Forms, why that being is the kind of thing it is. Intellect needs the One as cause of its being in order for Intellect to be a paradigmatic cause and the One needs Intellect in order for there to be anything with an intelligible structure. Intellect could not suffice as a first principle of all because the complexity of thinking (thinker and object of thought and multiplicity of objects of thought) requires as an explanation something that is absolutely simple. In addition, the One may even be said to need Intellect to produce Intellect. This is so because Plotinus distinguishes two logical ‘phases’ of Intellect's production from the One (see V 1. 7). The first phrase indicates the fundamental activity of intellection or thinking; the second, the actualization of thinking which constitutes the being of the Forms. This thinking is the way Intellect ‘returns’ to the One.
The third fundamental principle is Soul. Soul is not the principle of life, for the activity of Intellect is the highest activity of life. Plotinus associates life with desire. But in the highest life, the life of Intellect, where we find the highest form of desire, that desire is eternally satisfied by contemplation of the One through the entire array of Forms that are internal to it. Soul is the principle of desire for objects that are external to the agent of desire. Everything with a soul, from human beings to the most insignificant plant, acts to satisfy desire. This desire requires it to seek things that are external to it, such as food. Even a desire for sleep, for example, is a desire for a state other than the state which the living thing currently is in. Cognitive desires, for example, the desire to know, are desires for that which is currently not present to the agent. A desire to procreate is, as Plato pointed out, a desire for immortality. Soul explains, as unchangeable Intellect could not, the deficiency that is implicit in the fact of desiring.
Soul is related to Intellect analogously to the way Intellect is related to the One. As the One is virtually what Intellect is, so Intellect is paradigmatically what Soul is. The activity of Intellect, or its cognitive identity with all Forms, is the paradigm for all embodied cognitive states of any soul as well as any of its affective states. In the first case, a mode of cognition, such as belief, images Intellect's eternal state by being a representational state. It represents the cognitive identity of Intellect with Forms because the embodied believer is cognitively identical with a concept which itself represents or images Forms. In the second case, an affective state such as feeling tired represents or images Intellect (in a derived way) owing to the cognitive component of that state which consists in the recognition of its own presence. Here, x's being-in-the-state is the intentional object of x's cognition. Where the affective state is that of a non-cognitive agent, the imitation is even more remote, though present nevertheless. It is, says Plotinus, like the state of being asleep in comparison with the state of being awake (see III 8. 4). In other words, it is a state that produces desire that is in potency a state that recognizes the presence of the desire, a state which represents the state of Intellect. In reply to the possible objection that a potency is not an image of actuality, Plotinus will want to insist that potencies are functionally related to actualities, not the other way around, and that therefore the affective states of non-cognitive agents can only be understood as derived versions of the affective and cognitive states of souls closer to the ideal of both, namely, the state of Intellect.
There is another way in which Soul is related to Intellect as Intellect is related to the One. Plotinus distinguishes between something's internal and external activity (see V 4. 2, 27-33). The (indescribable) internal activity of the One is its own hyper-intellectual existence. Its external activity is just Intellect. Similarly, Intellect's internal activity is its contemplation of the Forms, and its external activity is found in every possible representation of the activity of being eternally identical with all that is intelligible (i.e., the Forms). It is also found in the activity of soul, which as a principle of ‘external’ desire images the paradigmatic desire of Intellect. Anything that is understandable is an external activity of Intellect; and any form of cognition of that is also an external activity of it. The internal activity of Soul includes the plethora of psychical activities of all embodied living things. The external activity of Soul is nature, which is just the intelligible structure of all that is other than soul in the sensible world, including both the bodies of things with soul and things without soul (see III 8. 2). The end of this process of diminishing activities is matter which is entirely bereft of form and so of intelligibility, but whose existence is ultimately owing to the One, via the instrumentality of Intellect and Soul.
According to Plotinus, matter is to be identified with evil and privation of all form or intelligibility (see II 4). Plotinus holds this in conscious opposition to Aristotle, who distinguished matter from privation (see II 4. 16, 3-8). Matter is what accounts for the diminished reality of the sensible world, for all natural things are composed of forms in matter. The fact that matter is in principle deprived of all intelligibility and is still ultimately dependent on the One is an important clue as to how the causality of the latter operates.
If matter or evil is ultimately caused by the One, then is not the One, as the Good, the cause of evil? In one sense, the answer is definitely yes. As Plotinus reasons, if anything besides the One is going to exist, then there must be a conclusion of the process of production from the One. The beginning of evil is the act of separation from the One by Intellect, an act which the One itself ultimately causes. The end of the process of production from the One defines a limit, like the end of a river going out from its sources. Beyond the limit is matter or evil.
We may still ask why the limitless is held to be evil. According to Plotinus, matter is the condition for the possibility of there being images of Forms in the sensible world. From this perspective, matter is identified with the receptacle or space in Plato's Timaeus and the phenomenal properties in the receptacle prior to the imposition of order by the Demiurge. The very possibility of a sensible world, which is impressively confirmed by the fact that there is one, guarantees that the production from the One, which must include all that is possible (else the One would be self-limiting), also include the sensible world (see I 8. 7). But the sensible world consists of images of the intelligible world and these images could not exist without matter.
Matter is only evil in other than a purely metaphysical sense when it becomes an impediment to return to the One. It is evil when considered as a goal or end that is a polar opposite to the Good. To deny the necessity of evil is to deny the necessity of the Good (I 8. 15). Matter is only evil for entities that can consider it as a goal of desire. These are, finally, only entities that can be self-conscious of their goals. Specifically, human beings, by opting for attachments to the bodily, orient themselves in the direction of evil. This is not because body itself is evil. The evil in bodies is the element in them that is not dominated by form. One may be desirous of that form, but in that case what one truly desires is that form's ultimate intelligible source in Intellect. More typically, attachment to the body represents a desire not for form but a corrupt desire for the non-intelligible or limitless.
The drama of human life is viewed by Plotinus against the axis of Good and evil outlined above. The human person is essentially a soul employing a body as an instrument of its temporary embodied life (see I 1). Thus, Plotinus distinguishes between the person and the composite of soul and body. That person is identical with a cognitive agent or subject of cognitive states (see I 1. 7). An embodied person is, therefore, a conflicted entity, capable both of thought and of being the subject of the composite's non-cognitive states, such as appetites and emotions.
This conflicted state or duality of personhood is explained by the nature of cognition, including rational desire. Rational agents are capable of being in embodied states, including states of desire, and of being cognitively aware that they are in these states. So, a person can be hungry or tired and be cognitively aware that he is in this state, where cognitive awareness includes being able to conceptualize that state. But Plotinus holds that the state of cognitive awareness more closely identifies the person than does the non-cognitive state. He does so on the grounds that all embodied or enmattered intelligible reality is an image of its eternal paradigm in Intellect. In fact, the highest part of the person, one's own intellect, the faculty in virtue of which persons can engage in non-discursive thinking, is eternally ‘undescended’. It is eternally doing what Intellect is doing. And the reason for holding this is, based on Plotinus' interpretation of Plato's Recollection Argument in Phaedo (72e-78b), that our ability to engage successfully in embodied cognition depends on our having access to Forms. But the only access to Forms is eternal access by cognitive identification with them. Otherwise, we would have only images or representations of the Forms. So, we must now be cognitively identical with them if we are going also to use these Forms as a way of classifying and judging things in the sensible world.
A person in a body can choose to take on the role of a non-cognitive agent by acting solely on appetite or emotion. In doing so, that person manifests a corrupted desire, a desire for what is evil, the material aspect of the bodily. Alternatively, a person can distance himself from these desires and identify himself with his rational self. The very fact that this is possible supplies Plotinus with another argument for the supersensible identity of the person.
Owing to the conflicted states of embodied persons, they are subject to self-contempt and yet, paradoxically, ‘want to belong to themselves’. Persons have contempt for themselves because one has contempt for what is inferior to oneself. Insofar as persons desire things other than what Intellect desires, they desire things that are external to themselves. But the subject of such desires is inferior to what is desired, even if this be a state of fulfilled desire. In other words, if someone wants to be in state B when he is in state A, he must regard being in state A as worse than being in state B. But all states of embodied desire are like this. Hence, the self-contempt.
Persons want to belong to themselves insofar as they identify themselves as subjects of their idiosyncratic desires. They do this because they have forgotten or are unaware of their true identity as disembodied intellects. If persons recognize their true identity, they would not be oriented to the objects of their embodied desire but to the objects of intellect. They would be able to look upon the subject of those embodied desires as alien to their true selves.
Plotinus views ethics according to the criterion of what contributes to our identification with our higher selves and what contributes to our separation from that identification. All virtuous practices make a positive contribution to this goal. But virtues can be graded according to how they do this (see I 2). The lowest form of virtues, what Plotinus, following Plato, calls ‘civic’ or ‘popular’, are the practices that serve to control the appetites (see I 2. 2). By contrast, higher ‘purificatory’ virtues are those that separate the person from the embodied human being (I 2. 3). One who practices purificatory virtue is no longer subject to the incontinent desires whose restraint constitutes mere civic or popular virtue. Such a person achieves a kind of ‘likeness to God’ recommended by Plato at Theaetetus 176a-b. Both of these types of virtue are inferior to intellectual virtue which consists in the activity of the philosopher (see I 2. 6). One who is purified in embodied practices can turn unimpeded to one's true self-identity as a thinker.
Plotinus' chronologically first treatise, ‘On Beauty’ (I 6), can be seen as parallel to his treatise on virtue (I 2). In it, he tries to fit the experience of beauty into the drama of ascent to the first principle of all. In this respect, Plotinus' aesthetics is inseparable from his metaphysics, psychology, and ethics.
As in the case of virtue, Plotinus recognizes a hierarchy of beauty. But what all types of beauty have in common is that they consist in form or images of the Forms eternally present in Intellect (I 6. 2). The lowest type of beauty is physical beauty where the splendor of the paradigm is of necessity most occluded. If the beauty of a body is inseparable from that body, then it is only a remote image of the non-bodily Forms. Still, our ability to experience such beauty serves as another indication of our own intellects' undescended character. We respond to physical beauty because we dimly recognize its paradigm. To call this paradigm ‘the Form of Beauty’ would be somewhat misleading unless it were understood to include all the Forms cognized by Intellect. Following Plato in Symposium, Plotinus traces a hierarchy of beautiful objects above the physical, culminating in the Forms themselves. And their source, the Good, is also the source of their beauty (I 6. 7). The beauty of the Good consists in the virtual unity of all the Forms. As it is the ultimate cause of the complexity of intelligible reality, it is the cause of the delight we experience in form (see V 5. 12).
Porphyry's edition of Plotinus' Enneads preserved for posterity the works of the leading Platonic interpreter of antiquity. Through these works as well as through the writings of Porphyry himself (234 -- c. 305 C.E.) and Iamblichus (c. 245 -- 325 C.E.), Plotinus shaped the entire subsequent history of philosophy. Until well into the 19th century, Platonism was in large part understood, appropriated or rejected based on its Plotinian expression and in adumbrations of this.
The theological traditions of Christianity, Islam, and Judaism all, in their formative periods, looked to ancient Greek philosophy for the language and arguments with which to articulate their religious visions. For all of these, Platonism expressed the philosophy that seemed closest to their own theologies. Plotinus was the principal source for their understanding of Platonism.
Through the Latin translation of Plotinus by Marsilio Ficino published in 1492, Plotinus became available to the West. The first English translation, by Thomas Taylor, appeared in the late 18th century. Plotinus was, once again, recognized as the most authoritative interpreter of Platonism. In the writings of the Italian Renaissance philosophers, the 15th and 16th century humanists John Colet, Erasmus of Rotterdam, and Thomas More, the 17th century Cambridge Platonists, and German idealists, especially Hegel, Plotinus' thought was the (sometimes unacknowledged) basis for opposition to the competing and increasingly influential tradition of scientific philosophy. This influence continued in the 20th century flowering of Christian imaginative literature in England, including the works of C.S. Lewis and Charles Williams.