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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Physicalism is sometimes known as materialism. Historically, materialists held that everything was matter -- where matter was conceived as "an inert, senseless substance, in which extension, figure, and motion do actually subsist" (Berkeley, Principles of Human Knowledge, par. 9). The reason for speaking of physicalism rather than materialism is to abstract away from this historical notion, which is usually thought of as too restrictive -- for example, forces such as gravity are physical but it is not clear that they are material in the traditional sense (Dijksterhuis 1961, Yolton 1983). It is also to emphasize a connection to physics and the physical sciences. Indeed, physicalism is unusual among metaphysical doctrines in being associated historically with a commitment both to the sciences and to a particular branch of science, namely physics.
The interpretation question itself divides into two sub-questions, which I will call the completeness question and the condition question. The completeness question asks:
The condition question asks:
The idea of supervenience might be introduced via an example due to David Lewis of a dot-matrix picture:
A dot-matrix picture has global properties -- it is symmetrical, it is cluttered, and whatnot -- and yet all there is to the picture is dots and non-dots at each point of the matrix. The global properties are nothing but patterns in the dots. They supervene: no two pictures could differ in their global properties without differing, somewhere, in whether there is or there isn't a dot (1986, p. 14).Lewis's example gives us one way to introduce the basic of idea of physicalism. The basic idea is that the physical features of the world are like the dots in the picture, and the psychological or biological or social features of the world are like the global properties of the picture. Just as the global features of the picture are nothing but a pattern in the dots, so too the psychological, the biological and the social features of the world are nothing but a pattern in the physical features of the world. To use the language of supervenience, just as the global features of the picture supervene on the dots, so too everything supervenes on the physical, if physicalism is true.
It is desirable to have a more explicit statement of physicalism, and here too Lewis's example gives us direction. Lewis says that, in the case of the picture, supervenience means that "no two pictures can be identical in the arrangement of dots but different in their global properties". Similarly, one might say that, in the case of physicalism, no two possible worlds can be identical in their physical properties but differ, somewhere, in their mental, social or biological properties. To put this slightly differently, we might say that if physicalism is true at our world, then no other world can be physically identical to it without being identical to it in all respects. This suggests the following account of what physicalism is:
(1) Physicalism is true at a possible world w iff any world which is a physical duplicate of w is a duplicate of w simpliciter.If physicalism is construed along the lines suggested in (1), then we have an answer to the completeness question. The completeness question asks: what does it mean to say that everything is physical. According to (1), what this means is that if physicalism is true, there is no possible world which is identical to the actual world in every physical respect but which is not identical to it in a biological or social or psychological respect. It will be useful to have a name for physicalism so defined, so let us call it supervenience physicalism.
In order to solve the epiphenomenal ectoplasm problem, we need to adjust (1) so that it does not have the truth of physicalism ruling out W as a possible world. While there are a number of different proposals about how to do this, the simplest is due to Frank Jackson (cf. Jackson 1993. For earlier proposals and further discussion, see Horgan 1983 and Lewis 1983.) He proposes replacing (1) with:
(2) Physicalism is true at a possible world w iff any world which is a minimal physical duplicate of w is a duplicate of w simpliciterBy ‘minimal physical duplicate’, Jackson means a possible world that is identical in all physical respects to the actual world, but which does not contain anything else; in particular, it does not contain any epiphenomenal ectoplasm. Unlike (1), (2) does not have physicalism ruling out W, and so (2) is preferable to (1), as a statement of physicalism, and it is (2) with which we shall work in this entry.
Once again there are a number of different responses to this problem in the literature (cf. Kim 1993). But perhaps the simplest response is that the problem conflates two issues that are better kept apart: the question of what physicalism itself tells us about W*, and the question of what our general knowledge tells us about W*. It is true that physicalism itself does not tell us anything about the distribution of mental properties at W*. Nevertheless, we know independently what the distribution is -- we know independently that the presence or absence of molecules on Saturn doesn't affect things like who has mental properties here on Earth. But why should one assume that this last piece of knowledge should be a consequence of physicalism? To put the point slightly differently, imagine that we discover that who has mental properties on Earth is in part a function of the behavior of molecules on Saturn. That would of course tell us that we are deeply wrong in our assumptions about how the world works. But it would not tell us that we are deeply wrong about physicalism. (For further discussion of this point, see Paull and Sider 1992, and Stalnaker 1996.)
But for some it is puzzling that physicalism is stated using modal notions (i.e. notions such as possible worlds) and nonetheless is contingent. To see the problem, notice first that, supervenience physicalism tells us that the minimal physical truths of the world entail all the truths; hence
(3) The minimal physical truths entail all the truths.Now suppose that S is a statement which specifies the minimal physical nature of the actual world and S* is a statement which specifies the total nature of the world. (It might be that neither S nor S* are expressible in languages we can understand, but let us set this aside.) If supervenience physicalism is true, it will then be true that:
(4) S entails S*On the other hand, (4) is clearly a necessary truth. However, if (4) is a necessary truth, how can physicalism be contingent? After all, (4) seems equivalent to physicalism. But if the two are equivalent, how can one be necessary and the other contingent?
But the response to this problem is straightforward. (4) is necessary, but it is not equivalent to physicalism. Rather, (4) follows from physicalism given various contingent assumptions, in particular the assumptions that S and S are the statements we say they are -- it is contingent fact, for example that S* summarizes the total nature of the world. On other hand, (3) is equivalent to physicalism but it is not necessary. (It is important to bear in mind here that not all entailment claims are necessary. Consider ‘my aunt's favorite statement entails my uncle's favorite’ -- that statement is contingent even though it is most naturally thought of as an entailment claim.)
This problem is not so easily answered as the previous three. Lying behind the problem is a deeper issue about the correct interpretation of necessity and possibility -- the modal notions one uses to formulate supervenience. On one way of interpreting these notions, the existence of a necessary being of this sort is incoherent. A reason is that it would violate David Hume's famous dictum that there are no necessary connections between distinct existences -- the being is distinct from the physical world and yet is necessitated by it. On another way of interpreting these notions, however, there is nothing incoherent in the idea of such a being. The correct way to think about modal notions, however, is a topic that is well beyond the scope of our discussion here. The problem seems to be that the supervenience definition of physicalism in effect presupposes something like Hume's dictum, in that it uses failure of necessitation as a test for distinctness. But this means that someone who denies the dictum will have to find an alternative way of formulating physicalism.
While the issue of physicalism is central to philosophy of mind, however, it is important also to be aware that supervenience physicalism is neutral on a good many of the questions that are pursued in philosophy of mind, and pursued elsewhere for that matter. If you read over the philosophy of mind literature, you will often find people debating a number of different issues: whether there are mental states at all; what sort of thing mental states are; to what extent mental states are environmentally determined. Given the multifariousness of mental states, it is quite likely that the correct position will be some kind of combination of these positions. But this is a question of further inquiry that is irrelevant to physicalism itself. So physicalism itself leaves many debates in the philosophy of mind unanswered.
This point is sometimes expressed by saying that supervenience physicalism is minimal physicalism (Lewis 1983): it is intended to capture the minimal or core commitment of physicalism. Physicalists may differ from one another in many ways, but all of them must at least hold supervenience physicalism. (Notice that the idea that (2) captures the minimal commitment of physicalism is a distinct idea from that of a minimal physical duplicate which it uses to capture minimal physicalism.)
Two issues here require further comment. First, in some discussions in philosophy of mind, the term ‘physicalism’ is used to refer to the identity theory, the idea that mental states or properties are neurological states or properties (Block 1980). In this use of the term, one can reject physicalism by rejecting the identity theory -- so by that standard a behaviorist or functionalist in philosophy of mind would not count as a physicalist. Obviously, this is a much more restricted use of the term than is being employed here.
Second, one might think that supervenience physicalism is inconsistent with eliminativism, the claim that psychological states do not exist, for the following reason. Suppose psychological states supervene on physical states. Doesn't that mean, contrary to eliminativism, that there must be some psychological states? The answer to this question is ‘no.’ For consider: the telephone on my desk has no psychological states whatsoever. Nevertheless it is still true (though, admittedly, a little odd) to say that a telephone which is identical to my telephone in all physical respects will be identical to it in all psychological respects. In the sense intended, therefore, one thing can psychologically identical to another even when neither has any psychological states.
Token physicalism is the view that every particular thing in the world is a physical particular. Here is one formulation of this idea:
Token physicalism:Supervenience physicalism neither implies nor is implied by token physicalism. To see that token physicalism does not imply supervenience physicalism, one need only note that the former is consistent with a version of dualism, namely property dualism. The mere fact that every particular has a physical property does not rule out the possibility that some particulars also have non-supervenient mental properties, i.e. mental properties that are only contingently related to the physical. But supervenience physicalism does rule out this possibility. Since token physicalism does not rule out property dualism but supervenience physicalism does, the first does not imply the second.
For every actual particular (object, event or process) x, there is some physical particular y such that x = y.
To see that supervenience physicalism does not imply token physicalism is more difficult. The crucial point is that token physicalism requires that for every psychological or social particular, there is some physical particular with which it is identical. But this is by no means obviously true. Consider the United States Court of Appeals for the Seventh Circuit. This might thought of as a social or legal object. But then, according to token physicalism, there must be some physical object for it to be identical with. But there might be no physical object (in any natural sense of the term) which is identical to the Court of Appeals for the Seventh Circuit. On the other hand, supervenience physicalism imposes no such requirement, and so supervenience physicalism does not imply token physicalism (For the classic presentation of this point, see Haugeland 1983).
The point that supervenience physicalism is logically distinct from token physicalism is an important one. One thing it shows is that token physicalism (since it is consistent with property dualism) does not capture minimal physicalism, and so the distinction between token physicalism and supervenience physicalism is no objection to the latter. But the difference between the two theses also raises a different question. Given that token physicalism does not capture the minimal commitment of physicalism, why has token physicalism been the subject of such discussion? One reason is that token physicalism provides one version of the idea that upper level scientific claims requires physical mechanisms. Supervenience physicalism does not on its own entail this. But token physicalism is often seen as a way to ensure this requirement. (For the classic presentation of this point, see Fodor 1974; see also Papineau 1996)
Having considered token physicalism, we can now turn to type physicalism. Type physicalism is a generalization and extension of the identity theory, which we considered above. It holds that that every property (or at least every property that is or could be instantiated in the actual world) is identical with some physical property. Here is a statement of this sort of idea:
Type physicalism:Unlike token physicalism, type physicalism certainly does entail supervenience physicalism: if every property instantiated in the actual world is identical with some physical property, then a world identical to our world in physical respects will of course be identical to it in all respects.
For every actually instantiated mental property F, there is some physical property G such that F=G.
Nevertheless the reverse entailment does not hold. Supervenience physicalism, as we have been understanding it, is a contingent thesis that is consistent with the possibility (if not the actuality) of disembodiment. But type physicalism as defined here is inconsistent with this possibility. To that extent, supervenience physicalism does not entail type physicalism.
Earlier we noted that philosophers such as Davidson have thought that
physicalism is a necessary truth. Even on that assumption, however,
it is still not completely obvious that supervenience physicalism
entails type physicalism. The reason for this has to do with
questions concerning the logical (or Boolean) closure of the set of
physical properties -- if P, Q and R are
physical properties, which of the various logical permutations of
P, Q and R are likewise physical
properties? On some assumptions concerning closure and
supervenience, supervenience physicalism (construed as a necessary
truth) entails type physicalism; on other assumptions, it
doesn't. But the problem is that the assumptions themselves are
difficult to interpret and evaluate, and so the issue remains a
difficult one. It is not necessary for our purposes to settle the
question concerning closure here. (For further discussion of these
issues see Kim 1993, Bacon 1990, Van Cleve 1990, Stalnaker 1996.)
The main problem in assessing whether a physicalist must be a reductionist is that there are various non-equivalent versions of reductionism.
One idea is tied to the notion of conceptual or reductive analysis. When philosophers attempt to provide an analysis of some concept or notion, they usually try to provide a reductive analysis of the notion in question, i.e. to analyze it in other terms. Applied to the philosophy of mind, this notion might be thought of entailing the idea that every mental concept or notion is analyzed in terms of a physical concept or notion. A formulation of this idea is (5):
(5) Reductionism is true iff for each mental predicate F, there is a physical predicate G such that a sentence of the form ‘ x is F iff x is G’ is analytically true.
While one occasionally finds in the literature the suggestion that physicalists are committed to (5) in fact, no physicalist since before Smart (1959) has (unqualifiedly) held anything like (5). Adapting Ryle (1949), Smart supposed that in addition to physical expressions there is a class of expressions which are topic-neutral, i.e. expressions which were neither mental nor physical but when conjoined with any theory would greatly increase the expressive power of the theory. Smart suggested that one might analyze mental expressions in topic-neutral (but not physical) terms, which in effect means that a physicalist could reject (5). It is fair to say that this move is one of the central innovations of philosophy of mind, a move to a large extent endorsed and developed by functionalists and cognitive scientists.
A different notion of reduction derives from the attempts of philosophers of science to explain intertheoretic reduction. The classic formulation of this notion was given by Ernest Nagel (1961). Nagel said that one theory was reduced to another if you could logically derive the first from the second together with what he called bridge laws, i.e., laws connecting the predicates of the reduced theory (the theory to be reduced) with the predicates of the reducing theory (the theory to which one is reducing). Here is a formulation of this idea, where the theories in question are psychology and neuroscience:
(6) Reductionism is true iff for each mental predicate F there is a neurological predicate G such that a sentence of the form ‘x is F iff x is G’ expresses a bridge law.Once again, however, there is no reason at all why physicalists need to accept that reductionism is true in the sense of (6). Indeed, many philosophers have argued that there are very strong empirical reasons to deny that anything like (6) is going to be the case. The reason is this. Many different neurological processes (whether in our own species or a different one) could underlie the same psychological process -- indeed, given science fiction, even non-neurological processes might underlie the same psychological process. But if multiple realizability -- as this sort of idea is called -- is true, then (6) seems to be false. (Fodor 1974, but for recent alternative views, see Kim 1993).
A third notion of reductionism is more metaphysical in focus than either the conceptual or theoretical ideas reviewed so far. According to this notion, reductionism means that the properties expressed by the predicates of (say) a psychological theory are identical to the properties expressed by the predicates of (say) a neurological theory -- in other words, this version of reductionism is in essence a version of type physicalism or the identity theory. However, as we have seen, if physicalists are committed only to supervenience physicalism, they are not committed to type physicalism. Hence a physicalist need not be a reductionist in this metaphysical sense.
A final notion of reductionism that needs to be distinguished from the previous three concerns whether mental statements follow a priori from non-mental statements. Here is a statement of this sort of idea,
(7) Reductionism is true iff for each mental predicate F there is non-mental predicate G such that a sentence of the form ‘ if x is F then x is G’ is a priori.What (7) says is that if reductionism is true, a priori knowledge alone, plus knowledge of the physical truths will allow one to know the mental truths. This question is in fact a highly vexed one in contemporary philosophy. However, this question is usually debated in the context of another, viz., the question of a posteriori and a priori physicalism. It is to that question, therefore, to which we will now turn.
(4) S entails S*Another way to say this is to say that if physicalism is true, then the following conditional is necessarily true:
(8) If S then S*Indeed, this is a general feature of physicalism: if it is true then there will always be a necessary truth of the form of (8).
Now, if (8) is necessary the question arises whether it is a priori, i.e. knowable independent of empirical experience, or whether it is a posteriori, i.e. knowable but not independently of empirical experience. Traditionally, every statement that was necessary was assumed to be a priori. However, since Kripke's classic work Naming and Necessity (1980), philosophers have become used to the idea that there are truths which are both necessary and a posteriori. Accordingly many recent philosophers have defended a posteriori physicalism: the claim that statements such as (8) are necessary and a posteriori (cf. Loar 1997). Moreover, they have used this point to try to disarm many objections to physicalism, including those concerning qualia and intentionality that we will consider in a moment. Indeed, as we have just noted, some philosophers have suggested that the necessary a posteriori provides the proper interpretation of non-reductive physicalism.
The appeal to the necessary a posteriori is on the surface an attractive one, but it is also controversial. One problem arises from the fact that Kripke's idea that there are necessary and a posteriori truths can be interpreted in two rather different ways. On the first interpretation -- I will call it the derivation view -- while there are necessary a posteriori truths, these truths can be derived a priori from truths which are a posteriori and contingent. On the second interpretation -- I will call it the non-derivation view -- there are non-derived necessary a posteriori truths, i.e. necessary truths which are not derived from any contingent truths (or any a priori truths for that matter). The problem is that when one combines the derivation view with the claim that (8) is necessary and a posteriori, one encounters a contradiction. If the derivation view is correct, then there is some contingent and a posteriori statement S# that logically entails (8). However, if S# logically entails (8) then (since ‘If C, then if A then B’ is equivalent to ‘If C & A, then B’) we can infer that the following is both necessary and a priori:
(9) If S & S# then S*.One the other hand, if physicalism is true, and S summarizes the total nature of the world it seems reasonable to suppose that S# was already implicitly included in S. In other words it seems reasonable to suppose that (9) is simply an expansion of (8). But if (9) is just an expansion of (8), then if (9) is a priori, (8) must also be a priori. But that means our initial assumption is false: (8) is not a necessary a posteriori truth after all (Jackson 1998).
How might an a posteriori physicalist respond to this objection? The obvious response is to reject the derivation view of the necessary a posteriori in favor of the non-derivation view. But this is just to say that if one wants to defend a posteriori physicalism, one will have to defend the non-derivation view of the necessary a posteriori. However, the problem here is that the non-derivation view is very controversial. Indeed, the question of which interpretation of Kripke's work is the right one, is one of the most vexed in contemporary analytic philosophy. So it is not something that we can hope to solve here. (For discussion, see Byrne 1999, Chalmers 1996 1999, Jackson 1998, Loar 1997, 1999, Lewis 1994, Yablo 1999.)
Now it is difficult to evaluate emergentism because it is unclear what genuine novelty is supposed to be. On one interpretation, what the emergentists meant by ‘genuine novelty’ was non-predictability in principle, i.e. the idea that no matter how much physical information you had about a creature you could not predict on that basis alone what experiences, if any, they might have. On this interpretation, emergentism seems very similar to a posteriori physicalism (Byrne 1993). On a different interpretation, what the emergentists meant by ‘genuine novelty’ was the idea that there was only a contingent connection between psychological states and physical state, a connection perhaps mediated by contingent psycho-physical laws. On this interpretation, however, emergentism seems simply to be a denial of physicalism as we have defined it here.
There is, however, a third interpretation of ‘genuine novelty’ which requires separate treatment. On this interpretation, the idea of genuine novelty is the idea of a layered world: a world that has genuine levels (i.e. levels distinct from one another), and that each of these levels are necessarily connected to others. So interpreted, emergentism is the view that our world is such a layered world.
Now, this version of emergentism does present a problem for our account. To see this, imagine that you begin with a classical form of dualism, and then discover that the laws which related the mental level to the physical level are metaphysically necessary, rather than contingent. In that situation, it is not clear that you have discovered that dualism is false. So emergentism seems to be consistent with dualism. On the other hand, emergentism seems also to be consistent with supervenience physicalism, since according to emergentism, any world physically identical to the actual world will be identical to it in all respects. However -- and here is the final point -- we have been assuming all along that supervenience physicalism is inconsistent with dualism. In short, the problem is this: (a) supervenience physicalism is consistent with emergentism; (b) emergentism is consistent with dualism; but (c) supervenience physicalism is inconsistent with dualism.
How are we to respond to this problem? I think the best thing to say is that emergentism and physicalism are inconsistent, and hence that (a) is false. However, the inconsistency does not have its source in the formal notion of supervenience. Instead it has its source in the interpretation that both views assign to that notion. The emergentist is obviously being guided by the metaphor of layers, and interprets supervenience in that light. However, while one sometimes uses the metaphor of layers to describe the world as portrayed by supervenience physicalism, it would be more apt to say -- as Lewis says in the example of the dot-matrix picture that we considered above -- that that doctrine presents the psychological, the biological and so on as patterns in the physical, rather than layers on top of the physical. So the picture implicit in emergentism is that of a layered world, whereas the picture implicit in supervenience physicalism is that of a patterned world. Since these pictures are inconsistent, (a) is false.
Even if emergentism is distinct from supervenience physicalism, however, it remains a controversial issue whether the emergentist picture can be made fully coherent (Stalnaker 1996). One sort of argument against it is that it seems to violate Hume's dictum that there are no necessary connections between distinct existences: according to emergentism, the levels of the world are wholly distinct from each other, and yet are necessarily connected (Jackson 1993) However, as we saw in our discussion above of the necessary beings problem, the proper interpretation of Hume's dictum is itself a matter of controversy, so emergentism remains controversial.
The condition question that has received less attention in the literature than the questions we have been studying so far. But it is just as important. Without any understanding of what the physical is, we can have no serious understanding of what physicalism is. After all, if we say that, no two possible worlds can be minimal physical duplicates without being duplicates simpliciter, we don't know what we've said unless we understand what it would take to be a minimal physical duplicate, as opposed (say) to a chemical duplicate or a financial duplicate. (The point here is a quite general one: if Thales says that everything is water, or Up-to-Date-Thales says everything supervenes on water, we don't understand what he says unless he says something about what water is. The physicalist is in the same position.)
So what is the answer to the condition question? If we concentrate for simplicity on the notion of a physical property, we can discern two kinds of answers to this question in the literature. The first ties the notion of a physical property to a notion of a physical theory, for this reason we can call it the theory based conception of a physical property:
The theory-based conception:According to the theory-based conception, for example, if physical theory tells us about the property of having mass, then having mass is a physical property. Similarly, if physical theory tells us about the property of being a rock -- or, what is perhaps more likely, if the property of being a rock supervenes on properties which physical theory tell us about -- then it too is a physical property. (The theory-based conception bears some relation to the notion of physical1 discussed in Feigl 1965; more explicit defense is found in Smart 1978, Lewis 1994, Braddon-Mitchell and Jackson 1996, and Chalmers 1996.)
A property is physical iff it either is the sort of property that physical theory tells us about or else is a property which metaphysically (or logically) supervenes on the sort of property that physical theory tells us about.
The second kind of answer ties the notion of a physical property to the notion of a physical object, for this reason we can call it the object-based conception of a physical property:
The object-based conception:According to the object-based conception, for example if rocks, trees, planets and so on are paradigmatic physical objects, then the property of being a rock, tree or planet is a physical property. Similarly, if the property of having mass is required in a complete account of the intrinsic nature of physical objects and their constituents, then having mass is a physical property. (The best examples of philosophers who operate with the object-conception of the physical are Meehl and Sellars 1956 and Feigl 1965; more recent defense is to be found in Jackson 1998.)
A property is physical iff: it either is the sort of property required by a complete account of the intrinsic nature of paradigmatic physical objects and their constituents or else is a property which metaphysically (or logically) supervenes on the sort of property required by a complete account of the intrinsic nature of paradigmatic physical objects and their constituents.
It is important to note that both conceptions of the physical remain silent on the question of whether topic-neutral or functional properties should be treated as physical or not. To borrow a phrase from Jackson (1998), however, it seems best to treat these properties as onlooker properties: given any set of physical properties, one might add onlooker properties without compromising the integrity of the set. But onlooker properties should not be treated as being physical by definition.
However, the response to this is that circularity is only a problem if the conceptions are interpreted as providing a reductive analysis of the notion of the physical. But there is no reason why they should be interpreted as attempting to provide a reductive analysis. After all, we have many concepts that we understand without knowing how to analyze (cf. Lewis 1970). So there seems no reason to suppose that either the theory or object conception is providing anything else a way of understanding the notion of the physical.
The point here is an important one in the context of the condition question. Earlier we said that the condition question was perfectly legitimate because it is legitimate to ask what the condition of being physical is that, according to physicalism, everything has. But this legitimate question should not be interpreted as the demand for a reductive analysis of the notion of the physical. Consider Thales again: it is right to ask Thales what he means by ‘water’ -- and in so doing demand an understanding of the notion of water -- but it is wrong to demand of him a conceptual analysis of water.
One response to this objection is to take its first horn, and insist that, at least in certain respects contemporary physics really is complete or else that it is rational to believe that it is (cf. Smart 1978, Lewis 1994 and Melnyk 1997). But while there is something right about this, there is also something wrong about it. What is right about it is that there is a sense in which it is rational to believe that physics is complete. After all, isn't it rational to believe that the most current science is true? But even so -- and here is what is wrong about the suggestion -- it is still mistaken to define physicalism with respect to the physics that happens to be true in this world. The reason is that whether a physical theory is true or not is a function of the contingent facts; but whether a property is physical or not is a not function of the contingent facts. For example, consider medieval impetus physics. Medieval impetus physics is false (though of course it might not have been) and thus it is irrational to suppose it true. Nevertheless, the property of having impetus -- the central property that objects have according to impetus physics -- is a physical property, and a counterfactual world completely described by impetus physics would be a world in which physicalism is true. But it is hard to see how any of this could be right if physicalism were defined by reference to the physics that we have now or by the physics that happens to be true in our world.
A different response to Hempel's dilemma is that what it shows, if it shows anything, is that a particular proposal about how to define a physical property -- namely, via reference to physics at a particular stage of its development -- is mistaken. But from this one can hardly conclude that we have no clear understanding of the concept at all. As we have seen, we have many concepts that we don't know how to analyze. So the mere fact -- if indeed it is a fact -- that a certain style of analysis of the notion of the physical fails does not mean that there is no notion of the physical at all, still less that we don't understand the notion.
One might object that, while these remarks are perfectly true, they nevertheless don't speak to something that is right about Hempel's dilemma, namely that for the theory-conception to be complete one needs to say a little more about what physical theory is. Here, however, we can appeal to the fact that we have a number of paradigms of what a physical theory is: common sense physical theory, medieval impetus physics, Cartesian contact mechanics, Newtonian physics, and modern quantum physics. While it seems unlikely that there is any one factor that unifies this class of theories, it does not seem unreasonable that there is a cluster of factors -- a common or overlapping set of theoretical constructs, for example, or a shared methodology. In short, we might say that the notion of a physical theory is a Wittgensteinian family resemblance concept, and this should be enough to answer the question of how to understand physical theory.
The first thing to say in response is that the mere possibility of panpsychism cannot really be what is at issue in this objection. For no matter how implausible and outlandish it sounds, panpsychism per se is not inconsistent with physicalism (cf. Lewis 1983). After all, the fact that there are some conscious beings is not contrary to physicalism -- why then should the possibility that everything is a conscious being be contrary to physicalism? So what is at issue in the objection is not panpsychism so much as the possibility that the paradigms or exemplars in terms of which one characterizes the notion of the physical might turn out to be radically different from what we normally assume -- for example, they might turn out to be in some essential or ultimate respect mental. If that were so, it certainly does seem strange to say that physicalism would or could be true.
Once the problem is put like that, however, it is clear that that the problem has a rather similar structure to other problems that arise when one tries to understand a concept in terms of paradigmatic objects which fall under the concept. Suppose one tried to define the concept red in terms of similarity to paradigmatic red things, such as blood. Pursuing this strategy commits one to the idea that the belief that blood is red is a piece of common knowledge shared among all those who are competent with the term. But that seems wrong -- someone who thought that blood was green would be mistaken about blood but not about red. Now this problem is a difficult problem, however -- and this is the crucial point for our purposes -- the problem is also a quite general problem, and not particularly tied to the notion of the physical. So to that extent, the concept of the physical does not seem to be any worse off than the concept of red. (For discussion of the general strategy see Lewis 1997)
Perhaps because of its connection to the physical sciences, physicalism is sometimes construed as an entire package of views, which contains the metaphysical thesis I have isolated for discussion as only one part. If we want a name for the entire package of views including the metaphysical claim we might call it the Physicalist World Picture. I will close our discussion of the interpretation question by considering the relation between physicalism (the metaphysical claim) and various other items that at least sometimes have been thought to be a part of the Physicalist World Picture.
(a) Methodological Naturalism: the idea that the mode of inquiry typical of the physical sciences will provide theoretical understanding of world, to the extent that this sort of understanding can be achieved. Physicalism is not methodological naturalism because physicalism is a metaphysical thesis not a methodological thesis.
(b) Epistemic Optimism: the idea that the mode of understanding typical of the sciences can be used by us, i.e. by human beings, to explain the world in total, to provide a final theory of the world.. Physicalism is not epistemic optimism because, since commitment to physicalism does not commit you to methodological naturalism, it clearly does not commit you to any optimism about the success of that method in the long run.
(c) Final Theory: the idea that there is a final and complete theory of the world, regardless of whether we can formulate it. One might think it obvious that if physicalism is true, there is a final theory of the world. However, because of some unclarity in the notion of a theory, the issues here are not cut and dried. According to some views, something is a theory only if it is finitely stateable in a language we can understand. If that is so, clearly physicalism does not entail the idea of a final theory. On a looser conception of a theory, however, it is reasonable to say that physicalism entails that there is a final theory.
(d) Objectivity: the idea that the final and complete theory of world, if it exists, will not involve any essential reference to particular points of view or experiences. It is reasonable to say that physicalism entails objectivity. However, given the possibilities of non-reductive or a posteriori physicalism even here the issues are not settled. On those approaches, it seems possible to have irreducible points of view or experiences supervening on something physical, which compromises objectivity.
(e) Unity of Science: the idea that all the branches of sciences developed by us will or should be unified into a single science, usually (but not always) thought of as physics. This thesis is clearly a methodological thesis about how science ought to proceed. As we have seen, however, physicalism is a metaphysical thesis rather than a methodological thesis about how science ought to proceed. Hence it is not equivalent to the unity of science thesis.
(f) Explanatory Reductionism: the idea that all genuine explanations must be couched in the terms of physics, and that other explanations, while pragmatically useful, can or should be discarded as knowledge develops. Physicalism is not explanatory reductionism because, as we saw in our discussion of non-reductive physicalism, physicalism is consistent with the idea that special sciences are quite distinct from physics. One might say that the special sciences are concerned with patterns in the physical that physicists themselves are not concerned with. For that reason the subject matter of the special sciences is distinct from the subject matter of physics.
(g) Generality of Physics: the idea that every particular event or process which falls under a law of the special sciences (i.e. sciences other than physics) also falls under a law of physics. In general, this view presupposes a view about laws and explanation -- for example, it implies or seems to imply that special sciences have laws. But physicalism does not entail any such thesis.
(h) Causal Closure of the Physical: the idea that every event has a physical cause, assuming it has a cause at all. Strictly speaking, physicalists are not committed to realism about causation, so they are not committed to causal closure. (Of course, many physicalists do think that causal closure is true, as we will see below, but their position does not entail causal closure.)
(i) Empiricism: the idea that all knowledge (with the possible exception of conceptual knowledge) is ultimately founded on sensory or perceptual experience. Empiricism can be given a descriptive or a normative reading. On its descriptive reading, it is most likely false. Most of the information that normal humans come to deploy seems to be caused by of both experience and inborn structure and maturation. On the normative reading, the claim is that justification is, at the end of the day, based on experience. But this epistemological thesis has nothing to do with physicalism.
(j) Nominalism: the idea that there are no abstract objects, i.e., entities not located in space and time, such as numbers, qualities or propositions. If we assume that abstract objects, if they exist, exist necessarily, i.e., exist in all possible worlds, then supervenience physicalism is completely silent on the question of whether abstract objects exist. All supervenience says is that if a world is a minimal physical duplicate of the actual world, it is a duplicate simpliciter. But if abstract objects exist then they clearly exist in both the actual world and any duplicate of the actual world. What this suggests is that nominalism is a distinct issue from physicalism (Schiffer 1987, Stoljar 1996).
(k) Atheism: the idea that there is no God as traditionally conceived. In the 17th and 18th century, physicalism (or materialism, as it was then known) was widely viewed as inconsistent with belief in God (Yolton 1983). Nowadays, this issue is somewhat less discussed. Nevertheless, as we noted previously, if God is thought of as essentially non-physical, then Atheism does seem to be a consequence of physicalism, at least on some interpretations of the background modal notions.
The main argument against physicalism is usually thought to concern the notion of qualia, the felt qualities of experience. The notion of qualia raises puzzles of its own, puzzles having to do with its connection to other notions such as consciousness, introspection, epistemic access, acquaintance, the first-person perspective and so on. However the idea that we will discuss here is the apparent contradiction between the existence of qualia and physicalism.
Perhaps the clearest version of this argument is Jackson's knowledge argument. (There are also a number of other arguments in this area -- for a very good recent discussion, see Chalmers 1996). This argument asks us to imagine Mary, a famous neuroscientist confined to a black and white room. Mary is forced to learn about the world via black and white television and computers. However, despite these hardships Mary learns (and therefore knows) all that physical theory can teach her. Now, if physicalism were true, it is plausible to suppose that Mary knows everything about the world. And yet -- and here is Jackson's point -- it seems she does not know everything. For, upon being released into the world of color, it will become obvious that, inside her room, she did not know what it is like for both herself and others to see colors -- that is, she did not know about the qualia instantiated by particular experiences of seeing colors. Following Jackson (1986), we may summarize the argument as follows:
P1. Mary (before her release) knows everything physical there is to know about other people.Clearly this conclusion entails that physicalism is false: for if there are truths which escape the physicalist story how can everything supervene on the physical. So a physicalist must either reject a premise or show that the premises don't entail the conclusion.
P2. Mary (before her release) does not know everything there is to know about other people (because she learns something about them on being released).
Conclusion. There are truths about other people (and herself) that escape the physicalist story.
There are many possible responses to this argument, but here I will briefly mention only three. The first is the ability hypothesis due to Lawrence Nemerow (1988) and developed and defended by David Lewis (1994). The ability hypothesis follows Ryle (1949) in drawing a sharp distinction between propositional knowledge or knowledge-that (such as ‘Mary knows that snow is white’) and knowledge-how (such as ‘Mary knows how to ride a bike’), and then suggests that all Mary gains is the latter. On the other hand, P2 would only be true if Mary gained propositional knowledge.
A second response appeals to the distinction between a priori and a posteriori physicalism. As we saw above, the crucial claim of a posteriori physicalism is that (4) -- i.e. the claim that S entails S* -- is a posteriori. Since (4) is a posteriori, you would need certain experience to know it. But, it is argued, Mary has not had (and cannot have) the relevant experience. Hence she does not know (4). On the other hand, the mere fact that Mary has not had (and cannot have) the experience to know (4) does not remove the possibility that (4) is true. Hence a posteriori physicalism can avoid the knowledge argument. (It is an interesting question which premise of the knowledge argument is being attacked by this response. The answer depends on whether (4) is physical or not: if (4) is physical, then the response attacks P1. But if (4) is not physical, the response is that the argument is invalid.).
A third response is to distinguish between various conceptions of the physical. We saw above that potentially the class of properties defined by the theory-conception of the physical was distinct from the class of properties defined by the object-conception. But that suggests that the first premise of the argument is open to interpretation in either of two ways. On the other hand, Jackson's thought experiment only seems to support the premise if it is interpreted in the one way, since Mary learns by learning all that physical theory can teach her. But leaves open the possibility that one might appeal to the object-conception of the physical to define a version of physicalism which evades the knowledge argument.
One of the most lively areas of philosophy of mind concerns the issue of which if any of these responses to the knowledge argument will be successful. The ability response raises questions about whether know-how is genuinely non-propositional (cf. Lycan (1996), Loar (1997) and Stanley and Williamson (forthcoming)), and about whether it gets the facts right to begin with (Braddon Mitchell and Jackson 1996). As against a posteriori physicalism, it has been argued both that it rests on a mistaken approach to the necessary a posteriori (Chalmers 1996, 1999, Jackson 1998), and that the promise of the idea is chimerical anyway (cf. Stoljar 2000). The third response raises questions about the distinction between the object and the theory conception of the physical and associated issues about dispositional and categorical properties (Cf. Chalmers 1996, Lockwood (1992), and Stoljar 2000, 2001.)
Kripke's argument is best approached by first considering what is often called a dispositional theory of linguistic meaning. According to the dispositional theory, a word means what it does -- for example, the word ‘red’ means red -- because speakers of the word are disposed to apply to word to red things. Now, for a number of reasons, this sort of theory has been very popular among physicalists. First, the concept of a disposition at issue here is clearly a concept that is compatible with physicalism. After all, the mere fact that vases are fragile and sugar cubes are soluble (both are classic examples of dispositional properties) does not cause a problem for physicalism, so why should the idea that human beings have similar dispositional properties? Second, it seems possible to develop the dispositional theory of linguistic meaning so that it might apply also to intentionality. According to a dispositional theory of intentionality, a mental concept would mean what it does because thinkers are disposed to employ the concept in thought in a certain way. So a dispositional theory seems to hold out the best promise of a theory of intentionality that is compatible with physicalism.
Kripke's argument is designed to destroy that promise. (In fact, Kripke's argument is designed to destroy considerably more than this: the conclusion of his argument is a paradoxical one to the effect that there can be no such a thing as a word's having a meaning. However, we will concentrate on the aspects of the argument that bear on physicalism.) In essence his argument is this. Imagine a situation in which (a) the dispositional theory is true; (b) the word ‘red’ means red for a speaker S; and yet (c) the speaker misapplies the word -- for example, S is looking at a white thing through rose-tinted spectacles and calls it red. Now, in that situation, it would seem that S is disposed to apply ‘red’ to things which are (not merely red but) either-red-or-white-but-seen-through-rose-tinted-spectacles. But then, by the theory, the word ‘red’ means (not red but) either-red-or-white-as-seen-through-rose-tinted-spectacles. But that contradicts our initial claim (b), that ‘red’ means red. In other words, the dispositional theory, when combined with a true claim about the meaning of word, plus a truism about meaning -- that people can misapply meaningful words -- leads to a contradiction and is therefore false.
How might a physicalist respond to Kripke's argument? As with the knowledge argument, there are many responses but here I will mention only two. The first response is to insist that Kripke's argument neglects the distinction between a priori and a posteriori physicalism. Kripke often does say that according to the dispositionalist, one should be able to ‘read off’ truths about meaning from truths a physicalist can reject. (For a proposal like this, see Horwich 2000.) However, the problem with this proposal is, as we have seen, that its background account of the necessary a posteriori is very controversial. As we saw, a posteriori physicalists are committed to what we called the non-derived view about necessary a posteriori truths. But the non-derived view has come under strident attack in recent times.
The second response is to defend the dispositional theory against Kripke's argument. One way to do this is to argue that Kripke's argument only works against a very simple dispositionalism, and that a more complicated version of such a theory would avoid these problems. (For a proposal along these lines, see Fodor 1992 and the discussion in Braddon-Mitchell and Jackson 1996). A different proposal is to argue that Kripke's argument underestimates the complexity in the notion of a disposition. The mere fact that in certain circumstances someone would apply ‘red’ to white things does not mean that they are disposed to apply red to white things -- after all, the mere fact that in certain circumstances something would burn does not mean that it flammable in the ordinary sense. (For a proposal along these lines see Hohwy 1998, and Heil and Martin 1998)
As with the knowledge argument, the issues surrounding Kripke's argument are very much wide open. But it is important to note that most philosophers don't consider the issues of intentionality as seriously as the issue of qualia when it comes to physicalism. In different vocabularies, for example, both Block (1995) and Chalmers (1996) distinguish between the intentional aspects of the mind or consciousness, and the phenomenal aspects or qualia, and suggest that it is really the latter that is the central issue. As Chalmers notes (1996; p. 24), echoing Chomsky's famous distinction, the intentionality issue is a problem, but the qualia issue is a mystery.
It is easiest to state Chomsky's criticism by beginning with two points about methodological naturalism. In general it seems rational to agree with the methodological naturalists that the best hope for a theoretical understanding of the world is by pursuing the methods which are typical of the sciences. It would then seem rational as a special case that our best hope for a theoretical understanding of consciousness or experience is by pursuing the methods of the sciences -- by pursuing, as we might put it, the naturalistic project with respect to consciousness. So Chomsky's first point is that it is rational to pursue the naturalistic project with respect to consciousness.
Chomsky's second point is that the physicalist project in philosophy of mind is on the face of it rather different from the naturalistic project. In the first place, the physicalist project is, as we have noted, usually thought of a piece of metaphysics. But there is nothing metaphysical about the naturalistic project, it simply raises questions about what we can hope to explain. In the second place, the physicalist project is normally thought of as being amenable to philosophical argument, whereas it is completely unclear where philosophical argument would enter the naturalistic project. In short, there doesn't seem anything particularly ‘philosophical’ about the naturalistic project -- it simply applies the methods of science to consciousness. But the physicalist project is central to analytic philosophy.
It is precisely at the place where the physicalist project departs from the naturalistic project that Chomsky's criticism begins to take shape. For insofar as it is different from the naturalistic project, there are a number of ways in which the physicalist project is questionable. First, it is hard to see what the project might be -- it is true that throughout the history of philosophy and science one encounters suggestions that one might find out about the world in ways that are distinct from the ones used in the sciences, but these suggestions have always been rather obscure. Second, it is hard see how this sort of project could recommend itself to physicalists themselves -- such a project seems to be a departure from methodological naturalism but most physicalists endorse methodological naturalism as a matter of fact. On the other hand, if the physicalist project does not depart from the naturalistic project, then the usual ways of talking and thinking about that project are highly misleading. For example, it is misleading to speak of it a piece of metaphysics and philosophy as opposed to a piece of ordinary science.
In sum, Chomsky's criticism is best understood as a kind of dilemma. The physicalist project is either identical to the naturalistic project or it is not. If it is identical, then the language and concepts that shape the project are potentially extremely misleading; but if it is not identical, then there are a number of ways in which it is illegitimate.
How is one to respond to this criticism? In my view, the strongest answer to Chomsky accepts the first horn of his dilemma and suggests that what philosophers of mind are really concerned with is the naturalistic project. Now, of course, what concerns them is not the details of the project -- that would not distinguish them from working scientists. Rather they are concerned with what the potential limits of the project are.
This is a theme which has reached its best expression in the work of Thomas Nagel (1980, 1984, 1999) and allied work by Bernard Williams (1984). According to them, any form of scientific inquiry will at least be objective, or will result in an objective picture of the world. On the other hand, we have a number of arguments -- the most prominent being the knowledge argument -- which plausibly show that there is no place for experience or qualia in a world that is described in purely objective terms. If Nagel and Williams are right that any form of scientific inquiry will yield a description of the world in objective terms, the knowledge argument is nothing less than a negative argument to the effect that the naturalistic project with respect to consciousness will not succeed.
If what is at issue is the limits of the naturalist project, why is
the debate so often construed as a metaphysical debate rather than a
debate about the limits of inquiry? In answer to this question, we
need to sharply divorce the background metaphysical framework within
which the problems of philosophy of mind find their expression, and
the problems themselves. Physicalism is the background metaphysical
assumption against which the problems of philosophy of mind are posed
and discussed. Given that assumption, the question of the limits of
the naturalistic project just is the question of whether
there can be experience in a world that is totally
physical. Nevertheless, when properly understood, the problems that
philosophers of mind are interested in are not with the framework
themselves, and to that extent are not metaphysical. Thus, the common
phrase ‘metaphysics of mind’ is misleading.
The first thing to say when considering the truth of physicalism is that we live in an overwhelmingly physicalist or materialist intellectual culture. The result is that, as things currently stand, the standards of argumentation required to persuade someone of the truth of physicalism are much lower than the standards required to persuade someone of its negation. (The point here is a perfectly general one: if you already believe or want something to be true, you are likely to accept fairly low standards of argumentation for its truth.)
However, while it might be difficult to assess dispassionately the arguments for or against physicalism, this is still something we should endeavor to do. Here I will review two arguments that are commonly thought to establish the truth of physicalism. What unites the arguments is that each takes something from the physicalist world-picture which we considered previously and tries to establish the metaphysical claim that everything supervenes on the physical.
The first argument is (what I will call) The Argument from Causal Closure. The first premise of this argument is the thesis of the Causal Closure of the Physical -- that is, the thesis that every event which has a cause has a physical cause. The second premise is that mental events cause physical events -- for example we normally think that events such wanting to raise your arm (a mental event) cause events such as the raising of your arm (a physical event). The third premise of the argument is a principle of causation that is often called the exclusion principle (Kim 1993, Yablo 1992). The correct formulation of the exclusion principle is a matter of some controversy but a formulation that is both simple and plausible is the following:
Exclusion PrincipleThe conclusion of the argument is the mental events are supervenient on physical events, or more briefly that physicalism is true. For of course, if the thesis of Causal Closure is true then behavioral events have physical causes, and if mental events also cause behavioral events, then they must supervene on the physical if the exclusion principle is true.
If an event e causes event e*, then there is no event e# such that e# is non-supervenient on e and e# causes e*.
The Argument from Causal Closure is perhaps the dominant argument for physicalism in the literature today. But it is somewhat unclear whether it is successful. The most promising response for the anti-physicalist is to reject the second premise and to adopt a version of what is called epiphenomenalism, the view that mental events are caused by, and yet do not cause, physical events. The argument against this position is usually epistemological: if pains don't cause pain behavior how can it be that your telling me that you are in pain gives me any reason for supposing you are? It might seem that epiphenomenalists are in trouble here, but as a number of recent philosophers have argued, the issues here are very far from being settled (Chalmers 1996, Hyslop 1999). The crucial point is that the causal theory of evidence is open to serious counterexamples so it is unclear that it can be used against epiphenomenalism effectively.
A different sort of response is to reject the causal principles on which the argument is based. As against the exclusion principle, for example, it is often pointed out that certain events are overdetermined. The classic example is the firing squad: both the firing by soldier A and by soldier B caused the prisoner's death but since these are distinct firings, the exclusion principle is false. However, while this line of response is suggestive, it is in fact rather limited. It is true that the case of the firing squad represents an exception to the exclusion principle -- an exception that the principle must be emended to accommodate. But is difficult to believe that it represents an exception that can be widespread. A more searching response is to reject the very idea of causal closure on the grounds, perhaps, that (as Bertrand Russell (1917) famously argued) causation plays no role in a mature portrayal of the world. Once again, however, the promise of this response is more imagined than real. While it is true that many sciences do not explicitly use the notion of causation, it is extremely unlikely that they do not imply that various causal claims are true.
The second argument for physicalism is (what I will call) The Argument from Methodological Naturalism. The first premise of this argument is that it is rational to be guided in one's metaphysical commitments by the methods of natural science. Lying behind this premise are the arguments of Quine and others that metaphysics should not be approached in a way that is distinct from the sciences but should rather be thought of as continuous with it. The second premise of the argument is that, as a matter of fact, the metaphysical picture of the world that one is led to by the methods of natural science is physicalism. The conclusion is that it is rational to believe physicalism, or, more briefly that physicalism is true.
The Argument from Methodological Naturalism has received somewhat less attention in the literature than the Argument from Causal Closure. But it seems just as persuasive -- in fact, rather more so. For how might one respond? One possibility is to reject its first premise. But this is not something that most people are attracted to (or at least are attracted to explicitly.)
The other possibility is to reject its second premise. However, once
it is appreciated what physicalism is -- and, more important, what
it is not -- it is not terribly clear what this would amount to or
what the motivation for it would be. In the first place, our earlier
discussion shows that physicalism is not inconsistent with
explanatory autonomy of the various sciences, so that one should not
reject physicalism merely because one can't see how to reduce
those sciences to others. In the second place, while it is perfectly
true that there are examples of non-physicalist approaches to the
world -- vitalism in biology is perhaps the best example -- this is
beside the point. The second premise of the Argument from
Methodological Naturalism does not deny that other views are
possible, it simply says that physicalism is the most likely view at
the moment. Finally, one might be inclined to appeal to arguments
such as the knowledge argument to show that physicalism is false, and
hence that methodological naturalism could not show that physicalism
is false. However, this suggestion represents a sort of confusion
about the knowledge argument. As we saw above, if successful the
knowledge argument suggests, not simply that physicalism is false but
that any approach to the world that is compatible with methodological
naturalism is false. But if that is so, it is mistaken to suppose
that the knowledge argument gives one any reason to endorse
anti-physicalism if that is supposed to be a position compatible with
First, a priori and a posteriori physicalism. As we have seen, the distinction between a posteriori and a priori is a crucial one in a number of respects. If a posteriori physicalism can be made out, then we have potential answers to both the qualia problem and the intentionality problem. In addition, we have an interpretation of emergentism. On the other hand, it is unclear if the notion is at the end of the day coherent.
Second, the relation between the theory-conception and the object-conception of the physical. As we have also seen, this distinction is an important one in that it allows us to answer the knowledge argument without appealing to the non-derivation view of the necessary a posteriori. On the other hand, the distinction is also controversial in a number of respects.
Finally, the relation between objectivity and physicalism. As we have seen Nagel and Williams both think that objectivity is a presupposition of the methodological naturalism that so many contemporary philosophers find attractive. But if that is right there is no point developing a version of physicalism -- or any approach to the world -- that rejects it.