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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
What are the grounds of parenthood? What is it that makes someone a parent? This question has been given extra urgency by new social arrangements and developments in reproductive technology, such as surrogacy, gamete donation, and cloning.
Are there any procreative rights? If so, what are they? Are they claim-rights or liberty-rights? What, if anything, limits them?
What is the relationship between parental rights and responsibilities and procreative rights and responsibilities?
When is it morally permissible to procreate?Although these questions cover most of the recent discussion of parenthood and procreation, they don't exhaust it. An additional question that should probably receive more attention than it does concerns the scope of parental rights and responsibilities. What does parenting involve? What should parents be allowed to do/not do? What does being a good parent require? Although a full account of parenthood should address these issues we will say little about them here.
We can distinguish four approaches to parenthood: genetic accounts, gestational accounts, intentional (or voluntaristic) accounts, and causal accounts. Some authors hold monistic versions of these accounts, according to which only one of these properties generates parental rights and responsibilities. Other authors hold pluralistic accounts of parenthood, according to which more than one of these relations -- and quite possibly each of the four relations -- can generate parental rights and responsibilities.
These accounts are accounts of what we might call the acquisition of natural parenthood: they are not intended to show how adoptive parents acquire their status as parents (although both the intentional and causal accounts could easily be extended to cover social or adoptive parents). It's plausible to suppose that natural parenthood and adoptive parenthood have distinct grounds. This, of course, does not mean that adoptive parents are only quasi or ersatz parents.
At first sight the genetic account may appear to be inconsistent with our attitudes to sperm and egg (gamete) donation (see Macklin 1996). Gamete donors are genetic parents, but they don't acquire the rights and responsibilities of parenthood. But in fact it's not clear that there is any inconsistency here at all. Our unwillingness to attribute parental rights and responsibilities to gamete donors could reflect the view that they have alienated (or perhaps transferred) their (potential) parental status, rather than that direct genetic derivation doesn't generate parental status. Some support for this view can be found in the fact that in most jurisdictions gamete donors must waive any parental claim they might have over their genetic offspring.
A better objection to the genetic account involves the case of the misplaced sperm:
Bruce is about to undergo some risky medical treatment, and has placed some of his sperm in a sperm-bank in case he needs it at a later date. Through a bureaucratic mishap Bruce's sperm is swapped with that of a sperm-donor, and is used by Bessie to produce a child. Does Bruce acquire parental rights and responsibilities over Bessie's child?
Intuitions vary here, but despite legal precedents to the contrary (Guardian Weekly 2002), there is at least some pull towards denying that Bruce's genetic relation to Bessie's child gives him any parental claim over it. (Arguably, this is stronger with respect to parental responsibilities than parental rights.)
What arguments have been given for the genetic account of parenthood? Hall (1999) defends the genetic account by appeal to the Lockean notion of self-ownership. Since the genetic parents own the genetic material from which the child is constituted, it follows that they have a prima facie parental claim to the child. There are a number of problems with this line of argument (see Kolers and Bayne 2001). First, it is in danger of subsuming parental relations under property relations, in that it attempts to establish a claim about parenthood from premises that involve claims about ownership. Although the parental relation has been (and sometimes still is, see Engelhardt 1996) conceived in proprietary terms, there are good reasons for not viewing it in this light. (For one thing, the scope of parental rights and responsibilities is very different from the scope of rights and responsibilities that tend to accompany property relations.) A second problem with the argument is the fact that taking self-ownership seriously entails that children own themselves, and this surely defeats any proprietary claim that their parents might have over them (Archard 1993). Third, it's not obvious that genetic parents do provide the material from which the child is constituted. The bulk of the matter from which the child is formed derives from the gestational mother, not the genetic parents. Of course, it is the child's genetic make-up -- derived from its genetic parents -- that structures that matter, but to argue for the priority of the genetic contribution over the gestational contribution is to argue for the priority of form over matter, and it's not obvious that this can be done.
Other arguments for the genetic account derive from the consideration of paternity: if direct genetic derivation isn't sufficient for parenthood it's hard to see how men could become fathers of newborns. Attention to fathers has been most salient in the literatures on overturned adoptions and what is usually, though controversially, called “surrogacy”. Several recent legal cases have overturned adoptions on the grounds that the estranged father, unidentified at the time of birth, has returned to claim the child. Supporters of these decisions endorse the view that unalienated genetic claims to children can override months or even years of rearing by the adoptive parents, as well as the earlier failure of the father to claim the child. Similarly, in surrogacy cases, many writers have defended the view (or simply assumed what seemed obvious) that a genetic father may indeed have his own child by contracting with a surrogate mother. This view entails a geneticist account of parenthood, at least as applied to fathers. Whether or not the attention to paternal claims implies a genetic account of parenthood, it has been the basis of criticisms of the gestational account.
It is often argued that common-law reflects a commitment to gestationalism, in that the husband of the gestational mother is presumed to be the father of the child. It is unclear whether this interpretation of the law can be sustained. Arguably, the common-law presumption is based on the importance of preserving children from the erstwhile stigma of illegitimacy, rather than any deep commitment to a gestational account of parenthood.
But this issue does raise a central problem for the gestational account, which we have called the “paternity” problem (Bayne and Kolers 2003): If gestation is necessary for parenthood, how can men become fathers? Some gestationalists bite the bullet here. According to Barbara Katz Rothman, “if men want to have children, they will either have to develop the technology that enables them to become pregnant … or have children through their relationships with women” (1989: 257). As we noted a moment ago, this claim seems deeply counter-intuitive to most.
Two sorts of arguments have been given for gestationalism. One line of argument is consequentialist: since the gestational mother, unlike the genetic mother, is guaranteed to be identifiable at birth (see e.g. Annas 1984; Charo 1990), it is in the best interests of the child that the gestational mother be regarded as the mother. Even if the consequentialist orientation of this argument is accepted, it seems to support pluralistic rather than monistic versions of gestationalism. If one wants to ensure that children enter the world ensconced in a network of people who have an interest in, and responsibilities for, their welfare, one wouldn't want to endorse gestationalism at the expense of geneticism.
A second line of argument appeals to the unique relationship between gestational mother and child. This relationship has a number of facets. First, the mother and fetus are physically related. The fetus is inside -- and perhaps even part of -- the mother's body; it is also physically dependent on the mother in a way that it isn't dependent on anyone else (including its genetic parents). Second, the mother typically invests a substantial amount of effort -- what we might call sweat equity -- into the child. In Narayan's words, a gestational mother typically undergoes “considerable discomfort, effort, and risk in the course of pregnancy and childbirth” (Narayan 1999: 81). Third, and more controversially, gestation is a process that can foster emotional and affective bonds. It seems plausible to factor the relationship between gestational mother and child into an account of parenthood, but it's an open question whether the nature of this relationship is such as to give the gestational mother a unique claim to parenthood.
Intentionalists motivate their position by appeal to cases of the following kind (see Hill 1991: 358f.). The Smiths wish to have a child “of their own.” They screen egg and sperm donors and find donors who satisfy their requirements. They then select a gestational mother, who carries the fetus and then hands it over to the couple after the child is born. Intentionalists argue that the commissioning couple, who “carefully and intentionally orchestrated the procreational act, bringing together all the necessary components with the intention of creating a unique individual whom they intend to raise as their own” (Hill 1991: 359) should be regarded as having the primary rights and responsibilities for the child.
One of the attractions of intentionalism is that it promises to explain our intuitions about the case of the misplaced sperm (see 1.1). Bruce lacks a parental relation to Bessie's child because he didn't intentionally bring the child into existence -- Bessie did. Another feature of intentionalism that many find attractive is its agreement with a voluntaristic view of the ground of responsibilities.
Despite the obvious attractions of an intentional account it faces a number of acute difficulties. Whatever the prospects of an intentional account of parenthood, it's hard to see how an intentional account of familial relations in general could be correct. As the saying goes, you can choose your friends but not your family. Even if duties of parents to their children can be shown to have a voluntary basis, it doesn't look as though the duties that siblings have to each other, or that children have to their parents, can be reconciled with a voluntaristic conception of the basis of obligations (see Rachels 1989).
A second objection to intentionalism concerns the exact content of the intentions that are supposed to ground parenthood. Consider a case in which a couple conceives by accident and then form intentions to give up the baby for adoption rather than rear it. This intention endures until 15 minutes after birth, at which point they change their minds and decide to rear the child after all. Is it plausible that for the first 15 minutes of the child's life, they are no more its parents than anyone else? Surely not. Arguably cases like this undermine monistic versions of intentionalism according to which intentions to procreate or nurture are necessary for parenthood. However, they don't undermine pluralistic intentionalism, according to which the intentions to bring a child into the world that one will then raise are sufficient, but not necessary, for parenthood.
The causal account differs from intentionalism in that one can cause something without intending to bring it about. Indeed, one can cause a certain state of affairs even when one is unaware that one's actions could have such an effect. One needn't have grasped the connection between sexual intercourse and pregnancy in order to be the cause of a child's existence.
One of the attractions of causalism is its promise to account for the plausibility of genetic, gestational and intentional accounts of parenthood. Both genetic and gestational relationships obviously contribute to causing the child to exist, and arguably, this is what makes each kind of relationship crucial to ascriptions of parenthood. And, in the sort of case that intentionalists appeal to, the commissioning couple might be regarded as the (or at least a) cause of the child's existence. Looked at in this light, causalism offers to provide a limited validation of its competitors.
But causal accounts face two tricky questions: what exactly is meant by causation in this context, and what implications does the causal account have? It seems clear that ‘but-for’ causation doesn't provide a suitable ground of parenthood -- if it wasn't for the actions of Julius Caesar Britney Spears would not have been conceived or born, but Julius Caesar is obviously not the father of Ms. Spears -- but it's unclear what notion of causation a causal theorist should adopt (Blustein 1997). Even with a satisfactory account of causation in hand it may be unclear who the account ascribes parenthood to in any particular case. This problem need not constitute a decisive objection to causal accounts, but it does suggest that such accounts cannot be appealed to in order to resolve hard cases.
One view, which seems plausible on its face, is that a person who clones herself (Source) has found an alternative means of reproduction (Robertson 1999). But this view does not straightforwardly follow from any account of parenthood we have seen. On a genetic view of parenthood, Source's clone is not her daughter, but her sister -- for the clone, like Source, is directly genetically derived from Source's parents (Lewontin 1999). In this respect cloning seems to infringe on reproductive freedom: may Source create further children for her parents without consulting them? Does she thereby give her parents new responsibilities or rights? Don't they have a right to decide how many children they have, and when?
On the other hand, a gestational account of parenthood would say that the clone is the child of whoever gestated it. If Source gestates her own clone, then she would be its mother, even though genetically she is its sister. (Gestationalism would thus be pushed toward nongenetic accounts of all kin relationships, not merely parenthood.) If someone else gestates the clone, then that person is its mother, and the clone is not (morally speaking) related in any way to Source or her parents.
On intentionalism and causalism, much depends on the account of intentions or causation that is asserted. If Source agrees to be cloned (or donates her cells for experimentation) but is uninterested in the outcome, then intentionalism would regard neither Source nor her parents as parents of the clone; only the lab where the child was created would be its “parent.” Similarly, depending on the form of causalism, Source may or may not be causally implicated in the right sort of way with the creation of a new generation.
Given the accounts of parenthood on offer, then, it is not at all clear that cloning constitutes a new form of reproduction at all; only geneticism must regard it as such. Even if cloning is a new form of reproduction, however, it is not clear whether cloning constitutes an increase or an infringement of reproductive rights.
If such a right exists, however, it is extremely problematic and complex. Its complexity is accentuated by the difficulty of understanding “autonomy,” particularly in a context -- procreation -- that is highly politicized, the object of deep and abiding values, and close to the core of persons' identity. It may be insufficient to understand autonomy in a “negative” sense, that is, in terms of simply being left alone. In the first place, the debates that have given rise to talk of “reproductive autonomy” -- debates over technological assistance, for the most part -- require infrastructures if they are to be available, and so autonomy is possible only when state or other organizations can underwrite institutions such as sperm banks or surrogacy contracts, which make such autonomy possible. Second, reproductive choices call into question why people want what they want. In a “pro-natalist” culture with a genetic understanding of heredity and character, it is not at all surprising that many people prefer technologically assisted fertility treatments to adoption (and to not having children at all); but it is not clear that this preference can be understood as a reflective, free choice. So a policy of simply allowing people to pursue whatever they can afford does not obviously promote autonomy. Finally, if equality matters, then the same arguments that support a governmental “hands-off” policy on reproduction also support a “hands-on” policy to procure fertility assistance for those less able to afford it. For this reason, when we refer to “libertarian liberals” below, we do not mean to equate this orientation with a “neo-Lockean” or “property-rights libertarian” approach in political philosophy. (The same holds for those we call “conservatives,” among whose members we number Wendell Berry, even though he is not plausibly regarded as a conservative in the political realm.)
This anti-statist starting point of reproductive conservatism does not lead to libertarianism, however, because conservatives tend to see the problem with the above abuses not primarily as the violation of individual autonomy, but as the intrusion of politics, economics, and individualism into the realm of families and communities. Thus conservatives may oppose some (putative) aspects of reproductive autonomy as much, and for the same reasons, as they oppose reproductive biotechnology. Many conservatives believe that abortion is usually immoral and should be illegal, and, while few outside theological circles any longer oppose the freedom of married heterosexual couples to use contraception (at their own expense), conservatives, whether religiously oriented or not, tend to see this as the limit to reproductive autonomy (Marquis 1989; Pope Paul VI 1968). Conservatives thus typically oppose access to reproductive assistance such as surrogacy. In sum, conservatives believe there is no right to reproductive autonomy, because reproductive choices gain their meaning and value from their communal context.
The second, libertarian-liberal school, regards itself as diametrically opposed to the conservative school. The lodestars of the libertarian-liberal school are the twin values of equality and autonomy (or the “harm principle”). (Dworkin 1993, Mill 1998) Authors such as John Harris assume first that any behavior is permissible provided it does not harm others; and second, that access to artificial means of reproduction ought to be universal because any restrictions would constitute unequal treatment of those who cannot conceive through sexual intercourse (whether due to infertility or because the person(s) in question don't form a “traditional” family) (Harris 1998a).
Particular concerns of the libertarian-liberal school have been to show that assumptions about the inherent wrongness of a number of innovative procedures are not borne out. In particular, libertarian-liberals have argued forcefully that conservative opposition to cloning, genetic selection, surrogacy, and even the harvest of fetal ovarian tissue is based in undefended traditionalism (Harris 1998a; cf. Glover 1998, Buchanan et al. 2000, chap. 2). Thus libertarian-liberals hold that there is a right to reproductive autonomy which encompasses access to whatever means are required provided that all parties freely consent, and that constraints on any behavior (or freely contracted service) are guilty until proven innocent.
Some critics of the libertarian-liberal school compose what might be called the policy-liberal school. Policy liberals share libertarian-liberal values of autonomy and equality, and as a result also treat market exchanges and consensual services as innocent until proven guilty. At the same time, however, policy liberals attend not only to the effects of particular choices, but to the impact of institutionalizing practices such as genetic selection, IVF, etc., and to the role of these practices within a broader society that aims to achieve and maintain broadly liberal background institutions (Rawls 1999; Glover et al. 1989; Buchanan et al. 2000). Institutionalization brings to the fore at least three distinct concerns that libertarian-liberals play down: the effects of large numbers; the incentives that policies create; and opportunity costs. Consider these in order, briefly.
If a large number of people all make similar reproductive choices, their actions may have unintended effects that may or may not be desirable. The far-reaching social, economic, political, environmental, and other consequences of the post-war “baby boom” illustrate this point clearly.
Policies create incentives not only in the population at large, but also in the medical profession and in the economy. An incentive is a reward or punishment that a person can achieve, and knows in advance that she can achieve, by taking some voluntary action. Some incentives are “perverse,” in that they reward people for doing what (for whatever reason) it is undesirable that they do (Pogge 1992). Medical research provides an obvious example of perverse incentives. Pharmaceutical research companies spend far more money on Viagra and other fertility drugs than on vaccines or cures for malaria, sleeping sickness, and other eliminable diseases that primarily affect poor people (United Nations Development Program 1999). In a context of market-based mechanisms for distributing medical goods and services, expanding the range of permissible procreative treatments and services available to those who can pay gives pharmaceutical companies an incentive to ignore millions of deaths among the world's poor, and instead to serve the procreative desires of the world's wealthy.
This example of a perverse incentive also demonstrates an opportunity cost. Assuming that money, person-hours, and laboratory space are finite, devoting these resources to non-lifesaving procedures takes away from the resources that can be allotted to research on and delivery of lifesaving treatments.
Because of their institutional focus, many policy liberals are more cautious about reproductive autonomy than libertarian liberals. Policy liberals have endorsed significant restrictions that libertarian liberals would reject. For instance, Hugh LaFollette endorses a program for licensing all parents, adoptive or otherwise (LaFollette 1982). In fact, as a general rule, policy liberals endorse a wide variety of arguably coercive population policies (O'Neill 1979; Bayles 1979). (See below for further discussion.)
In conclusion, policy liberals hold that procreative autonomy is one among many important forms of autonomy that societies ought to promote and protect. These forms of autonomy may conflict among themselves, and may also conflict with the state's legitimate (or compulsory) ends such as public-goods provision and compliance with national constitutions and international law. Talk of rights, from a policy liberal standpoint, is appropriate only within a nexus of liberties, claims, powers, and ends. Thus while policy liberals would typically defend the concept of a right to procreative autonomy, they would be much more cagey than their libertarian cousins about what such a right entails in different contexts.
The final major school on the right to procreative autonomy comprehends a variety of views that share a feminist commitment to opposing patriarchy and promoting persons' (and particularly women's) abilities to determine the shape of their own lives ? including sexuality and the number and spacing of their children. While self-described feminists can be found in each of the schools discussed above, many feminist writers criticize each of these schools while fashioning independent, anti-patriarchal positions that combine some of these schools' strengths.
The feminist concern to enable women to shape their own lives and control their bodies suggests an initial sympathy with the libertarian-liberals' focus on autonomy and equality. But unlike liberals, many feminists are skeptical of the reproductive biotechnology establishment, which remains preponderantly white, upper-middle class, male, and tied to large corporations. (Hence feminists might charge that, rather than the diametric opposite of communitarian conservatism, libertarian liberalism is in fact another variety of communitarian conservatism.) (Corea, 1985, 1988; Rothman 1989). When this establishment represents itself as empowering women, many feminists charge that this putative empowerment is the opposite: it conscripts poorer women into service for men and women who are usually wealthier; it creates new expectations that may subtly coerce women to pursue fertility treatments or other medical interventions; and it inevitably contains the cultural, economic, sexist, and racist biases of the society at large (Brazier 1998). Among many examples that support this judgment is the observation that many laws that purportedly embody a right to reproduce in fact give rights not to women (or men, for that matter), but to physicians (Brazier 1998).
Some feminist writers have also raised the concern that any putative “right to procreate” threatens to give men power over women. In addition to empowering the mostly male scientific establishment, a right to procreate could empower a man to prevent his erstwhile partner from aborting her pregnancy (Overall 1993; Corea 1995). Thus the importance of a right not to procreate has leads many feminists to place the various strands of procreative autonomy within a nexus of interests.
But feminism should not therefore be conflated with policy liberalism. Feminist work on procreative autonomy tends to emphasize at least two important issues that policy liberals ignore or play down. First, many feminists examine the rhetoric surrounding reproductive biotechnology and other services, concerned that this rhetoric tends to commodify women's bodies, devalue women's role in reproduction, and treat women as mere means rather than ends in themselves. For instance, some reproductive services entail so-called “womb rental,” “egg harvesting,” or “surrogate motherhood.” The terminology in each of these strikes many writers as objectifying or dehumanizing women (Rothman 1988). (Conservatives such as Meilaender (1987) and Kass (1972) share this concern.) Radical feminists such as Gena Corea draw a sharp distinction between what the “pharmacracy” sees and what women experience, arguing that the reproductive biotechnology establishment relies on a distorted and stereotyped picture of the nature, desires, and needs of women, as well as the success rate of the technologies it purveys (Corea 1985; Brazier 1998). To be sure, even if these charges are accurate, their accuracy is historically contingent; it is conceivable that reproductive technologies could be made available without creating such a “pharmacracy.” Nonetheless it is important to see how sweeping an alteration of the current gender system would have to be before the “pharmacracy” disappeared.
Second, as we have seen, many feminists adopt a more complex and skeptical conception of autonomy than do liberals. Actions that seem consensual, on this view, may actually involve subtle but powerful practices of coercion.
Thus many feminists share a commitment to the right to shape one's life and control one's body, a desire to balance procreative autonomy within a nexus of social practices that foster autonomy and equality, as well as the social supports necessary for the genuine exercise of that autonomy. But also common among feminists is a deep skepticism about reproductive biotechnology and the scientific/corporate establishment devoted to it. It seems fair to say that, at least among feminists who endorse talk of rights, feminists support a right to procreative autonomy; but this support is compatible with denying that there is a right to procreate or reproduce as such, and thus, that there are claim-rights to access fertility treatments or other reproductive aids that biotechnology might devise. Indeed, the abortion debate has demonstrated that the liberty not to procreate is no less important than the liberty to procreate.
But it is not at all settled whether such contracts ought to be legal and, if so, enforceable. Apart from concerns about what sorts of things should be immune from commodification (Radin 1996, Glover et al. 1989), the central point of contention is whether anyone who undertakes a contractual obligation to surrender custody of one or more future children can do so autonomously. Reproduction is, for many, a life-changing process, and arguably one cannot know in advance how it may change one's own attitudes. In several documented cases, gestational surrogate mothers as well as gamete donors have had a change of heart over the course of pregnancy and childbirth (In re Baby M). Some writers argue on such grounds that not only should all surrogacy contracts be unenforceable, they should also be illegal (Dodds and Jones 1989; see Purdy 1989 and Oakley 1992 for a response). Although it is rarely noted, such arguments may have implications for the morality of gamete donation, in that the gamete donor who has second thoughts is in some ways analogous to the surrogate mother who has second thoughts. Gena Corea (1985) discusses a case in which a sperm donor had a change of heart and sought visitation rights in court.
Some libertarian liberals, like libertarians in the theory of justice (as well as communitarian conservatives), would balk at the idea that public funds should be coercively collected through taxation for the purpose of guaranteeing universal access to assisted reproduction. But if libertarian liberals take this line, they sacrifice much if not all of the bite of their argument for the widespread availability of assisted reproduction, namely, treating all persons equally, whether or not they are able to reproduce within “traditional” family frameworks. Moreover, coercively taxed social resources must already be spent to enforce contracts and settle disputes in court. Thus some libertarian liberals adopt the mantle of egalitarian liberalism in the theory of justice to hold that public funds should, in fact, be spent on universal access to assisted reproduction (Harris 1998). The same holds for ending pregnancies. Those who believe that access to abortion is an important basis of human freedom should not tolerate its being a mere liberty right, but should rather be willing to use public funds to guarantee access to all. (As Wicclair (2000) notes in a context of moral conflict over abortion, such a commitment might also require an account of conscientious objection by physicians.)
Parenthood is usually thought to bring with it both rights and responsibilities. Many writers regard the rights, such as they are, as contingent on fulfillment of the responsibilities (Archard 1990). As attractive as this position is, it would seem to deny that parents have custodial rights, that is, rights to carry out certain obligations to the best of their ability and as they see fit (Page 1984). Arguably, being a parent does involve the possession of such rights. In this respect parenthood is like holding political office -- whoever wins the election has the right to be required to perform the duties attendant on the office. That such a right is defeasible (through impeachment, custody decisions, or declarations of unfitness) does not show that it does not exist and normally attach to parents.
One problem with the custodial-rights approach is that it seems to ignore the contingency of particular kinship patterns such as the “nuclear family” common in contemporary western societies (Blustein 1982). A society that reared children communally, for instance, would deny that parents have custodial rights, so a custodial-rights view would either have to condemn such practices, or accept its own cultural limitations. In contrast, a view that endorsed the abstract principle “parental rights are grounded in parental obligations” immediately provides a framework for assessing the justifiability of communal childrearing systems whether within western culture or in other cultures.
Another problem with the custodial-rights approach is that it requires a robust, and relatively monistic, account of the nature of parenthood (see section I above). If parents have, in the first instance, custodial rights to their children, then either such rights must be distributed among all parents, or parenthood must be a comparatively monistic phenomenon, privileging genetic, gestational, or intentional ties over all others.
One concern with O'Neill's view is the oddness surrounding the idea that one can have a right to do x and y, but no right to do x, even though x is a proper subset of x and y. A second concern is that the requirement of giving a child an open future, or a normal life for the society at the time, threatens to bring inequality through the back door. For instance, in a society where poor parents are unable to ensure their children access to adequate nutrition or education, O'Neill seems forced to deny these parents the right to procreate. As a policy liberal, though, O'Neill may then counter with a broader conception of social justice.
Questions about the morality of reproduction can take a variety of forms, including (but not limited to) questions about whether to: conceive a child that one knows will have a certain type of condition; conceive a child that one knows has a risk of a certain type of condition; bring a certain child to term; engage in genetic manipulation (and if so, at what point in the reproductive process); and so on. For the most part, we will abstract away from these questions here, and focus on some of the broader philosophical issues. Our discussion will also be restricted to moral issues rather than legal ones. We therefore assume throughout that reproduction is fully voluntary and informed -- that is, neither coerced nor accidental.
Indirect personal interests clearly have a bearing on the morality of reproduction. It seems clearly wrong to have a child that one knows in advance will be born with a highly infectious fatal disease. It also seems wrong to have a child in a situation in which everyone in the community is near death from starvation.
A second set of interests that ought to be taken into account in decisions about reproduction involve those of the child who will be created. We can call these direct personal interests. Direct personal interests are most obviously relevant in situations in which the individual created would be born with a life that was so miserable as to be not worth living. Whether or not there are such lives -- and if so, which lives merit such a description -- is controversial, but it is not unreasonable to suppose that a life can be so nasty, brutish, and short that it is of no benefit to the individual who endures it. We might say that certain possible individuals have an interest in not being brought into existence (see McMahon 1998, Roberts 1998).
Marie is taking a drug that she knows will cause a birth defect -- say, a withered arm -- in any child that she conceives (call this child “Amy”). In 3 months this drug will have passed from her body, and she will be able to conceive a child free from this defect (call this child “Sophie”). Intuitively, Marie does something wrong in deciding to have Amy rather than Sophie.
It is unclear how we can capture the wrongness of Marie's actions by appeal only to personal interests. Indirect personal interests don't seem to explain why it would be wrong to bring Amy into the world: she is wanted; her birth doesn't expose her community to an unacceptable threat (except for potential “costs” based in aggregate communal welfare or empathy, but these hardly seem analogous to infectious disease). Nor do direct personal interests seem to explain why Marie acts wrongly. Intuitively, Amy isn't wronged by being created, for she has a life worth living. Amy isn't made worse off by Marie's actions, for had Marie waited another three months before conceiving she would have given birth to a different child (Sophie) instead of Amy (hence the non-identity problem).
Non-identity cases of this kind are called “same-number” cases because they comparing situations which contain the same number of individuals. But other versions of the non-identity problem involve different-number (or non-comparative) choices:
Sally has a genetic condition that she knows will cause any child she conceives to be born with moderate retardation. Despite knowing this fact, Sally deliberately conceives and gives birth to a moderately retarded child, George.
Does Sally do something wrong in conceiving and giving birth to George? Many are inclined to think that she does. Yet, again, it is not obvious how we can cash out the wrongness of Sally's actions in either indirect or direct personal interests.
Few of those who have written on the non-identity problem have been prepared to bite the bullet and hold that Marie does nothing wrong in deciding to have Amy rather than Sophie, or that Sally does something wrong in reproducing at all. Broadly speaking, we can group responses to these cases into three classes: (i) appeals to indirect personal interests; (ii) appeals to direct personal interests; and (iii) appeals to impersonal interests. We take these responses in this order.
At first sight it is difficult to see how Marie might have harmed or wronged Amy: Amy hasn't been made worse off than she was (for she wasn't), nor has she been made worse off than she would have been (for had Marie not conceived Amy she wouldn't have been). Feinberg (1992) compares such situations with situations in which someone is harmed (e.g their leg is broken) in the course of being saved from an even greater harm (e.g. death). In both cases an evil or harm is justified in virtue of the fact that it is a necessary condition of a greater good -- in the one case saving a person's life, in the other case bringing a life into existence.
Shiffrin (1999), however, holds that harming someone to save them from a greater harm is morally distinct from harming them to impose a “pure benefit” on them. A pure benefit is a benefit that is just a good and is not also a removal from or prevention of harm. Shiffrin claims, not implausibly, that we have serious qualms about harming someone without their consent in order to secure a great pure benefit for them, even when we can be sure that they would regard the pure benefit as far outweighing the harm in question (see also Steinbock and McClamrock 1994).
Shiffrin drives a wedge into Feinberg's analogy but her argument raises questions of its own. First, one might challenge the assumption that life is a pure benefit. Even if we assume that Amy's life would be worth living, creating her would be a benefit only on a rather peculiar conception of what “benefit” entails. Amy is not better off than she otherwise would have been, for there is no way that she otherwise would have been. Furthermore, the argument may prove too much. If one is never justified in harming someone (without their consent) in order to impose a pure benefit on them, and if existence always involves some form of harm, then it must always be wrong to bring someone into existence. Although this view has been ably defended (see Benatar1997) it is deeply counter-intuitive and few would find it an acceptable price to pay for a solution to the non-identity problem.
One might think that when faced with the choice of creating one of two possible individuals, one should create the individual that will live the best life. After all, if one should want what's best for one's children, shouldn't one want one's children to be as good as they can be (see Savulescu 2001)? But it's doubtful that common-sense morality recognizes an obligation to “optimize” when it comes to children. Suppose that Marie would have a normal child right now, but if she waits three months she'll be able to take advantage of a new drug that will ensure that her child will have perfect pitch and 20-20 vision. Does Marie do something in wrong in not waiting? It's not so clear. The moral pressure to optimize is thus not strong, if it exists at all. (Indeed, the debate over genetic manipulation or “designer babies” shows that there is no consensus that it is even permissible to optimize, let alone obligatory.)
More plausible may be a negative version of this view, defended by John Harris (1998a) and Dan Brock (1995). Harris asserts “a strong moral obligation to prevent preventable harm and suffering and that this obligation applies equally to curing disease and injury and to preventing the avoidable creation of people who will have disease or injury” (Harris 1998a: 31). Unfortunately Harris's principle seems to prove too much, implying that reproduction is always immoral, for we are all subject to disease, injury, and limited opportunity. We suspect that Harris would reject this conclusion, but it is unclear how he can avoid it.
A closely related approach to the non-identity problem appeals to a principle of good (or responsible or loving) parenting. According to Michael Freeman, "The principle of parental responsibility requires that individuals should desist from having children unless certain minimum conditions can be satisfied. Responsible parents want their children to have good and fulfilling lives" (1997: 180). Freeman goes on to claim that the principle of parental responsibility entails that the very young and very old should not become parents (although he fails to say how young is too young and how old too old). Similarly, Laura Purdy claims that one shouldn't reproduce unless one can ensure that one's children will have a decent life, where she claims that clean water, nutritious food, safe shelter, education, and medical care are basic prerequisites for a decent life (Purdy 1995). Purdy position seems to imply that many -- and perhaps even most -- of the world's children have been wrongly brought into existence. This may in fact be true, but it is nonetheless an astonishing result.