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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Ockham led an unusually eventful life for a philosopher. As with so many medieval figures who were not prominent when they were born, we know next to nothing about the circumstances of Ockham's birth and early years, and have to estimate dates by extrapolating from known dates of events later in his life.
Ockham's life may be divided into three main periods.
Ockham was born, probably in late 1287 or early 1288, in the village of Ockham (= Oak Hamlet) in Surrey, a little to the southwest of London. He probably learned basic Latin at a village school in Ockham or nearby, but this is not certain. At an early age, somewhere between seven and thirteen, Ockham was “given” to the Franciscan order (the so called “Greyfriars”). There was no Franciscan house (called a “convent”) in the tiny village of Ockham itself; the nearest one was in London, a day's ride to the northeast. It was there that Ockham was sent.
As an educational institution, even for higher education, London Greyfriars was a distinguished place; at the time, it was second only to the full-fledged Universities of Paris and Oxford. At Greyfriars, Ockham probably got most of his “grade school” education, and then went on to do what we might think of as “high school” education in basic logic and “science” (natural philosophy), beginning around the age of fourteen.
Around 1310, when he was about 23, Ockham began his theological training. It is not certain where this training occurred. It could well have been at the London Convent, or it could have been at Oxford, where there was another Franciscan convent associated with the university. In any event, Ockham was at Oxford studying theology by at least the year 1318-19, and probably the previous year as well, when (in 1317) he began a required two-year cycle of lectures commenting on Peter Lombard's Sentences, the standard theological textbook of the day. Then, probably in 1321, Ockham returned to London Greyfriars, where he remained. Although he had taken the initial steps in the theology program at Oxford (hence his occasional nickname, the Venerabilis Inceptor, “Venerable Beginner”), Ockham did not complete the program there, and never became a fully qualified “master” of theology at Oxford. Nevertheless, London Grayfriars was an intellectually lively place, and Ockham was by no means removed from the heat of academic controversy. Among his “housemates” were two other important Franciscan thinkers of the day, Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham, both sharp critics of Ockham's views. It was in this context that Ockham wrote many of his most important philosophical and theological works.
In 1323 Ockham was called before the Franciscan province's chapter meeting, held that year in Bristol, to defend his views, which were regarded with suspicion by some of his confreres. About the same time, someone—it is not clear who—went from England to the Papal court at Avignon and charged Ockham with teaching heresy. As a result, a commission of theologians was set up to study the case. Ockham was called to Avignon in May, 1324, to answer the charges. He never went back to England.
Ockham stayed at the Franciscan convent in Avignon. It has sometimes been suggested that he was effectively under “house arrest” there, but this seems an exaggeration. On the contrary, he appears to have been free to do more or less what he wanted, although of course he did have to be “on hand” in case the investigating commission wanted to ask him questions about his writings. The investigation must not have demanded much of Ockham's own time, since he was able to work on a number of other projects while he was in Avignon, including finishing his last major theological work, the Quodlibets. It should be pointed out that, although there were some stern pronouncements that came out of the investigation of Ockham, his views were never officially condemned as heretical.
In 1327, Michael of Cesena, the Franciscan “Minister General” (the chief administrative officer of the order) likewise came to Avignon, in his case because of an emerging controversy between the Franciscans and the current Pope, John XXII, over the idea of “Apostolic poverty,” the view that Jesus and the Apostles owned no property at all of their own but, like the mendicant Franciscans, went around begging and living off the generosity of others. The Franciscans held this view, and maintained that their own practices were a special form of “imitation of Christ.” Pope John XXII rejected the doctrine, which is why Michael of Cesena was in Avignon.
Things came to a real crisis in 1328, when Michael and the Pope had a serious confrontation over the matter. As a result, Michael asked Ockham to study the question from the point of view of previous papal statements and John's own previous writings on the subject. When he did so, Ockham came to the conclusion, apparently somewhat to his own surprise, that John's view was not only wrong but outright heretical. Furthermore, the heresy was not just an honest mistake; it was stubbornly heretical, a view John maintained even after he had been shown it was wrong. As a result, Ockham argued, Pope John was not just teaching heresy, but was a heretic himself in the strongest possible sense, and had therefore effectively abdicated his papacy. In short, Pope John XXII was no pope at all!
Clearly, things had become intolerable for Ockham in Avignon.
Under cover of darkness the night of May 26, 1328, Michael of Cesena, Ockham, and a few other sympathetic Franciscans, fled Avignon and went into exile. They initially went to Italy, where Louis (Ludwig) of Bavaria, the Holy Roman Emperor, was in Pisa at the time, along with his court and retinue. The Holy Roman Emperor was engaged in a political dispute with the Papacy, and Ockham's group found refuge under his protection. On June 6, 1328, Ockham was officially excommunicated for leaving Avignon without permission. Around 1329, Louis returned to Munich, together with Michael, Ockham and the rest of their fugitive band. Ockham stayed there, or at any rate in areas under Imperial control, until his death. During this time, Ockham wrote exclusively on political matters. He died on April 9/10, 1347, at roughly the age of sixty.
Ockham's writings are conventionally divided into two groups: the so called “academic” writings and the “political” ones. By and large, the former were written or at least begun while Ockham was still in England, while the latter were written toward the end of Ockham's Avignon period and later, in exile. With the exception of his Dialogue, a huge political work, all are now available in modern critical editions, and many are now translated into English, in whole or in part. The academic writings are in turn divided into two groups: the “theological” works and the “philosophical” ones, although both groups are essential for any study of Ockham's philosophy.
Among Ockham's most important writings are:
Several lesser items are omitted from the above list.
Ockham is rightly regarded as one of the most significant logicians of the Middle Ages. Nevertheless, his originality and influence should not be exaggerated. For all his deserved reputation, his logical views are sometimes completely derivative and occasionally very idiosyncratic.
Logic, for Ockham, is crucial to the advancement of knowledge. In the "Prefatory Letter" to his Summa of Logic, for example, he praises it in striking language:
For logic is the most useful tool of all the arts. Without it no science can be fully known. It is not worn out by repeated use, after the manner of material tools, but rather admits of continual growth through the diligent exercise of any other science. For just as a mechanic who lacks a complete knowledge of his tool gains a fuller [knowledge] by using it, so one who is educated in the firm principles of logic, while he painstakingly devotes his labor to the other sciences, acquires at the same time a greater skill at this art.
Ockham's main logical writings consist of a series of commentaries (or “expositions”) on Aristotle's and Porphyry's own logical works, plus his own Summa of Logic, his major work in the field. His Treatise on Predestination contains an influential theory on the logic of future contingent propositions, and other works as well include occasional discussions of logical topics, notably his Quodlibets.
Ockham's Summa of Logic is divided into three parts, with the third part subdivided into four subparts. Part I divides language, in accordance with Aristotle's On Interpretation (1, 16a3-8, influenced by Boethius's interpretation), into written, spoken and mental language, with the written kind dependent on the spoken, and the spoken on mental language. Mental language, the language of thought, is thus the most primitive and basic level of language. Part I goes on to lay out a fairly detailed theory of terms, including the distinctions between (a) categorematic and syncategorematic terms, (b) abstract and concrete terms, and (c) absolute and connotative terms. Part I then concludes with a discussion of the five “predicables” from Porphyry's Isagoge, and of each of Aristotle's categories.
While Part I is about terms, Part II is about “propositions,” which are made up of terms. Part II gives a systematic and nuanced theory of truth conditions for the four traditional kinds of assertoric categorical propositions on the “Square of Opposition,” and then goes on to tensed, modal and more complicated categorical propositions, as well as a variety of “hypothetical” (molecular) propositions. The vehicle for this account of truth conditions is the semantic theory of “supposition,” which will be treated below.
If Part I is about terms and Part II about propositions made up of terms, Part III is about arguments, which are in turn made up of propositions made up of terms. As mentioned, Part III is divided into four subparts. Part III.1 treats syllogisms, including a complete theory of modal syllogistic. Part III.2 concerns demonstrative syllogisms in particular. Part III.3 is in effect Ockham's theory of consequence, although it also includes discussions of semantic paradoxes like the Liar (the so called insolubilia) and of the still little-understood disputation form known as “obligation.” Part III.4 is a discussion of fallacies.
Thus, while the Summa of Logic is not in any sense a “commentary” on Aristotle's logical writings, it nevertheless covers the traditional ground: Porphyry's Isagoge and Aristotle's Categories in Part I, On Interpretation in Part II, Prior Analytics in Part III.1, Posterior Analytics in Part III.2, Topics (and much else) in Part III.3, and finally Sophistic Refutations in Part III.4.
Part I of the Summa of Logic also introduces a number of semantic notions that play an important role throughout much of Ockham's philosophy. None of these notions is original with Ockham, although he develops them with great sophistication and employs them with skill.
The most basic such notion is “signification.” For the Middle Ages, a term “signifies” what it makes us think of. This notion of signification was unanimously accepted; although there was great dispute over what terms signified, there was agreement over the criterion. Ockham, unlike many (but no means all) other medieval logicians, held that terms do not in general signify thought, but can signify anything at all (including things not presently existing). The function of language, therefore, is not so much to communicate thoughts from one mind to another, but to convey information about the world.
In Summa of Logic I.33, Ockham acknowledges four different kinds of signification, although the third and fourth kinds are not clearly distinguished. In his first sense, a term signifies whatever things it is truly predicable of by means of a present-tensed, assertoric copula. That is, a term t signifies a thing x if and only if ‘This is a t’ is true, pointing to x. In the second sense, t signifies x if and only if ‘This is (or was, or will be, or can be) a t’ is true, pointing to x.  These first two senses of signification are together called “primary" signification.
In the third and fourth senses, terms can also be said to signify certain things they are not truly predicable of, no matter the tense or modality of the copula. For instance, the word ‘brave’ not only makes us think of brave people (whether presently existing or not); it also makes us think of the bravery in virtue of which we call them “brave.” Thus, ‘brave’ signifies and is truly predicable of brave people, but also signifies bravery, even though it is not truly predicable of bravery. (Bravery is not brave.) This kind of signification is called “secondary” signification. To a first approximation, then, we can say that what a term secondarily signifies is exactly what it signifies but does not primarily signify. Again to a first approximation, we can say that a “connotative” term is just a term that has a secondary signification, and that such a connotative term “connotes” exactly what it secondarily signifies; in short, connotation is just secondary signification.
The theory of supposition was the centerpiece of late medieval semantic theory. Supposition is not the same as signification. First of all, terms signify wherever we encounter them, whereas they have supposition only in the context of a proposition. But the differences go beyond that. Whereas signification is a psychological, cognitive relation, the theory of supposition is, at least in part, a theory of reference. For Ockham, there are three main kinds of supposition:
Personal supposition, which was the main focus, was divided into various subkinds, distinguished in terms of a theory of “descent to singulars” and “ascent from singulars.” A quick example will give the flavor: In ‘Every dog is a mammal’, ‘dog’ is said to have “confused and distributive” personal supposition insofar as
Although the mechanics of this part of supposition theory are well understood, in Ockham and in other authors, its exact purpose remains a mystery. Although at first the theory looks like an account of truth conditions for quantified propositions, it will not work for that purpose. And although the theory was sometimes used as an aid to spotting and analyzing fallacies, this was never done systematically and the theory is in any event ill suited for that purpose.
Ockham was perhaps the first person to give not just lip service to the notion of “mental language” (because Aristotle and Boethius had mentioned it), but actually to develop the notion in some detail and to put it to work for him. Written language for Ockham is “subordinated” to spoken language, and spoken language is “subordinated” to mental language. For Ockham, the terms of mental language are concepts; its propositions are mental judgments. Whereas the signification of terms in spoken and written language is purely conventional and can be changed (hence in English we say ‘dog’ whereas in Latin it is ‘canis’), the signification of terms (concepts) in mental language is established by nature once and for all. Concepts “naturally signify” what they are concepts of; this “natural signification” is thought of as a kind of representation relation, based on the fact that concepts are in some way “naturally similar” to their objects.
This arrangement provides an account of synonymy (both interlinguistic and intralinguistic) and equivocation in spoken and written language. Two terms (whether from the same or different spoken/written languages) are synonymous if and only if they are subordinated to the same concept; a single given term of spoken/written language is equivocal if and only if it is subordinated to more than one concept simultaneously.
This raises an obvious question: Is there synonymy or equivocation in mental language itself? (If there is, it will obviously have to be accounted for in some other way than for spoken/written language.) A great deal of modern secondary literature has been devoted to this question. Trentman  was the first to argue that no, there is no synonymy or equivocation in mental language. On the contrary, mental language for Ockham is a kind of lean, stripped down, “canonical” language with no frills or inessentials, a little like the “ideal languages” postulated by logical atomists in the first part of the twentieth century. Spade  likewise argued in greater detail, on both theoretical and textual grounds, that there is no synonymy or equivocation in mental language. More recently, Panaccio , Tweedale  (both on largely textual grounds), and Chalmers  (on mainly theoretical grounds) have argued the contrary case for synonymy, that Ockham did—or in any event should have — allowed for certain kinds of mental synonymy.
The situation is complicated, but it goes to the heart of much of what Ockham is up to. In order to see why, let us return briefly to the theory of connotation. Connotation was described above in terms of primary and secondary signification. But in Summa of Logic I.10, Ockham himself draws the distinction between absolute and connotative terms by means of the theory of definition.
For Ockham, there are two kinds of definitions: real definitions and nominal definitions. A real definition is somehow supposed to reveal the essential metaphysical structure of what it defines; nominal definitions do not do that. As Ockham sets it up, all connotative terms have nominal definitions, never real definitions, and absolute terms (although not all of them) have real definitions, never nominal definitions. (Some absolute terms have no definitions at all.)
As an example of a real definition, consider: ‘Man is a rational animal’ or ‘Man is a substance composed of a body and an intellective soul’. Each of these traditional definitions is correct, and each in its own way expresses the essential metaphysical structure of a human being. But notice: the two definitions do not signify (make us think of) exactly the same things. The first one makes us think of all rational things (in virtue of the first word of the definiens) plus all animals (whether rational or not, in virtue of the second word of the definiens). The second definition makes us think of, among other things, all substances (in virtue of the word ‘substance’ in the definiens), whereas the first one does not. It follows therefore that an absolute term can have several distinct real definitions that don't always signify exactly the same things. They will primarily signify—be truly predicable of—exactly the same things, since they will primarily signify just what the term they define primarily signifies. But they can also (secondarily) signify other things as well.
Nominal definitions, Ockham says, are different. Like real definitions, there can be several distinct nominal definitions of the same connotative term. But in the case of nominal definitions, all the definitions of a given term will signify exactly the same things in exactly the same ways. This is a very strong claim, and appears to mean that for Ockham all nominal definitions of a given connotative term are synonymous. Furthermore, Ockham seems to think of connotative terms as in effect a kind of shorthand abbreviation for their nominal definitions. If all this is so, then it means that not only are all the nominal definitions of a given connotative term synonymous with one another; they are also all synonymous with the term they define.
If, therefore, there is no synonymy in mental language, it follows that there will be no connotative terms in mental language either. Or, more carefully put, either there are no simple connotative terms in mental language, or else, if there are, then mental language does not have the wherewithal to formulate their (complex) nominal definitions. The latter hypothesis would seem to cripple mental language entirely. Hence the prevailing view until approximately 1990 was that for Ockham there are no simple connotative terms in mental language. There are connotative expressions there, but all of them are complex expressions that, if one wants to put it this way, can in a “degenerate” sense (as mathematicians speak of “degenerate” cases) be said to serve as their own nominal definitions. It remains that no two expressions of mental language are synonymous.
But in 1990 Claude Panaccio published a paper that showed once and for all that Ockham did hold that there are simple connotative terms in mental language. He says it explicitly and repeatedly, and in a variety of texts (just not the texts that had been previously focused on). Since that time the secondary literature seems to have gradually converged on the view that, for Ockham, there is no synonymy among simple terms in mental language, but that synonymy can occur there between simple terms and complex expressions, or between various complex expressions.
It should be emphasized that these matters are far from settled, and some of the claims above are controversial. Readers should nevertheless be aware of the issues. For much rests on them. This is because Ockham's use of connotation theory is crucial to his ontological enterprise.
For Ockham, absolute terms are a guide to ontology. Because Ockham thinks we get the absolute terms of our mental language from a direct experience of the things they signify, it follows that absolute terms are all truly predicable of (past or present) things. But connotative terms are not like that; we can and do have connotative terms for all sorts of things that have never existed — even for things that cannot exist, like (according to the medieval view) ‘chimera’ and ‘vacuum’.
Since simple connotative terms are in effect shorthand abbreviations for their nominal definitions, they can be systematically eliminated and replaced by those nominal definitions without loss of expressive power. If those nominal definitions in turn contain further connotative terms of their own, the latter can in turn be expanded into their own nominal definitions. And so on, until we arrive at a fully expanded nominal definition of the original, simple connotative term, a definition that consists only of absolute terms and of various syncategorematic expressions.
At least that seems to be the goal. What Ockham tries to do, then, is to eliminate the need for many putative entities by parsing away all talk of them via his theory of connotation. As we shall see, most of the Aristotelian categories, for example, are needless “extras” in a perfectly adequate ontology; we do not need any entities in those putative categories.
Thus the question whether there is synonymy in mental language is crucial to our understanding of the success of Ockham's overall ontological project. Since spoken or written language is semantically derivative on mental language, it is vital that we get the semantics of mental language to work out right for Ockham, or else the systematic coherence of much of what he has to say will be in jeopardy. The jury is still out.
Ockham was a nominalist, indeed he is the person whose name is perhaps most famously associated with nominalism. But nominalism means many different things:
The first two kinds of nominalism listed above are independent of one another. Historically, there have been philosophers who denied metaphysical universals, but allowed (individual) entities in more ontological categories than Ockham does. Conversely, one might reduce the number of ontological categories, and yet hold that universal entities are needed in the categories that remain.
Still, Ockham's “nominalism,” in both the first and the second of the above senses, is often viewed as derived from a common source: an underlying concern for ontological parsimony. This is summed up in the famous slogan known as “Ockham's Razor,” often expressed as “Don't multiply entities beyond necessity.” Although the sentiment is certainly Ockham's, that particular formulation is nowhere to be found in Ockham's texts. Moreover, as usually stated, it is a sentiment that virtually all philosophers, medieval or otherwise, would accept; no one wants a needlessly bloated ontology. The question, of course, is which entities are needed and which are not.
Ockham's Razor, in the senses in which it can be found in Ockham himself, never allows us to deny putative entities; at best it allows us to refrain from positing them in the absence of known compelling reasons for doing so. In part, this is because human beings can never be sure they know what is and what is not “beyond necessity”; the necessities are not always clear to us. But even if we did know them, Ockham would still not allow that his Razor allows us to deny entities that are unnecessary. For Ockham, the only truly necessary entity is God; everything else, the whole of creation, is radically contingent through and through. In short, Ockham does not accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason.
Nevertheless, we do sometimes have sufficient methodological grounds for positively affirming the existence of certain things. Ockham acknowledges three sources for such grounds (three sources of positive knowledge). As he says in Sent. I, dist. 30, q. 1: “For nothing ought to be posited without a reason given, unless it is self-evident (literally, known through itself) or known by experience or proved by the authority of Sacred Scripture.”
In the case of universal entities, Ockham's nominalism is not based on his Razor, on his principle of parsimony. That is, Ockham does not hold merely that there is no good reason for affirming universals, so that we should refrain from doing so in the absence of further evidence. No, he holds that theories of universals, or at least the theories he considers, are outright incoherent; they either are self-contradictory or at least violate certain other things we know are true in virtue of the three sources just cited. For Ockham, the only universal entities it makes sense to talk about are universal concepts, and derivative on them, universal terms in spoken and written language. Metaphysically, these “universal” concepts are singular entities like all others; they are “universal” only in the sense of being “predicable of many.”
But this was a view Ockham came to gradually. Over the course of his career, Ockham changed his view of what universal concepts are. To begin with, he adopted what is known as the fictum-theory, a theory according to which universals have no “real” existence at all in the Aristotelian categories, but instead are purely “intentional objects” more or less in the sense of modern phenomenology; they have only a kind of “thought”-reality. Such “fictive” objects were metaphysically universal; they just weren't real. Eventually, however, Ockham came to think this intentional realm of “fictive” entities was not needed, and by the time of his (relatively late) Quodlibets seems to adopt instead a so called intellectio-theory, according to which a universal concept is just the act of thinking about several objects at once; metaphysically it is quite singular, and is “universal” only in the sense of being predicable of many.
Thus, Ockham is quite certain there are no metaphysically universal entities. But when it comes to paring down the number of basic ontological categories, he is more cautious, and it is there that he uses his Razor ruthlessly—always to suspend judgment, never to deny.
The main vehicle for this “ontological reduction” is the theory of connotation, coupled with the related theory of “exposition.” The theory of exposition, which is not fully developed in Ockham, will become increasingly prominent in authors immediately after him. In effect, the theory of connotation is related to the theory of exposition as explicit definition is related to contextual definition. The notion of the “square” of a number can be explicitly defined, for example, as the result of multiplying that number by itself. Contextual definition operates not at the level of terms, but at the level of propositions. Thus, Bertrand Russell famously treated ‘The present king of France is bald’ as amounting to ‘There is an x such that x is a present king of France and x is bald, and for all y if y is a present king of France then y = x’. We are never given any outright definition of the term ‘present king of France’, but instead are given a technique of paraphrasing away seemingly referential occurrences of that term in such a way that we are not committed to any actually existing present kings of France. So too, Ockham tries to provide us, at the propositional level, with paraphrases of propositions that seem at first to refer to entities he sees no reason to believe in.
For example, in Summa of Logic, II.11, among other places, Ockham argues that we can account for the truth of 'Socrates is similar to Plato' without having to appeal to a relational entity called “similarity”:
For example, for the truth of ‘Socrates is similar to Plato’, it is required that Socrates have some quality and that Plato have a quality of the same species. Thus, from the very fact that Socrates is white and Plato is white, Socrates is similar to Plato and conversely. Likewise, if both are black, or hot, [then] they are similar without anything else added. (Emphasis added.)
In this way, Ockham removes all need for entities in seven of the traditional Aristotelian ten categories; all that remain are entities in the categories of substance and quality, and a few entities in the category of relation, which Ockham thinks are required for theological reasons pertaining to the Trinity, the Incarnation and the Eucharist, even though our natural cognitive powers would see no reason for them at all. As is to be expected, the ultimate success of Ockham's program is a matter of considerable dispute.
Ockham's “physics” or natural philosophy is of a broadly Aristotelian sort, although he interprets Aristotle in his own fashion. Ockham wrote a great deal in this area, and indeed his Exposition of Aristotle's Physics is his longest work except for his Commentary on the Sentences
As a nominalist about universals, Ockham had to deal with the Aristotelian claim in the Posterior Analytics that science is about what is universal and necessary. He discusses this issue in the Prologue to his Exposition of the Physics, and there agrees with Aristotle. But he interprets Aristotle's dictum as saying that science is about certain propositions with general (universal) terms in them; it is only in that sense that science deals with the universal. This of course does not mean that for Ockham our scientific knowledge can never get beyond the level of language to actual things. He distinguishes various senses of ‘to know’ (scire, from which we get scientia or “science”):
As described earlier, Ockham holds we do not need to allow entities in all ten of Aristotle's categories. In particular, we do not need them in the category of quantity. For Ockham, there is no need for real “mathematical” entities—numbers, points, lines, surfaces, solids (in the geometrical sense). Talk about such things can invariably be parsed away, via the theory of connotation or exposition, in favor of talk about substances and qualities (and, in certain theological contexts, a few relations). This Ockhamist move is illustrative of and influential on an important development in late medieval physics: the application of mathematics to non-mathematical things, culminating in Galileo's famous statement that the “book of nature” is written in the “language of mathematics.”
Such an application of mathematics violates a traditional Aristotelian prohibition against metabasis eis allo genos, grounded on quite reasonable considerations. The basic idea is that things cannot be legitimately compared in any respect in which they differ in species. Thus it makes little sense to ask whether the soprano's high C is higher or lower than Mount Everest—much less to ask (quantitatively) how much higher or lower it is. But for Aristotle, straight lines and curved lines belong to different species of lines. Hence rectilinear motion and circular motion cannot be meaningfully compared or measured against one another.
Although the basic idea is reasonable enough, Ockham recognized that there are problems. The length of a coiled rope, for example, can straightforwardly be compared to the length of an uncoiled rope, and the one can meaningfully be said to be longer or shorter than, or equal in length to, the other. Ockham's solution is to note that, on his ontology, straight lines and curved lines are not really different species of lines—because lines are not really things in the first place. Talk about lines is simply a “manner of speaking” that can be parsed (“expounded”) away.
Thus, to compare a “curved” (coiled) rope with a “straight” (uncoiled) one is not really to talk about the lengths of lines in two different species; it is to talk about two ropes, which are after all in the same species. To describe the one as curved (coiled) and the other as straight (uncoiled) is not to appeal to specifically different kinds of entities—curvature and straightness—but merely to describe the ropes in ways that can be expounded according to two different patterns. Since such talk does not have ontological implications that require specifically different kinds of entities, the Aristotelian prohibition of metabasis does not apply.
Once one realizes that we can appeal to connotation theory, and more generally the theory of exposition, without invoking new entities, the door is opened to applying mathematical analyses (all of which are exponible, for Ockham) to all kinds of things, and in particular to physical nature.
Ockham's contributions were by no means the only factor in the increasing mathematization of science in the fourteenth century. But they were important ones.
Like most medieval accounts of knowledge, Ockham's is not much concerned with answering skeptical doubts. He takes it for granted that humans not only can but frequently do know things, and focuses his attention instead on the “mechanisms” by which this knowledge comes about.
Ockham's theory of knowledge, like his natural philosophy, is broadly Aristotelian in form, although—again, like his natural philosophy—it is “Aristotelian” in its own way. For most Aristotelians of the day, knowledge involved the transmission of a “species” between the object and the mind. At the sensory level, this species may be compared to the more recent notion of a sense “impression.” More generally, we can think of it as the structure or configuration of the object, a structure or configuration that can be “encoded” in different ways and found isomorphically in a variety of contexts. One recent author, describing the theory as it occurs in Aquinas, puts it like this:
Consider, for example, blueprints. In a blueprint of a library, the configuration of the library itself, that is, the very configuration that will be in the finished library, is captured on paper but in such a way that it does not make the paper itself into a library. Rather, the configuration is imposed on the paper in a different sort of way from the way it is imposed on the materials of the library. What Aquinas thinks of as transferring and preserving a configuration we tend to consider as a way of encoding information.
The configuration of features found in the external object is also found in “encoded” form as a species in the organ that senses the object. (Depending on the sense modality, it may also be found in an intervening medium. For example, with vision and hearing, the species is transmitted through the air to the sense organ.) At the intellectual level, the so called “agent intellect” goes to work on this species and somehow produces the universal concept that is the raw material of intellectual cognition.
Ockham rejected this theory of species. For him, species are unnecessary to a successful theory of cognition, and he dispenses with them. Moreover, he argues, the species theory is not supported by experience; introspection reveals no such species in our cognitive processes.
On Ockham's interpretation of the species theory, the agent intellect's work of “abstracting” the universal concept from the quite individual sensible species is a process of “filtering,” “subtracting” or “extracting”; we disregard the peculiar features of individual instances and retain only what is common to all of them. On such an account, what the agent intellect produces as the result of its work must already be present (together with the “individual” features that are disregarded) in the species it takes as its starting point, and ultimately in the original object. Thus, if the process results in a universal concept, the universal must have been really present in the object at the outset. As a nominalist about universals, Ockham will therefore not accept this theory.
Ockham's rejection of the species theory of cognition was an important development in late medieval epistemology.
One of the more intriguing features of late medieval epistemology in general, and of Ockham's view in particular, is the development of a theory known as “intuitive and abstractive cognition.” The theory is found in authors as diverse as Duns Scotus, Peter Auriol, Walter Chatton, and Ockham. But their theories of intuitive and abstractive cognition are so different that it is hard to see any one thing they are all supposed to be theories of. Nevertheless, to a first approximation, intuitive cognition can be thought of as perception, whereas abstractive cognition is closer to imagination or remembering. The fit is not exact, however, since authors who had a theory of intuitive and abstractive cognition usually also allowed the distinction at the intellectual level as well.
It is important to note that abstractive cognition, in the sense of this theory, has nothing necessarily to do with “abstraction” in the sense of producing universal concepts from cognitive encounters with individuals. Instead, what abstractive cognition “abstracts” from is the question of the existence or non-existence of the object. By contrast, intuitive cognition is very much tied up with the existence or non-existence of the object. Here is how Ockham distinguishes them:
For intuitive cognition of a thing is a cognition such that by virtue of it it can be known whether the thing exists or not, in such a way that if the thing does exist, the intellect at once judges it to exist and evidently knows it to exist … Likewise, intuitive cognition is such that when some things are known, one of which inheres in the other or the one is distant in place from the other or is related in another way to the other, it is at once known by virtue of the incomplex cognitions of those things whether the thing inheres or does not inhere, whether it is distant or not distant, and so on for other contingent truths …
Abstractive cognition, however, is that by virtue of which it cannot be evidently known of the thing whether it exists or does not exist. And in this way abstractive cognition, as opposed to intuitive cognition, “abstracts” from existence and non-existence, because by it neither can it be evidently known of an existing thing that it exists, nor of a non-existent one that it does not exist.
The correct interpretation of Ockham's theory of intuitive and abstractive cognition is a matter of considerable controversy. The “standard” view holds that intuitive cognition for Ockham grounds infallible judgments, whereas abstractive cognition does not. Recently, however, this view has been questioned on the grounds that it is based on a misreading of a certain text. The issues are complex and subtle, and the matter has not yet been finally sorted out.
Ockham's ethics combines a number of themes. For one, it is a will-based ethics in which intentions count for everything and external behavior or actions count for nothing. In themselves, all actions are morally neutral.
Again, there is a strong dose of divine command theory in Ockham's ethics. Certain things (i.e., in light of the previous point, certain intentions) becomes morally obligatory, permitted or forbidden simply because God decrees so. Thus, in Exodus, the Israelites' “spoiling the Egyptians” (or rather their intention to do so, which they carried out) was not a matter of theft or plunder, but was morally permissible and indeed obligatory—because God had commanded it.
Nevertheless, despite the divine command themes in Ockham's ethics, it is also clear that he wanted morality to be to some extent a matter of reason. There is even a sense in which one can find a kind of natural law theory in Ockham's ethics; one way in which God conveys his divine commands to us is by giving us the natures we have. Unlike Augustine, Ockham accepted the possibility of the “virtuous pagan”; moral virtue for Ockham does not depend on having access to revelation.
But while moral virtue is possible even for the pagan, moral virtue is not by itself enough for salvation. Salvation requires not just virtue (the opposite of which is moral vice) but merit (the opposite of which is sin), and merit requires grace, a free gift from God. In short, there is no necessary connection between virtue—moral goodness—and salvation. Ockham repeatedly emphasizes that “God is a debtor to no one”; he does not owe us anything, no matter what we do.
For Ockham, acts of will are morally virtuous either extrinsically, i.e. derivatively, through their conformity to some more fundamental act of will, or intrinsically. On pain of infinite regress, therefore, extrinsically virtuous acts of will must ultimately lead back to an intrinsically virtuous act of will. That intrinsically virtuous act of will, for Ockham, is an act of “loving God above all else and for his own sake.”
In his early work, On the Connection of the Virtues, Ockham distinguishes five grades or stages of moral virtue, which have been the topic of considerable speculation in the secondary literature:
The difficulty in understanding this hierarchy comes at the fourth stage, where it is not clear exactly what moral factor is added to the preceding three stages.
At the beginning of his Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle remarked that “the good is that at which all things aim.” Each thing, therefore, aims at the good, according to the demands of its nature. In the Middle Ages, “Aristotelians” like Thomas Aquinas held that the good for human beings in particular is “happiness,” the enjoyment of the direct vision of God in the next life. And, whether they realize it or not, that is what all human beings are ultimately aiming at in their actions. For someone like Aquinas, therefore, the human will is “free” only in a certain restricted sense. We are not free to choose for or against our final end; that is built into us by nature. But we are free to choose various means to that end. All our choices, therefore, are made under the aspect of leading to that final goal. To be sure, sometimes we make the wrong choices, but when that occurs it is because of ignorance, distraction, self-deception, etc. In an important sense, then, someone like Aquinas accepts a version of the so called Socratic Paradox: No one knowingly and deliberately does evil.
Ockham's view is quite different. Although he is very suspicious of the notion of final causality (teleology) in general, he thinks it is quite appropriate for intelligent, voluntary agents such as human beings. Thus the frequent charge that Ockham severs ethics from metaphysics by denying teleology seems wrong. Nevertheless, while Ockham grants that human beings have a natural orientation, a tendency toward their own ultimate good, he does not think this restricts our choices.
For Ockham, as for Aristotle and Aquinas, I can choose the means to achieve my ultimate good. But in addition, for Ockham unlike Aristotle and Aquinas, I can choose whether to will that ultimate good. The natural orientation and tendency toward that good is built in; I cannot do anything about that. But I can choose whether or not to to act to achieve that good. I might choose, for example, to do nothing at all, and I can do this knowing full well what I am doing. But more: I can choose to act knowingly directly against my ultimate good, to thwart it. I can choose evil as evil.
For Ockham, this is required if I am going to be morally responsible for my actions. If I could not help but will to act to achieve my ultimate good, then it would not be morally praiseworthy of me to do so; moral “sins of omission” would be impossible (although of course I could be mistaken in the means I adopt). By the same token, moral “sins of commission” would be impossible if I could not knowingly act against my ultimate good. But for Ockham these conclusions are not just required by theory; they are confirmed by experience.
The divine command themes so prominent in Ockham's ethics are much more muted in his political theory, which on the contrary tends to be far more “natural” and “secular.” As sketched above, Ockham's political writings began at Avignon with a discussion of the issue of poverty. But later on the issues were generalized to include church/state relations more broadly. He was one of the first medieval authors to advocate a form of church/state separation, and was important for the early development of the notion of property rights.
The Franciscan Order at this time was divided into two parties, which came to be known as the “Conventuals” and the “Spirituals” (or “zealots”). The Spirituals, among which were Ockham, Michael of Cesena, and the other exiles who joined them in fleeing Avignon, tried to preserve the original ideal of austere poverty practiced and advocated by St. Francis himself (c. 1181-1226). The Conventuals, on the other hand, while recognizing this ideal, were prepared to compromise to accommodate the practical needs of a large, organized religious order; they were by far the majority of the order. The issue between the two parties was never one of doctrine; neither side accused the other of heresy. Rather, the question was one of how to shape and run the order—in particular, whether the Franciscans should (or even could) renounce all property rights.
The ideal of poverty had been (and still is) a common one in religious communities. Typically, the idea is that the individual member of the order owns no property at all. If a member buys a car, for instance, it is not strictly his car, even though he may have exclusive use of it, and it was not bought with his money; he doesn't have any money of his own. Rather it belongs to the order.
The original Franciscan ideal went further. Not only did the individual friar have no property of his own, neither did the order. The Franciscans, therefore, were really supposed to be “mendicants,” to live by begging. Anything donated to the order, such as a house or a piece of land, strictly speaking remained the property of the original owner (who merely granted the use of it to the Franciscans). (Or, if that would not work—as, for example, in the case of a bequest in a will, after the original owner had died—the ownership would go to the Papacy.)
Both the Spirituals and the Conventuals thought this ideal of uncompromising poverty was exhibited by the life of Jesus and the Apostles, who—they said—had given up all property, both individually and collectively. St. Francis regarded this as the clear implication of several Scriptural passages: e.g., Matt. 6:24-34, 8:20, 19:21. In short, the Apostolic (and Franciscan) ideal was, “Live without a safety net.”
Of course, if everyone lived according to this ideal, so that no one owned any property either individually or collectively, then there would be no property at all. The Franciscan ideal, then, shared by Conventuals and Spirituals alike, entailed the total abolition of all property rights.
Not everyone shared this view. Outside the Franciscan order, most theoreticians agreed that Jesus and the Apostles lived without individual property, but thought they did share property collectively. Nevertheless, Pope Nicholas III, in 1279, had officially approved the Franciscan view, not just as a view about how to organize the Franciscan order, but about the interpretation of the Scriptural passages concerning Jesus and the Apostles. His approval did not mean he was endorsing the Franciscan reading as the correct interpretation of Scripture, but only that it was a permissible one, that there was nothing doctrinally suspect about it.
Nevertheless, this interpretation was a clear reproach to the Papacy, which at Avignon was wallowing in wealth to a degree it had never seen before. The clear implication of the Franciscan view, therefore, was that the Avignon Popes were conspicuously not living their lives as an “imitation of Christ.” Whether for this reason or another, the Avignon Pope John XXII decided to reopen discussion of the question of Apostolic poverty and to come to some resolution of the matter. But, as Mollat  puts it (perhaps not without some taking of sides):
When discussions began at Avignon, conflicting opinions were freely put forward. Meanwhile, Michael of Cesena, acting with insolent audacity, did not await the Holy See's decision: on 30 May 1322 the chapter-general [of the Franciscan order] at Perugia declared itself convinced of the absolute poverty of Christ and the Apostles.
It was this act that provoked John XXII to issue his first contribution to the dispute, his bull Ad conditorem in 1322. There he put the whole matter in a legal framework.
According to Roman law, as formulated in the Code of Justinian, “ownership” and “legitimate use” cannot be permanently separated. For example, it is one thing for me to own a book but to let you use it for a while. Ownership in that case means that I can recall the book, and even if I do not do so, you should return it to me when you are done with it. But it is quite another matter for me to own the book but to grant you permanent use of it, to agree not to recall it as long as you want to keep it, and to agree that you have no obligation to give it back ever. John XXII points out that, from the point of view of Roman law, the latter case makes no sense. There is no practical difference in that case between my having the use of the book and your owning it; for all intents and purposes, it is yours.
Notice the criticism here. It is a legal argument against the claim that the Papacy as an institution can own something and yet the Franciscans as an order, collectively, have a permanent right to use it. The complaint is not against the notion that an individual friar might have a right to use something until he dies, at which time use reverts to the order (or as the Franciscans would have it, to the Papacy). This would still allow some distinction between ownership and mere use. Rather the complaint is against the notion that the order would not own anything outright, but would nevertheless have permanent use of it that goes beyond the life or death of any individual friar, so that the ownership somehow remained permanently with the Papacy, even though the Pope could not reclaim it, use it, or do anything at all with it. John XXII argues that this simply abolishes the distinction between use and ownership.
Special problems arise if the property involved is such that the use of it involves consuming it—e.g., food. In that case, it appears that there is no real difference between ownership and even temporary use. For things like food, using them amounts for practical purposes to owning them; they cannot be recalled after they are used. In short, for John XXII, it follows that it is impossible fully to live the life of absolute poverty, even for the individual person (much less for a permanent institution like the Franciscan order). The institution of property, and property “rights,” therefore began in the Garden of Eden, the first time Adam or Eve ate something. These property rights are not “natural” rights; on the contrary, they are established by a kind of positive law by God, who gave everything in the Garden to Adam and Eve.
Ockham disagreed. For him, there was no “property” in the Garden of Eden. Instead, Adam and Eve there had a natural right to use anything at hand there. This natural right did not amount to a property right, however, since it could not have been used as the basis of any kind of legal claim. Both John XXII and Ockham seem to agree in requiring that “property” (ownership) be a matter of positive law, not simply of natural law. But John says there was such property in the Garden of Eden, whereas Ockham claims there was not; there was only a natural right there, so that Adam and Eve's use of the goods there was legitimate. For Ockham, “property” first emerged only after the Fall when, by a kind of divine permission, people began to set up special positive legal arrangements assigning the legal right to use certain things to certain people (the owners), to the exclusion of anyone else's having a legal right to them. The owners can then give permission to others to use what the owners own, but that permission does not amount to giving them a legal right they could appeal to in a court of law; it can be revoked at any time. For Ockham, this is the way the Franciscans operate. Their benefactors and donors do not give them any legal rights to use the things donated to them—i.e., no right they could appeal to in a court of law. Rather the donation amounts only to a kind of permission that restores the original natural (not legal) right of use in the Garden of Eden.
A fair number of Ockham's writings are available in English, in whole or in part. For a complete list of translations to 1999, see Spade , pp. 5-11. The following major items deserve particular mention:
Ample bibliographies of the secondary literature up to 1990 may be found in:
The following list includes all works cited in this article, plus several other noteworthy items:
|Paul Vincent Spade