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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Paul Gerhard Natorp was one of the most prominent philosophers in Germany at the turn of the last century. Born in Düsseldorf on January 24, 1854, he began his university education at Bonn in classical philology under Hermann Usener, and continued at the University of Strassburg, but as he neared completion of his studies, he found himself unsatisfied with his work, and vexed by “a secret philosophical urge.” It found its outlet when a friend studying at Marburg wrote to him of Hermann Cohen and F.A. Lange, and of their interpretation of Kant; thenceforth Natorp “placed his whole thinking and his entire, powerful capacity for work in the service of this single task:” the development of “philosophy as science” (Cassirer 1925: 276). His first philosophy teacher was Ernst Laas, whose anti-Kantian and anti-Platonic positivism simply incited Natorp to deeper engagement with the philosophy of critique. In this way, his early philosophical studies converged with his original love of philology as he pursued the “prehistory” of Kantian critique in Descartes, Galileo, and Copernicus back to Plato. Natorp completed his Habilitation under Cohen at Marburg in 1881, and taught there until his death on August 17, 1924.
During his long and prolific tenure at Marburg, Natorp came into contact with a number of illustrious scholars and writers. Boris Pasternak, Karl Barth, and Ernst Cassirer were among his students; Rabindranath Tagore was his friend. In the fateful summer of 1914 the young T.S. Eliot caricatured Natorp, the director of the summer program in which he was enrolled [image available online]. In addition to Cohen, academic colleagues included the philosopher Nicolai Hartmann, the theologians Rudolf Bultmann and Rudolf Otto, and the literary scholar Ernst Robert Curtius. Late in life, Natorp directed Hans-Georg Gadamer's doctoral dissertation (Gadamer 1922), and, together with his long-time philosophical interlocutor, Edmund Husserl of Freiburg, engineered Martin Heidegger's appointment as an Extraordinarius at Marburg in 1923. Upon Natorp's death the following summer, Heidegger assumed his chair, thus bringing the department's Kantian orientation to a decisive close.
Like his younger contemporary, Ernst Cassirer, Natorp initially focused on the explication, defense, and elaboration of Cohen's difficult and often impenetrable work on Kant-interpretation, the theory of science, and the history of philosophy. While Natorp did also publish some important works of contemporary systematic philosophy (1887, 1888h), he devoted much of his attention in the last decades of the nineteenth century to filling out historical elements in Cohen's larger framework. He especially employed his classics expertise in the explication of ancient anticipations of “critical” scientific philosophy, and the analysis of its natural development. Later, in the chaotic social, political, and cultural landscape of pre- and interwar Germany, and especially in the wake of Cohen's death in 1918, Natorp departed from the classic Marburg concentration on the logic of the exact sciences. This departure was less a shift in his basic philosophical outlook than the sounding of new themes, some native to the Marburg School, others arising out of dialogue with other philosophers. Motivated by the liberal-socialist ideals integral to the global theory of culture that was the Marburgers' ultimate aim, Natorp wrote widely on ethics, politics, and Sozialpädagogik. On the other hand, one must also interpret Natorp's later thought (esp. his “ontological turn”) in light of his dialogue with other philosophies challenging neo-Kantianism's dominance in the German academy, notably the so-called Lebensphilosophie, and the phenomenologies of Husserl and Heidegger.
Neo-Kantianism, it is often said, was the dominant current of late nineteenth-century German academic philosophy. While true, this statement is uninformative, since the label conveys no clear doctrinal content. Given the widespread perception that philosophy had become discredited by the untenable claims of the German Idealists, the various neo-Kantian schools shared a conviction that Kant—on some interpretation of his sobriety—could give philosophy a respectable and genuine task again, now that it had awakened from its long post-Hegelian hangover. The label therefore does not necessarily signify a revival of Kant's doctrines (much less of Kant-scholarship for its own sake), but rather, as Natorp himself puts it, philosophizing in the spirit of Kant. But what does that mean? For the Marburg School, Kant's great idea, “the central notion with respect to which one must relate, understand, and evaluate everything else in Kant” is the transcendental method (Natorp 1912c: 194). This method constitutes “the unshakeable guideline of our whole philosophizing” (Natorp 1912c: 196). Why? Because the transcendental method anchors philosophy in facts (eminently the fact of mathematical physics), of which philosophy is to establish the conditions of possibility or justification (Rechtsgrund). By limiting itself to this task of justification, philosophical reason keeps itself from ascending into the aether of speculation. At the same time, by discovering the source of scientific objectivity (and thus of rational objectivity generally), i.e., by “clearly exhibiting the law [of objectivity] in its purity,” philosophy “secures science [and rational activity generally] in its autonomy and preserves it from alien distraction” (Natorp 1912c: 197-198). Transcendental philosophy in the Kantian spirit, then, is doubly “critical,” checking itself against metaphysical excesses, on the one hand, but also rigorously formulating the ideal grounds of the sciences, on the other. At the same time, the Marburg School finds in the critical philosophy an idealistic bulwark against the empiricism epitomized by Mill.
Moreover, the Marburgers endorsed Kant's view that philosophy should adopt an approach to the other domains of human culture—morality, art, and religion—that was “critical” in just the transcendental sense described above. This approach, then, takes the critique of science as the paradigm of philosophy's relation to culture in general. Just as the critical theory of science begins from the concrete theories developed by the special sciences, so philosophy in general should begin from the achievements of culture (e.g., works of art, moral action or institutions), and investigate the basis of their claims. This is one reason Cohen and Natorp call their critical philosophy “idealism,” because its task vis-à-vis culture is to lay out the system of rational principles that make possible the “facts” of science, morality, and art. At the same time, their idealism aims at making explicit the “ideas” that guide, or ought to guide, the continuous development of culture. Finally, the Marburgers' very theory of transcendental principles is itself “idealistic” in the radical sense that all objects of experience are held to be the product solely of the activity of thinking. Nevertheless, Marburg theory denies philosophy any “speculative” task of seeing or knowing things that are beyond experience, of constructing systems of ideas that are not immanent in the facts of human knowledge, action, or production. Like Cassirer, Natorp makes this view of philosophy in the Kantian spirit the basis of his own philosophy of science and of his historical interpretations.
One main reason why neo-Kantians of all stripes see the essence of philosophy in critique is that it guarantees philosophy's autonomy. Of all rational activities, philosophy alone has the task of discovering the conditions and regulative ideals that make such activities at all possible. While the problem of philosophy's identity as a discipline of course goes back to Plato, we are faced, in the nineteenth-century German context, with the particular problem of philosophy's relation to the positive sciences, which had completely repudiated and replaced the knowledge-claims of the speculative systems of German Idealism. For the Marburgers, the issue of philosophy's disciplinary integrity becomes intertwined with the question of the autonomy of reason itself. Cohen and Natorp faced a difficult task. Having turned their backs on speculative philosophy, they could not define reason's autonomy by falling back upon the discredited Geist of German Idealism. But they also could not let reason (or as they prefer to call it, “thinking”) be conceived as a set of psychological operations, since that would subject reason's laws (logic) to more basic psychological or psychophysical laws. Already in his (1887), Natorp objects to this psychologism (though he does not use the term) on the grounds that science and knowledge, and the very notion of objective truth these presuppose, would be rendered senseless if grounded in the subjective experience of the thinking or knowing psyche. The chief task for any account of Natorp's philosophy, then, is to make sense of his notion of rational autonomy.
Beyond the issue of reason's autonomy or priority, another central issue for Natorp is reason's history; again, this is a concern typical of the Marburg School generally; one of its peculiarities is the quasi-Hegelian insistence upon the integration of the systematic and historical moments of philosophy. Cohen wrote major essays on Plato, and Natorp's early work concentrated on what the Marburgers considered ancient and early modern anticipations of the critical philosophy. Then there is Natorp's magnum opus, the Platos Ideenlehre of 1903, in which he simultaneously develops a “critical” interpretation of the theory of forms and an argument for the order of the dialogues, all conceived as an “Introduction to Idealism.”
During his life, Paul Natorp was overshadowed by his mentor, Cohen, and after his death, by the more glamorous Cassirer. For decades, if he was mentioned at all, one remembered his controversial Plato book, or, perhaps, his other contributions to the study of Greek thought. But Natorp has been further obscured by the general eclipse of neo-Kantianism for most of the twentieth century. It has only been since the late 1970's, with the revival of European interest in the Marburg School, and especially through the work of Helmut Holzhey since the 1980's, that Natorp has reappeared on the philosophical scene and the unique features of his thought have become more plainly distinguished from Cohen's. Holzhey's unearthing of several heterodox, critical texts from the Nachlass suggests that Natorp himself had suppressed them, either “for the sake of maintaining the unity of the ‘Marburg School,’” or because he did not always think himself able to provide an alternative to a particular Cohenian thesis. Yet, despite the Marburgers' loud assertion of the centrality to their philosophy of science and its history, most recent interest in Cohen has focused on his late works in the philosophy of religion; and despite Natorp's allegiance to Cohen's generally scientistic program, much ado is made of his purported “ontological turn” away from epistemology. By contrast, this article focuses on Natorp's thought in the areas to which he after all devoted most of his career as a member of the Marburg School: philosophy of science, history of philosophy, and philosophical psychology; it does not deal with his politics or pedagogical theories, philosophically informed though they are.
It is a commonplace of nineteenth-century German intellectual history that with the collapse of post-Kantian Idealism, philosophy ceded its claim of scientificity to the positive sciences. The special sciences made rapid and startling progress, continually adding to the store of human knowledge. Philosophy, meanwhile, seemed to have lost its way, and many thinkers pinned their hopes for a rehabilitation of philosophy on a return to Kant. The Marburg School in particular interpreted this to mean that philosophy should orient itself with respect to the sciences, rather than strive—as German Idealism had—to forge a scientific system of its own, independent from the results of the positive sciences: only in this attenuated sense would philosophy be “scientific.” For all that, Natorp by no means conceived philosophy as a humble handmaiden. On the contrary, its task is to discover and establish the highest principle(s) of rational understanding, and thereby the principles not only of the sciences, but also of ethics and aesthetics, in short, of all the domains of human culture. It must however take science as its primary object of inquiry because science represents the paradigm of knowing (Erkenntnis). Only a critique of science can therefore elucidate rationality or, as the Marburgers call it, the “logic” of thinking, for it is only in science that we can most reliably witness thinking at work, successfully achieving knowledge. Thus the question of the “concept of science” becomes “the chief question of logic and the foundational question of philosophy” (Cohen 1902: 445). The Marburgers identify the unifying principle of science and ethics in particular as the concept of law (Gesetz), and, as Cohen puts it, “it is the business of logic to determine the meaning of law, or rather, the meanings of law” (Cohen 1902: 445).
Natorp and Cohen find general affirmation of this train of thought in Kant's project of seeking the conditions of possibility of the “fact” of mathematical natural science. However, the similarities end there, for by rejecting or modifying several basic aspects of Kant's philosophy, they also end up with a radically transformed conception of the nature of scientific experience and the meaning of knowledge. The first of their modifications stems from an anti-psychologistic critique of Kant himself, namely of what they see as a confusion in the first Critique between the task of a transcendental grounding of the sciences and that of a transcendental logic of human cognition. The former is in their view the genuine critical enterprise, for it promises to reveal the autonomous sources of objective knowledge, whereas the latter threatens to trace science back to psychological, and therefore contingent, subjective (albeit a priori) wellsprings. Second, they deny any scientific role to intuition as conceived by Kant, either pure or empirical. Partly this is a result of their anti-psychologism, which forbids them from grounding the objectivity of science in the subjective faculties of cognition; but it is also because they see, with Kant, the essence of thinking in its activity and spontaneity, whereas intuition (at least as defined by Kant) is passive and affective. Hence, intuition thus conceived threatens to introduce a heteronomous, and therefore rationally unacceptable, factor into science. Finally, the Marburgers follow their German Idealist predecessors in dismissing all talk of things in themselves, conceived as things existing independently of knowledge. We can see how these three important modifications of Kant's philosophy stem from the same basic concern with rational autonomy. For reason to be autonomous, its activity must be spontaneous; but this spontaneity cannot be conceived of psychologically, because human cognition as a matter of fact has a passive, and therefore heteronomous, intuitive element, namely sensibility. Furthermore, things in themselves can play no explanatory role here because they are ex hypothesi alien to reason.
These modifications have two radical consequences for Kantian doctrine, consequences that characterize the Marburgers' own theory of science and cognition. The first is a new conception of science; the second is a new conception of the categories (see Section 4). It might seem that science, as the achievement of an autonomous rationality, must fail to be objectively true of the world, if reason's autonomy implies that it can have no intuitive, receptive link to the world via sensibility. How in general could the rationally constructed system be related to the constraints of experience? How in particular could physics, the science of motion in space and time, be possible if the pure forms of intuition, space and time, were banished from science?
If Natorp often seems to embrace the troubling thesis that science is not of the phenomenal world, this is because he holds, first, that the meaning of “phenomenon” is problematic; and second, that the aspect of science relevant to philosophy has nothing to do with its relation to a phenomenal realm. In this he follows Cohen's dictum:
Not the stars in the heavens are the objects which [the transcendental] method teaches us to contemplate in order to know them; rather, it is the astronomical calculations, those facts of scientific reality which are the “actuality” that needs to be explained…. What is the foundation of the reality which is given in such facts? What are the conditions of that certainty from which visible actuality takes its reality? The laws are the facts, and [hence] the objects [of our investigation]; not the star-things. (Cohen 1877: 27, f.)
The point is that the scientific or epistemic value of, say, astronomy, is not to be found in what is given and observable by the senses, but rather in the mathematical exactness of its equations. These alone constitute and underwrite the truth-value of astronomy's propositions, and they are solely the achievements of reason's activity. As noted above, the essential characteristic of science lies in its objectivity, and that objectivity is rooted in its lawfulness. It is this formal feature of objectivity that constitutes the philosophical interest in science, not the material content of a particular science's theorems; in other words, the philosophical question is: “How is this lawfulness possible?” This question is distinct from the psychological question, “What are the psychological laws that make it possible for me (as a psychophysical being) to observe a star?” or the astronomical question, “What are the laws governing the ’being’ of this star in its states and properties?”
Hence, it is not so much the case that science on the Marburgers' conception loses all traction on the phenomenal or “actual” world, as that they are asking an entirely different question. While for Kant himself such traction is the only warrant that we are cognizing a genuine object, for Natorp the nexus of science and apparent reality is irrelevant to the spontaneous, legislating factor of science that is the activity of reason alone and therefore of paramount interest to philosophy. How such essentially subjective application of categories to sensible phenomena in fact happens is a problem of psychology, not philosophy, to investigate. Thus we must be very careful in interpreting the Marburg talk of “scientific experience.” Yes, it is not experience in general or psychological (subjective) experience (Erlebnis), but scientific (objective) experience (Erfahrung) which is the “fact” whose transcendental sources philosophy is to seek. Yet we must not in turn take this scientific “experience” to mean “experience cleansed by experiment” (to paraphrase Helmholtz): experiment by definition obviously remains empirical. Rather, by “scientific experience” Natorp just means the “legislative” act of categorial “Grundlegung,” of “hypothesis.”
Now by the end of the nineteenth century, it was obvious to any informed observer of science that its categorial structures were in fact hypothetical and dynamic: the fact of scientific experience could no longer be taken as the essentially complete edifice of Newtonian physics, as Kant had done. In Natorp's rewording of Kant, science is not a factum at all, but a fieri, i.e., not an accomplished deed, but an ongoing doing. Hence, what makes science scientific—i.e., productive of genuine knowledge—cannot possibly be founded on a set of fixed (physical) principles, analogous to mathematical axioms the certainty of which somehow flows into its theorems. Instead, the Marburgers argue, its scientificity can only reside in its method, i.e., in the regular and regulated manner of its progress. And since its scientificity is equivalent to objectivity or lawfulness, transcendental critique must determine the relation of lawfulness to method.
In his memoirs, Hans-Georg Gadamer calls Natorp, his doctoral supervisor, a “Methodenfanatiker.” By this Gadamer means that Natorp, for most of his career, focused on the methodical aspect of thinking to the point of reducing thinking to method. To understand this quite riddling statement, one must take into account Natorp's interpretation of the word, “method.” He writes:
The word “method,” metienai, implies not a mere “going” or movement in general; nor, as Hegel believes, a mere accompanying [going-with]; rather, method means a going towards a goal, or at any rate in a secured direction: it means “going-after” [pursuit]. (Natorp 1912c: 199-200)
The directedness towards a goal which Natorp claims is implied by “method” illuminates one of two senses in which his philosophy is idealistic, namely that science (and the other activities of culture) are guided by regulative ideas or limit-concepts (Grenzbegriffe). Ideas, as Kant argues in the Transcendental Dialectic, are a priori concepts whose source lies in pure reason alone. Their only legitimate—though indispensable—theoretical use is to regulate the understanding's cognition of objects: reason sets down the conditions under which the understanding's activity will have achieved its ideal completion in the systematic interconnection of its cognitions, i.e., in an ultimate science. Reason thereby offers the understanding a rule—viz. maximal scope and maximal internal systematicity—against which any actually achieved system of science must be measured; and because human finitude makes it impossible in principle for any actual system to attain the ideal maximum, reason also spurs the understanding on towards ever new discoveries and reorganizations.
While Natorp often seems to blur the distinction between Kantian categories and ideas, collapsing them both into “hypotheses” (see below), there is one notion that functions as an ideal: the Ding an sich. According to Natorp, the thing in itself, properly conceived, is a “pure limit-concept [Grenzbegriff], which merely delimits [begrenzt] experience in its own creative legislation” (Natorp 1912c: 199); more precisely, the thing in itself is not some mind-independent X, but rather an X necessarily implied by the fact of scientific progress, namely the “epitome [Inbegriff] of scientific knowledge” (Natorp 1918a: 19). Because science is an activity of reason alone, and the thing in itself is a rational posit necessary for that activity, it is no longer in conflict with the postulate of reason's autonomy. Given an object of scientific cognition, the cognition is conceived as a process never “definitively concluded,” as Cohen says; rather, “every true concept is a new question, none is a final answer” (Cohen 1885, cited at Natorp 1918a: 19). Natorp comments: “Just this is the meaning of the thing in itself as X: the infinite task” (Natorp 1918a: 19). In other words, the thing in itself is the ideal of an object exhaustively determined by concepts, that is, completely known. As with Kant, however, our cognitive finitude means that the process of conceptual determination can only approach this ideal asymptotically. This pursuit of total determination is what Natorp calls “method,” the pursuit of science.
This brings us to the key notion of “hypothesis.” The pursuit of science—its “method”in Natorp's special sense—proceeds by hypothesis. Sometimes he puts it more pointedly: hypothesis is method. Since method is for him a “going-after” or pursuit of the “perpetually distant goal” or focus imaginarius of complete objective determination, Natorp interprets “hypothesis” in a correspondingly active sense. He takes the term “hypo-thesis” quite literally as a “setting-down” or “laying-under,” or as he puts it, a “Ge-setz” or “Grund-legung.” These glosses all emphasize the activity of hypothesis: it is less a posit than a positing, and act by which thinking proceeds and becomes experience. Natorp writes:
The risk [Wagnis] [of hypothesizing] is inevitable if the process of experience should begin and continue moving: just as my foot must take a stand if it is to be able to walk. This taking a stand is necessary, but the stand must in turn always be left behind. (Natorp 1912c: 203)
The act of hypothesis has two aspects. First, hypothesis as law (Gesetz) or groundwork (Grundlegung) is for Natorp the transcendental foundation for scientific experience, i.e., for the activity of legislating and thus rationally understanding the phenomena. The phenomena in question are not however the sensible phenomena of subjective, psychic experience, but are instead themselves theoretical constructions or interpretations. These constructions in turn are founded on hypotheses of a lower order, viz. on specific concepts formulated to transmute particular subjective experiences into objective knowledge. To take up our earlier example, when the astronomer speaks of planets and their laws of motion, he is speaking objectively of scientific phenomena, as opposed to the subjective appearance of sensible phenomena to you or me. Therefore, on Natorp's view, strange as it may sound, the phenomenon “Mars” is an hypothesis, an object certainly, but for all that an ideal and never fully determined thought-object; moreover, the motion of this object, too, is ideal: it can be calculated with the utmost exactitude. It is these two hypotheses—“Mars” and the laws governing motion—that alone are objective, and susceptible to knowledge; the reddish speck in the sky is merely a subjective appearance, of which there can be “acquaintance,” perhaps, but no (astronomical) science.
To pull our strands together, thinking in the strict sense is scientific thinking, for it alone is generative of knowledge, i.e., objective truth. Science (and therefore knowledge) as a matter of fact evolves through time: science is a fieri. However, this evolution or fieri is not unregulated, but moves in a continuous pursuit of ever more precise determinations of experience, and this pursuit is literally called “method.” These determinations of experience just are the objects of science. The philosophical task therefore is to analyze the condition of possibility of the regularity of this methodical determination of experience. Natorp (like Cohen) identifies this condition as hypothesis, interpreted as law (Ge-setz, posit); experience in the strict sense is only possible given a law (Gesetz) that functions as its interpretational groundwork or foundation (Grundlegung). The first hypothesis or primal posit then must be the law of lawfulness, the rational postulate that experience, in order to be Erfahrung, and not mere Erlebnis, must accord with law, i.e., be grounded on a rational foundation. This categorical imperative that all its experience fall under law is the originary act of reason wherein lies its ultimate autonomy; it is the regulative principle of the continuous, orderly flow of experience. As a general, purely formal law it regulates the particular hypotheses that in turn generate or ground particular objects of Erfahrung (such as “Mars,” “electricity,” “atom,” or “gravity”) in the regulated process of their ever wider and ever more rigorous determination. How it does this is a separate problem, one that Natorp attempts to solve through his system of categories, treated in the next section.
Just as “experience” for the neo-Kantians is restricted to “scientific experience,” so too is “thinking” restricted to “scientific thinking;” in fact, Natorp virtually conflates experience and thinking. His view of science as the movement (Gang) of method via hypotheses regulated by an ideal of complete objective determination leaves the problem of what exactly these hypotheses do and how they do it: the problem of Marburg “logic.” As Cassirer points out, Natorp's conception of logic presses the traditional “analytic” doctrines of concept, judgement, and syllogistic into the background in favor of the “synthetic” logic of the genesis of mathematical and physical objectivity. Natorp's logic is therefore called “genetic,” telling how thinking lawfully generates or synthesizes the unities that are its objects of knowledge. As such however it amounts to an analytic reconstruction of thinking's synthetic construction of its objects. He writes:
It is true that thinking operates [schafft] (in the sciences) in accord with secure laws of synthesis, although to a large extent it is at the same time unconscious of these laws. [As science] its interest is not primarily these laws, but rather the scientific content which is generated in virtue of them. Thinking is in each case focused upon its particular object. An entirely new level of reflection is required to investigate, not the particular object, but the laws in accordance with which this and any scientific object in general first constitutes itself as an object. This new kind of reflection we call “logic.” (Natorp 1910c: 10-11)
In other words, the scientific hypotheses or laws (Ge-setze) by which science methodically, synthetically progresses are not transparent to rationality qua scientific rationality; they must be analogically retraced by a critical “logic.”This is because the scientist is, and should be, solely concerned with the laws in accordance with which the phenomena (objectively, not psychologically conceived) may be coherently ordered and determined as an objectivity. Scientific thinking is the “legislating” (hypothesizing) of these laws; logic—philosophy—is the laws in accordance with which this legislation occurs: reason's constitution as opposed to its statutes.
For Natorp, as for Kant, thinking is activity, doing: the technical term is “function.” This word, however, is as ambiguous as it is central to the Marburg account of thinking. Occasionally, “function” seems to mean something like subjective, psychic act, and as such is excluded from epistemological consideration; usually, however, it signifies the spontaneity of thinking, not in psychological terms, but as the rational act of hypothetical legislation discussed earlier. In this second signification it is sometimes connected with “function” in the mathematical sense, or else mathematical functions are adduced as paradigmatic of the functional conception of thinking. The standard sense of “function” for Natorp, then, is that of an act or “operation” of thinking, where this means laying down a hypothesis. Since the hypothesis is always a concept, a generality that imposes a unity upon a phenomenal manifold, we can understand “function” more precisely as an act of unification or synthesis.
For Kant, too, the term, “function,” is always connected to the categories' spontaneity and their synthetic activity; further, he holds that true cognition (Erkenntnis) can only occur if the synthesis in question “schematizes” representations given in intuition. By contrast, Natorp understands all concepts as functional, i.e., as categorial, since all of them, including the concepts of space and time, are thought-operations serving to unify a manifold. As we saw above, Natorp rejects any notion of intuition as a passive faculty receptive of a given sensible manifold. Instead, he interprets intuition as itself an act of synthesis, i.e., as a generation of unity. He argues that a critical account of knowledge is not justified in presupposing some object conceived as existing radically independent of mind, and which then somehow affects it via intuition: to do so would be tantamount to an intolerable “metaphysicism” (Natorp 1912c: 202). Rather, Natorp claims to find in the first Critique itself the basis for his view that intuition is not a factor “alien to thought [denkfremd],” but that it merely signifies a different aspect of thinking, viz. that aspect in which a fully spatio-temporally determined object, rather than merely a law, is thought. This “fulfillment [Vollzug]” of objective thought “in each of its stages requires rigorously unambiguous determination, but determination always with respect to the lawful functions of thinking itself: determination of the particular, of quantity, of quality, in accord with the relation of causality and its laws” (Natorp 1912c: 204). On this view, far from being separate from and opposed to thinking as they seem to be in the first Critique, space and time, as the forms of intuition, are originary thought-acts that make possible the determination of any object whatsoever. They are hypothesized, synthetic manifolds, or—more precisely—unified, ordered manifolds of points or “positions” (Stellen) into which any object must first be integrated if it is to undergo any further determination as to quantity, quality, etc. Thus, only in virtue of these various synthetic procedures of progressive determination, which Natorp calls “objectivation” (i.e., object-formation), can a phenomenon even appear. But how does it appear? Since intuition and thinking are being analyzed here entirely at the “functional” level, the phenomenon evidently does not appear as a sensible object, i.e., one that may be assigned a unique set of spatio-temporal loci, and that then could serve as a carrier (Träger) of all further determinations of quality, quantity, or relation.
This then raises the following pressing question: if, as he argues, intuition is itself a synthetic activity, what “matter” does it synthesize, if not the sensible manifold? Natorp is distressingly elusive on this point, even in his explicit discussions of the status of time and space in science. The following is clear, however. Like Kant, Natorp understands thinking always to be thinking an object. For Natorp, however, this means “constituting,” “constructing,” or “objectivating” the object. But since he (re)interprets these objects as non-sensible phenomena, he also interprets space and time non-psychologically, i.e., as non-sensible. They are not the forms of sensible intuition, but the ideal system of dimensions (three spatial dimensions plus time, conceived as “structures of a purely mathematical kind, which nonetheless go beyond mere number, in virtue of the general relation to existence [that is] contained in their very concepts” (Natorp 1910c: 341).
Thus a very crucial distinction must be made between two levels of phenomenality and of objectivity, which for the purposes of this article shall be called “first-order” and “second-order.” A first-order phenomenon is the psychic, subjective appearance that Natorp tacitly acknowledge has a basis in sensibility, and which he calls the “Phänomen letzter Instanz” or the “phenomenon of final authority” (Natorp 1887: 273, 274; 1913b: 192); this first-order phenomenon is a “Vorstellung,” or “representation,” i.e., a doxic phenomenon. Hence it cannot be the referent of knowledge or science, since science does not concern itself with doxic appearances as such, but the objects (or objectivities) which appear in or through the appearances.
But how are we to understand this “appearing” of an object “through” the doxic appearances? What, precisely, is the relation between the first-order and second-order “phenomena”? In the places where he explicitly mentions sensibility in the concrete, psychological sense, Natorp conceives it as never conveying or “giving” the mind an object, ready-made. Rather, “what” sensibility gives is so entirely indeterminate and uncoordinated that it cannot even be called a manifold; whatever the chaos of sensibility may be, Natorp conceives it as nothing more than a task (Aufgabe), problem, or demand (Forderung) for objectivity, that is, objectivation. Since no thing (no object) is ever given in sensibility, any object is only ever constructed, and can only be known qua construction, viz. as an instance of its constituting law.
Natorp everywhere likens this problematic relation of first-order phenomenality and second-order objectivity to solving for X in an equation. If the solution(-set) of X is the object for which thinking is to solve, then the sensible appearance is analogous to the notational cipher, “X,” itself, since what-has-not-yet-been-experienced is simply what-has-not-yet-been-constructed. Moreover, just as in solving an equation one can only determine the X in light of other known quantities assumed in the equation, one must in the same way establish the determinations of the problematic object in light of other objectivities (laws) that are assumed (ge-setzt). No such objectivities are ever granted absolutely, of course, but only relatively, namely with respect to the particular problem. They, too, are always susceptible to becoming problems in their turn. Therefore no complete solution—no total determination of the object—can be achieved for any X, except asymptotically. While the fully determinate object itself thus remains a forever unreachable focus imaginarius (See Section 3), it is, by the same token, always at least partially determined. And it is this partially determined objectivity as itself a (non-sensible) object of thinking that Natorp considers the second-order phenomenon, even though he will usually just call it a “phenomenon,” simpliciter. This scientific phenomenon, as an objectivity that is progressively constituted by a dialectic between hypothesis and calculation, entirely loses any sense of “appearance.” This reconception of the phenomenon of mathematical physics of course has its precise analogue in geometry's replacement of constructions “in intuition” by purely logical deductions from Grundlagen (or “functions” in the sense of “hypothetical act”) as epitomized by Hilbert's Grundlagen der Geometrie, a book cited with approval by Natorp and Cassirer.
The question now is: what makes the second-order phenomenon a bona fide objectivity, in contrast to the first-order phenomenon? Whereas the first-order phenomena constitute private, lived subjectivity, not open to prediction or even adequate description, Natorp's answer is that the second-order object is constructed in accordance with laws of thinking, which as laws are in their very nature objective, i.e., universally valid for any thinker. Therefore objects (Gegenstände) lawfully determined will in principle be rationally transparent to any other thinker, i.e., “objective” (objektiv, gegenständlich). Any such lawful objectivation or object-formation just is knowledge or science, in the sense of being objectively thinkable. These laws of constitution are in turn hierarchically arranged: the highest, most general laws are those governing all possible thinking, and thus the generation of all experience. These are followed by mathematics, and by all the mathematically “exact” sciences. As was shown in Section 3, Natorp conceives these laws (Ge-setze) as essentially “hypothetical,” that is, as categorial posits. With the apparent exception of the basic logical laws (e.g., the indispensable “law of laws”), all such laws are in principle revisable (which is chiefly why the determination of objectivities must be conceived as asymptotic).
Hence, philosophy, as transcendental critique (see Section 1), is “sharply distinguished from any kind of ‘psychologism’” and “maintains its rigorously objective character” (Natorp 1912c: 198). Why? Because its point of departure are the objective “formations” [Gestaltungen] of human culture, as objectivities, not as products of subjective psychological operations (Natorp 1912c: 198). In other words, philosophy always begins from the second-order phenomena. Moreover, the psychological inquiry is, Natorp argues, necessarily posterior to the philosophical one, since there is no “immediate access to the immediacy of psychic experience [Erlebnis]; it can only be approached by a [methodical] regression from its objectivations, which must therefore [first] be secured in their own purely objective justification” (Natorp 1912c: 198).
We finally turn to the Marburg thesis that philosophy, as philosophy of science, must also be the philosophical history of science. For science, as a fieri (a doing) evolves over time; hence the activity of its basic functions and the regulated mutation of its laws can only be observed through time. Yet this historical tracing of the progress of science must be philosophically informed, that is, grounded in the transcendentally isolated system of basic functions. As mentioned above, Natorp holds that the entire value of the transcendental method is normative: having laid bare the categorial functions in their purity, science can be judged as to its rigor, i.e., its submission to rational legislation. The Marburgers, with this criterion in hand, enthusiastically apply it in praise and blame.
A historiographical commonplace of neo-Kantianism has it that the labor of grounding the sciences was divided between the Marburg and Southwest Schools, the former attending to the natural sciences, the latter to the human sciences or Geisteswissenschaften. Recent scholarship has complicated this picture, reminding us of Rickert's contributions to philosophy of natural science, and noting that the Marburg School, too, has a theory of history. Already Cohen argues that the disciplinary division between systematic philosophy and the history of philosophy is artificial and harmful; he insists that “the study of philosophy requires the connection of the systematic and historical interest” (Cohen 1902: 440).
Still, the common view, if one-sided, is not wrong, for the Marburg theory of history has a very different starting-point than does the Southwest School. Unlike Rickert and Windelband, Cohen and Natorp do not begin their theory of history from the “fact” of historical science, in the way they begin their theory of natural science from the “fact” of mathematical physics. When they speak of history, they mean, on the one hand, the history of science, and on the other, the history of philosophy, properly construed, namely as the critique of science. Only secondarily are they interested in political, economic, or social history, and only insofar as it advances their primary project.
The Marburg conception of genuine philosophy as in the first place a transcendental logic of natural science therefore restricts history to a history of “scientific idealism.” In rejecting the view that scientific progress is better understood exclusively from a “systematic” perspective, “detache[d] … from its historical bonds,” Cohen remarks that the “very value and security of science is rooted in its own history, connected, as it were, with the general history of mind [Geist]” (Cohen 1916: 310). This sounds odd since we have heard again and again that science is rooted in its method, but now are told it is rooted in its history. Perhaps the paradox is only seeming, for there is an intimate connection between the Marburg School's notion of hypothesis as the active posit of mind, on the one hand, and its notion of science as essentially historical, on the other. Their conception of the logic of science as the dynamic Gang of categorial hypotheses implies that science can only be grasped developmentally, i.e., historically.
The Marburg view of that history differs importantly from Hegel's, with which it might seem to have much in common, in two respects: first, it is not based upon a sequence of conceptual contradiction and resolution; second, the history of science's development is relativistic, that is, in principle incapable of achieving an “absolute” resolution. Let me focus on the first of these differences. For Hegel, history is the linear evolution of Geist's self-knowledge through time; the further to the right you go, the more advanced the stage of (self-)consciousness. These stages—the “phenomena”—of Geist are inseparable from, indeed just are their cultural manifestations. Cohen and Natorp, too, take genuine history to be the history of rational self-consciousness, but for them this simply means reason's transcendental, reflective consciousness of the basis of science, that is, method. This principle of lawfulness is in itself unchanging, eternal, atemporal; it is not expressed “in” phenomena, but instead makes possible and generates phenomena as such; and indeed (as we saw above) generates time itself as a condition of the possibilty of phenomena. Because its object—this rational insight into reason's own principle—is essentially detached from time, history for the Marburg School is not conceived with respect to time. Of course science develops in time, and may be tracked diachronically along a time-line, yet its innermost core is the self-same atemporal idea, around which science circles, its progression represented by ever wider, but concentric orbits. Thus the history of science is itself ideal, in the sense of focusing solely upon those moments of reflective illumination when science becomes self-conscious—through philosophy—of its rational foundation or transcendental nucleus. Cohen writes: “In the history of every science the history of scientific reason in general always fulfills itself concentrically” (Cohen 1916: 310). He considers the fact that each of these moments of self-consciousness must occur in concrete circumstances and have a unique point on a real time-line to be as obvious as it is irrelevant.
The transcendental nucleus is method, and method is the meaning of idealism; hence, idealism is born when reason becomes self-conscious of its thinking as methodical and scientific. Since this birth has a historical locus, Cohen argues, “idealism's historical origin … conditions idealism through its connection with the methodological foundation of science no less than its material origin in methodology” (Cohen 1916: 309). Put another way, idealism connects with its methodological foundation by connecting with its historical origin. It follows that idealism has two related historical tasks: the primary task is to open and maintain a direct avenue to its origin. This involves a secondary task, viz. retracing previous scientific connections to that same primal idealism, which alone can serve as the criterion of the “relatedness [Verwandtheit] of different phases of science.” The history of idealism is therefore not of its evolution (as is the history of science) but of its rebirths.
The history of science is a history of often contradictory or incommensurable theories, each of which is represented in Cohen's image as a ring. Nonetheless, as scientific, the variety of theories all express the central, unitary activity of reason: positing hypotheses. Because of this constant unity of scientific reason, a “continuous connection of reason and the fundamental forces [Grundkräfte] of its history is required” (Cohen 1916: 310). By “fundamental forces” Cohen just means Greek antiquity, specifically Plato:
Plato is the founder of the system of philosophy … because he founded logic [in the Marburg sense], and thereby the system of philosophy. He is generally to be understood as the founder of idealism. But the word, “idealism,” in the whole history of culture, in which it has against the odds remained the guiding watchword, has only emerged at certain illuminating turning-points from an unclear and imprecise meaning. (Cohen 1902: 446)
History's “illuminating turning-points,” where idealism's meaning manifests itself clearly and distinctly, are the moments when the generative principle of scientific knowledge shines forth—i.e., when a critical, reflective perspective upon method is achieved—drawing the mind from its hyperbolic forays back into the regular orbit of reason, when we realize that we cannot simply be guided by the things as they appear to us. They are moments of reason's recollection, rebirth, and self-renewal.
Hence the Marburgers consider it of the utmost significance that their heroes—especially Galileo, Leibniz, and Kant—explicitly link their conceptions of science back to Plato. As Cohen and Natorp select and interpret their idealistic predecessors, they see illustrated in them the crucial immanent role of historical reflection in science, by which it ascends to transcendental self-reflection upon its methodological foundation. As Cohen puts it, “history is … a sign [Wahrzeichen] of the inner life and growth of all problems of scientific reason as they emerge out of the root of their methodology” (Cohen 1916: 310); and that root is, historically, Plato: “Idealism is the Idealism of the Platonic Idea” (Cohen 1916: 305). For Cohen and Natorp, “Plato” signifies the organizing principle of science as a historically unfolding, living enterprise. To stop reading Plato is to subtract science from its rational core, and deprive it—not of its method, which it will always have qua science—but of self-transparency of its own pure foundation and legitimacy.
Although history, according to Cohen, “discloses the origin of idealism from the start,” we must rely no less upon our methodic understanding of idealism in order “to recognize this idealism correctly wherever it appears” (Cohen 1916: 305). This statement confirms the hermeneutic inseparability of system and history: each supports the other. By “systematically” determining idealism as the method of science, we enable idealism to recognize itself in its historical manifestations; these manifestations, in turn, furnish the “fact” of science to be systematically determined. This reciprocity of history and theory informs the following passage, in which Cohen links Plato with the Marburg program.
The concept of idealism must be determined logically. This determination is the profoundest task and the highest content of logic. Plato found this determination by establishing logic's connection to science, and thus grounding logic. The determination lies in the concept of the Idea [i.e., Platonic form], the misunderstanding of which led necessarily to the indeterminacy of the notion of idealism itself. What does “Idea” signify? (Cohen 1902: 447)
In other words, to succeed in the methodic or “logical” determination of idealism, we can do no better than ask the historical question of how Plato “hits upon this determination.”
This is precisely the task Natorp sets himself in Platos Ideenlehre [Plato's Doctrine of Ideas]. True to the Marburg view that idealism can only be understood by retracing its development, Natorp simultaneously reconstructs the idealistic meaning of the dialogues and the “logical” order in which they must have been composed. He takes a double-pronged approach by arguing, on the one hand, that the Platonic ideai (forms or ideas) are in fact correctly understood to have a “critical” sense; and, on the other hand, by explaining why this critical intent of Plato (and by extension of all other critical idealists) was misconstrued not only by Aristotle and virtually the whole tradition, but even, at times, by Plato himself. That mistaken reading consists in taking the ideas to be substances, i.e., really existent things, which however have a purely noetic, or rather, noumenal character; whose appearances (the “particulars”) may be sensible, but which in themselves exist “separately,” open only to a quasi-mystical vision. Kant himself of course understood Plato in just this way, chastising him for flying beyond the limits of reason on the wings of intellectual intuition.
Natorp by contrast argues—over the course of 500 pages—that while Plato may for various reasons talk in a way that encourages such a reading, his most mature, sober, and self-critical dialogues support a categorial interpretation of the forms as “hypotheses” in the special sense discussed in Section 3. Thus, the problems of how the ideas could exist apart from the world of real particulars, and whether pure reason has a special intuitive faculty capable of bridging the gulf, evaporate, once we recognize the immanent operation of the ideai as the categorial hypotheses that are the conditions of possibility of thinking in general, and of science in particular. Thus Natorp interprets the supreme form, the form of the Good, as the “law of lawfulness,” i.e., the unifying source of both theoretical and practical reason, while the five “great kinds” of the Sophist are seen as mutually implicative logical Grundbegriffe or “root-categories” of all predicative thinking. These ideai are no more separately existent, according to Natorp, than are Kant's categories: they are not transcendent so much as they are transcendental. It has been the incapacity of all (Aristotelian) realists or “dogmatists” to grasp this distinction that has led to the chronic misunderstandings of Plato and all other “criticists”.
The Marburg “theory” of history to which Natorp subscribes, and in light of which he writes his Platos Ideenlehre, is this: Plato's moment of insight into the truth of transcendental idealism (à la Cohen), is followed by millenia of dark irrelevance, punctuated by shining rings of recollection, epitomized by Galileo, Newton, and Kant. This picture of Marburg Philosophiegeschichtsphilosophie will strike many as downright surreal; still, it only seems right to note the following. Though we must understand the Marburg conception of history to grasp their motivation for reading and re-reading Plato, we need not accept that conception in order to appreciate either Natorp's genetic logic of science or his reading of Plato. As Lembeck puts it in the introduction to his (1994):
It is not a matter of proving that Plato's philosophy is not transcendental idealism; that is so obvious as to be taken for granted. It is however something entirely else to show why Cohen and Natorp believe that Plato, at least in principle, laid the groundwork for this idealism. (Lembeck 1994: 5)
Fortunately for them, we can betray their idée fixe of Plato as the living heart of transcendental idealism without, as they would think, destroying or dismissing their work. Indeed, one can perhaps better appreciate the value of Natorp's reading of Plato if one does not think of it as support for Marburg idealism as such, but simply as an ingenious attempt to make sense of the relation of ideal form and empirical particular, an attempt that merely employs the logic of categorial functions—as a hypothetical springboard.
|2003.||Plato's Theory of Ideas. Politis, Vasilis, ed. Politis, Vasilis, Connolly, John, trans. Sankt Augustin: Akademia Verlag. Forthcoming.|
|1986a.||Letters from and to Natorp (1883-1921), as well as other documents. In Holzhey 1986, vol. 2: 141-496.|
|1986b.||Manuscripts from the Nachlass. In Holzhey 1986, vol. 2: 5-140. They include: “Zu Cohens Logik;” “Zu Cohens Logik (Entwurf für Die logischen Grundlagen der exakten Wissenschaften);” “Quantität und Qualität in Cohens Kantinterpretation;” “Synthetische Einheit und Ursprung (aus einer ‘Einleitung zur Allgemeinen Logik’);” “Zu Cohens Religionsphilosophie.”|
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|1890e.||Review of E. Zeller's Grundriss der griechischen Philosophie (Leipzig, 1889). Philosophische Monatshefte 26: 362-363.|
|1890f.||Review of W. Windelband's Geschichte der alten Philosophie (Nördlingen, 1888) and Geschichte der Philosophie(Freiburg, 1890). Philosophische Monatshefte 26: 356-362.|
|1890g.||“Neue Schriften zur Skepsis im Altertum.” Philosophische Monatshefte 26: 61-75.|
|1890h.||“Demokrit-Spuren bei Platon.” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 3: 515-531.|
|1890i.||“Aristipp in Platos Theätet.” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 3: 347-362.|
|1890j.||“Aristoteles und die Eleaten.” Philosophische Monatshefte 26: 1-16; 147-169.|
|1889a.||Review of L.v.Sybel's Platons Symposion. Ein Programm der Akademie Marburg (1888). Philosophische Monatshefte 25: 235-240.|
|1889b.||Review of K. Joel's Zur Erkenntnis der geistigen Entwicklung und der schriftstellerischen Motive Platos (Berlin, 1887). Philosophische Monatshefte 25: 232-235.|
|1889c.||“Über Grundabsicht und Entstehungszeit von Platons Gorgias.” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 2: 394-413.|
|1889d.||“Neue Schriften zur platonischen Frage.” Philosophische Monatshefte 25: 340-359.|
|1889e.||“Philosophie und Wissenschaft der Vorsokratiker.” Philosophische Monatshefte 25: 204-223.|
|1889f.||“Platos Phädros.” Philologus, NS 428-449; 583-628.|
|1888a.||“Neue Heraklit-Forschungen.” Philosophische Monatshefte 24: 88-102.|
|1888b.||Review of T. Gomperz's Platonische Aufsätze (Vienna, 1887). Philosophische Monatshefte 24: 485-488.|
|1888c.||Review of E. Zeller's Über die Unterscheidung einer doppelten Gestalt der Ideenlehre in den platonischen Schriften (Berlin, 1887). Philosophische Monatshefte 24: 481-485.|
|1888d.||“Ueber Demokrits gnêsiê gnômê.” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 1: 348-356.|
|1888e.||“Aristoteles' MetaphysikK 1-8, 1065a26.” Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 1: 178-193.|
|1888f.||“Thema und Disposition der aristotelischen Metaphysik.” Philosophische Monatshefte 24: 37-65; 540-574.|
|1888g.||“Zum Eingang.” Philosophische Monatshefte 23: 1-8.|
|1888h.||Einleitung in die Psychologie nach kritischer Methode. Freiburg.|
|1887.||“Ueber objektive und subjektive Begründung der Erkenntniss (Erster Aufsatz).” Philosophische Monatshefte 23: 257-286.|
|1886.||Review of M. Guggenheim's Die Lehre vom apriorischen Wissen in ihrer Bedeutung für die Entwicklung der Ethik und Erkenntnistheorie in der Sokratisch-Platonischen Philosophie (Berlin, 1885). Philosophische Monatshefte 23: 236-239.|
|1885a.||Review of E. Hardy's Der Begriff der Physis in der griechischen Philosophie (Berlin, 1884). Philosophische Monatshefte 21: 572-593.|
|1885b.||Review of H. Siebeck's Geschichte der Psychologie (2 vols., Gotha, 1880, 1884). Philosophische Monatshefte 21.|
|1884a.||Review of A. Harpf's Die Ethik des Protagoras und deren zweifache Moralbegründung, kritisch untersucht (Heidelberg, 1884). Göttinger gelehrte Anzeigen: 784-795.|
|1884b.||Forschungen zur Geschichte des Erkenntnisproblems im Altertum: Protagoras, Demokrit, Epikur und die Skepsis. Berlin. Reprinted, Darmstadt, 1965.|
|1883.||“Untersuchungen über die Skepsis im Altertum: Aenesidem.” Rheinisches Museum für Philologie, NS 38: 28-91.|
|1882a.||“Die kosmologische Reform des Kopernikus in ihrer Bedeutung für die Philosophie.” Preußische Jahrbücher 49: 355-375.|
|1882b.||“Analekten zur Geschichte der Philosophie.” Philosophische Monatshefte 18: 567-577.|
|1882c.||“Galilei als Philosoph. Eine Skizze.” Philosophische Monatshefte 18: 193-229.|
|1882d.||“Descartes' Erkenntnistheorie. Eine Studie zur Vorgeschichte des Kritizismus.” Habilitationsschrift (1881). Marburg.|
|1881a.||“Leibniz und der Materialismus.” Holzhey, Helmut, ed. Studia Leibnitiana 17 (1985): 1-14.|
|1881b.||“Über das Verhältniß des theoretischen und praktischen Erkennens zur Begründung einer nichtempirischen Realität. Mit Bezug auf W. Herrmann, Die Religion im Verhältniß zum Welterkennen und zur Sittlichkeit.” Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik, 79: 242-259.|