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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
The term ‘nationalism’ is generally used to describe two phenomena: (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity, and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take when seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty. (1) raises questions about the concept of nation (or national identity), which is often defined in terms of common origin, ethnicity, or cultural ties, and while an individual's membership in a nation is often regarded as involuntary, it is sometimes regarded as voluntary. (2) raises questions about the whether sovereignty must be understood as the acquisition of full statehood with complete authority for domestic and international affairs, or whether something less is required.
It is traditional, therefore, to distinguish nations from states -- whereas a nation often consists of an ethnic or cultural community, a state is a political entity with a high degree of sovereignty. While many states are nations in some sense, there are many nations which are not fully sovereign states. As an example, the Native American Iroquois constitute a nation but not a state, since they do not possess the requisite political authority over their internal or external affairs. If the members of the Iroquois nation were to strive to form a sovereign state in the effort to preserve their identity as a people, they would be exhibiting a kind of nationalism.
Nationalism has long been ignored as a topic in political philosophy, written off as a relic from bygone times. It has only recently come into the focus of philosophical debate, partly in consequence of rather spectacular and troubling nationalist clashes, like those in Rwanda, former Yugoslavia and former Soviet republics. The surge of nationalism usually presents a morally ambivalent, and for this reason often fascinating, picture. ‘National awakening’ and struggle for political independence are often both heroic and inhumanly cruel; the formation of a recognizably national state often responds to deep popular sentiment, but can and does sometimes bring in its wake inhuman consequences, including violent expulsion and ‘cleansing’ of non-nationals, all the way to organized mass murder. The moral debate on nationalism reflects a deep moral tension between solidarity with oppressed ethnic national groups on the one hand and the repulsion people feel in the face of crimes perpetrated in the name of nationalism on the other. Moreover, the issue of nationalism points to the wider domain of problems, having to do with the treatment of ethnic and cultural differences within democratic polity, which are arguably among the most pressing problems of contemporary political theory.
In this entry we shall first present conceptual issues of definition and classification (Sections 1 and 2), and then the arguments put forward in the moral debate (Section 3), dedicating more space to the arguments in favor of nationalism, than to those against it, in order to give the philosophical nationalist a proper hearing.
Although the term ‘nationalism’ has a variety of meanings, it centrally encompasses the two phenomena noted at the outset: (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their identity as members of that nation and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take in seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty. (See, for example, Nielsen 1998-9, 9.) Each of these aspects requires elaboration. (1) raises questions about the concept of nation or national identity, about what it is to belong to a nation, and about the degree of care about a nation required. Nations and national identity may be defined in terms of common origin, ethnicity, or cultural ties, and while an individual's membership in the nation is often regarded as involuntary, it is sometimes regarded as voluntary. The degree of care for one's nation that is required by nationalists is often, but not always, taken to be very high: on such views one's nation's claims have supremacy in competition with rival contenders for authority and loyalty (see Berlin 1979, Smith 1991, Levy 2000).
(2) raises questions about the whether sovereignty entails the acquisition of full statehood with complete authority for domestic and international affairs, or whether something less than statehood would suffice. Although sovereignty is often taken to mean full statehood (Gellner 1983, ch. 1), more recently possible exceptions have been recognized (Miller 1992, 87).
Despite these definitional worries, there is a fair amount of agreement about what is historically the most typical, paradigmatic form of nationalism. It is the one which features the supremacy of the nation's claims over other claims to individual allegiance, and which features full sovereignty as the persistent aim of its political program. Nationalists often see the state as a political unit centrally `belonging' to one ethnic-cultural group, and actively charged with protecting and promulgating its traditions. This form is exemplified by the classical, ‘revivalist’ nationalism, most prominent in the 19th century in Europe and Latin America. This classical nationalism later spread across the world, and in present days still marks many contemporary nationalisms.
Thus, in its general form, the concept of nationalism concerns the relationship between the ethno-cultural domain (featuring etho-cultural groups or ‘nations’) and the domain of political organization. In our preliminary analysis of the concept, we noted that nationalism involves the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity. We can divide the questions raised above in connection with this analysis into two sorts. First, the descriptive ones:
(1a) What is a nation and national identity?Second, the normative ones:
(1b) What is it to belong to a nation?
(1c) What is the nature of a pro-national attitude?
(1d) Is membership in a nation voluntary or non-voluntary?
(1e) Is the attitude of caring about national identity always appropriate?In the remainder of this section, we discuss the descriptive questions (1a) -- (1d). We leave questions (1e) and (1f) for Section 3, which concerns the moral debate.
(1f) How much should one to care?
If one wants to enjoin people to struggle for their national interests, one must have some idea about what a nation is and what it is to belong to a nation. So, in order to formulate and ground their evaluations, claims, and directives for action, pro-nationalist thinkers have been elaborating theories of ethnicity, culture, nation and state. Their opponents have in their turn challenged these theories. Now some presuppositions about ethnic groups and nations are essential for the nationalist, while others are theoretical elaborations designed to support the essential ones. The former concern the definition and status of the target or social group which is the beneficiary of the nationalist program, variously called ‘nation’, ‘ethno-nation’ or ‘ethnic-group’. Since nationalism is particularly prominent with groups that don't yet have a state, one can't define belonging to a nation in terms of belonging to a state.
Indeed, purely ‘civic’ loyalties are often put into the separate category under the title ‘patriotism’, or ‘constitutional patriotism’ (Habermas 1996). This yields a spectrum of definitions for the concept of ‘nation’, with lots of intermediate positions. On one end of the spectrum, we find a small but distinguished band of theorists, including E. Renan (1882) and M. Weber (1970). Recall that on their definition, a nation is any group of people who voluntarily aspire to a common political state-like organization. Recall also that if such a group of people succeeds in forming a state, the loyalties of the group members would be ‘civic’ (as opposed to ‘ethnic’) in nature. The other end of the spectrum is more typical, for nationalist claims are focused upon a community of common origin, language, tradition and culture, membership in which is non-voluntary. Thus, on this more typical view, an ethno-nation is a community of origin and culture, including prominently a language and customs.
The distinction between these two distinct concepts of nationhood is related (although not identical) to the one drawn by older schools of social and political science between ‘civic’ and ‘ethnic’ nationalism, the first being allegedly Western European and the later more Central and Eastern European originating in Germany (a very prominent proponent of the view is H. Kohn 1965). Philosophical discussions centered around nationalism tend to concern the ethnic-cultural variants only and this habit will be followed here. A group aspiring to nationhood on this basis will be called here an ‘ethno-nation’ in order to underscore its ethno-cultural rather than purely civic underpinnings. For the ethno-(cultural) nationalist it is one's ethnic-cultural background which determines one's membership in the community. One can't choose to be a member; instead, membership depends on the accident of origin and early socializing. It may be, however, that commonality of origin is an almost mythical notion for most contemporary candidate groups: ethnic groups have been mixing for millennia.
Therefore, sophisticated pro-nationalists tend to stress cultural membership only, and speak of ‘nationality’, omitting the ‘ethno-’ part (Miller 1992, 87; Tamir 1993). M. Seymour in his recent proposal of a ‘socio-cultural definition’ adds a political dimension to the purely cultural one. A nation is a cultural group, possibly but not necessarily united by a common descent, endowed with some kind of civic ties (Seymour 2000). This is the kind of definition that would be accepted by most parties in the debate today. So defined, nation is a somewhat mixed, both ethno-cultural and civic category, but still closer to the purely ethno-cultural than to the purely civic extreme.
The wider descriptive underpinning of nationalist claims has varied across the last two centuries. The early German discussions feature talk about ‘the spirit of people’, while somewhat later ones, mainly of French extraction, about ‘collective mentality’, ascribing to them specific and significant causal powers. A later descendent of this notion is the idea of a ‘national character’ peculiar to each nation, which partly survives today under the guise of national ‘forms of life’ and of feeling (Margalit 1997, see below). For almost a century, up to the end of the Second World War, it was customary to link nationalistic views with the metaphor of a society being something ‘organic’. Isaiah Berlin, writing as late as the early seventies, proposed as a part of his definition of nationalism that it consists of the conviction that people belong to a particular human group, and that "...the characters of the individuals who compose the group are shaped by, and cannot be understood apart from, those of the group ..." (first published in 1972, reprinted in Berlin, 1979: 341). The nationalist claims, according to Berlin, that "the pattern of life in a society is similar to that of a biological organism" (ibid.), and that the needs of this ‘organism’ determine the supreme goal of all of its members.
Most contemporary defenders of nationalism, especially philosophers, avoid such language. The metaphor of organism and talk about character have been replaced by one master-metaphor -- that of national identity. It is centered upon cultural membership, and used both for the identity of a group and for the socially-based identity of its members, e.g., the national identity of George in so far as he is English or British. Various authors unpack the metaphor in various ways -- some stress involuntary membership in the community, others the strength with which one identifies with the community, yet others link it to the personal identity of each member of the community. Addressing these issues, the nationally minded philosophers, like MacIntyre (1994), Taylor (1989), Seymour and others have significantly contributed to introducing and maintaining important topics such as community, membership, tradition and social identity in contemporary philosophical debate.
Let us now turn to the issue of the origin and ‘authenticity’ of ethno-cultural groups or ethno-nations. In social and political science one usually distinguishes two kinds of views. The first are the ‘primordialist’ views. According to them, actual ethno-cultural nations have either existed ‘since time immemorial’ (an extreme, somewhat caricatured version, corresponding to nineteenth century nationalist rhetoric), or at least for a long time during the pre-modern period (a more moderate version championed by A. Smith (1991)). The second are the modernist views, placing the origin of nations in modern times. They can be further classified according to their answer to a further question: how real is the ethno-cultural nation? The modernist realist view is that nations are real but distinctly modern creations, instrumental in the genesis of capitalism (Gellner 1983, and Hobsbawn 1990). On the opposite side of the fence one finds anti-realist views. According to one such view nations are merely ‘imagined’ but somehow still powerful entities; what is meant is that belief in them holds sway over the believers (Anderson 1965). The extreme anti-realist view claims that they are pure ‘constructions’. These divergent views seem to support rather divergent moral claims involving the concept of a nation.
Indeed, older authors -- from great thinkers like Herder and Bauer, to the propagandists who followed their footsteps -- have been at great pains to ground normative claims upon firm ontological realism about nations: nations are real, bona fide entities. However, the contemporary moral debate has tried to diminish the importance of the imagined/real divide. Prominent contemporary philosophers have claimed that normative-evaluative nationalist claims are compatible with the ‘imagined’ nature of nation. (See, for instance, Miller 1992, Tamir 1993, and MacCormick 1982.) They point out that common imaginings can tie people together, and that actual interaction resulting from togetherness can engender important moral obligations.
Let us now turn to question (1c), concerning the nature of pro-national attitudes. The explanatory issue that has interested political and social scientists concerns ethno-nationalist sentiment, the paradigm case of a pro-national attitude. Is it as irrational, romantic and indifferent to self-interest as it might seem on the surface? The issue has divided authors into two camps -- those who see nationalism as basically irrational and those who try to explain it as being rational at least in some sense. Authors in the first camp propose various explanations of why people assent to irrational views. Some say, critically, that nationalism is based on ‘false consciousness’. But where does such false consciousness come from? The most simplistic view is that it is a result of direct manipulation of ‘masses’ by ‘elites’. On the opposite side, the famous critic of nationalism, E. Kedourie (1960) sees this irrationality as being spontaneous. Authors relying upon the Marxist tradition offer various deeper explanations. To mention one, the French structuralist E. Balibar sees it as a result of ‘production’ of ideology effectuated by mechanisms which have nothing to do with spontaneous credulity of individuals, but with impersonal, structural social factors (Balibar and Wallerstein 1992).
Consider next the other camp of those who see nationalistic sentiments as being rational at least in some weak sense. Some authors claim that it is often rational for individuals to become nationalists (Hardin 1985). On the one hand, identification and cohesion within the ethno-national group has to do with inter-group cooperation, and cooperation is easier for those who are part of the same ethno-national group. To take an example of ethnic ties in a multiethnic state, a Vietnamese newcomer to the States will do well to rely on his co-nationals: common language, customs and expectations might help him a lot in finding his way in new surroundings. Once the ties are established and he has become part of a network, it is rational to go on cooperating, and ethnic sentiment does secure the trust and the firm bond needed for smooth cooperation. A further issue is when it is rational to switch sides; to stay with our example, when does it become profitable for our Vietnamese to develop an all-American patriotism. This has received a detailed elaboration in Laitin (1998), who uses material from the ex-Soviet Union. On the other hand, there is conflict between various ethno-nations which leads to non-cooperation with outsiders. Can one rationally explain the extremes of ethno-national conflict? Authors like Hardin propose to do it in terms of a general view of when a hostile behavior is rational: most typically, if you have no reason to trust someone, it is reasonable to take precautions against him. If both sides take precautions, however, each will tend to see the other as being seriously inimical. It then becomes rational to start treating the other as an enemy. Mere suspicion can thus lead by small, individually rational steps, to a situation of conflict. (Such negative development is often presented as a variant of the so-called Prisoner's Dilemma.) Now, it is relatively easy to spot the circumstances in which this general pattern applies to national solidarities and conflicts. The line of thought just sketched is often called ‘rational choice approach’. It has enabled the application of conceptual tools from game-theoretic and economic theories of cooperative and non-cooperative behavior for explanation of ethno-nationalism.
It is worth mentioning, however, that the individualist rational-choice approach, centered upon personal rationality, has serious competitors. A tradition in social psychology, initiated by Tajfel (1981), shows that individuals may identify with a randomly selected group, even when membership in the group brings no tangible rewards. Does rationality of any kind underlie this tendency of identification? Some authors (Sober & Wilson 1998) answer in the affirmative. They propose that it is a non-personal, evolutionary rationality: individuals who develop a sentiment of identification and sense of belonging end up better off in the evolutionary race, and that is why we have inherited such propensities. The initial sentiments were reserved for one's own kin, thus supporting the spreading of one's own genes. Cultural evolution has taken over the mechanisms of identification that initially developed within biological evolution. As a result, we project the sentiment originally reserved for kinship to our cultural group. Further, detailed explanations in such socio-biological perspective differ a lot among themselves, and constitute a wide research program.
Finally, concerning question (1d), a nation is typically seen as essentially a non-voluntary community to which one belongs by birth and early nurture, whereby the relation of belonging is somehow enhanced and perhaps taken to a higher level, becoming more conscious and more complete by one's additional endorsement. (There are exceptions to this basically non-voluntaristic view, for instance, theoretical nationalists who accept voluntary changes of nationality. See also E. Renan's (1882, 19) famous definition of a nation as constituted by ‘everyday plebiscite’.)
Recall again our basic analysis, namely, that nationalism involves (1) the attitude that the members of a nation have when they care about their national identity, and (2) the actions that the members of a nation take when seeking to achieve (or sustain) some form of political sovereignty. The politically central point is (2), the actions enjoined by the nationalist. This point raises three important questions:
To these we now turn.
(2a) Does political sovereignty require statehood or something weaker? (2b) What actions are appropriate to bringing sovereignty about and maintain it? (2c) Under what conditions is it appropriate to take actions of this kind?
The classic (and conservative) answer to (2a) is that political sovereignty requires statehood, while the more liberal answer is that some form of political autonomy is required, though not necessarily full statehood. Consider the former, classic answer to (2a).
On this view, political sovereignty requires a state ‘rightfully owned’ by the ethno-nation (Oldenquist, 1997, who credits the expression to the writer C. Milosz). However, this classic form of nationalism is not only concerned with the creation of a state but also with its maintenance and strengthening. Once the state is there, further options are opened for nationalists. They sometimes promote claims for its expansion (even at the cost of wars) and sometimes opt for isolationist policies. The expansion is often justified by appeal to the unfinished business of bringing literally all members of the nation under one state, and sometimes justified simply as an interest the nation has in gaining more territory and resources. In doing this they often imply specific answers to (2b) and (2c), i.e., that in national independence struggle the use of force is almost always a legitimate means for bringing about sovereignty. As for maintenance of sovereignty by peaceful and merely ideological means, political nationalism is closely tied to nationalism in culture. The latter insists upon the preservation and transmission of a given culture, more accurately, of recognizably ethno-national traits of the culture in its pure form, dedicating artistic creation, education and research to this goal. Of course, the ethno-national traits can be actual or invented, partly or fully so. Again, in the classical variant the relevant norm claims that one has both a right and an obligation (‘a sacred duty’) to promote such traditions. Its force is that of a trump that wins over other interests and even over human rights (and this trump is often needed in order to carry on national independence struggle).
As a consequence, this classic form of nationalism has something to say about the level of attitudes as well. It answers question (1e) affirmatively, and sees caring for one's nation as a fundamental duty of each of its members. It is also prone to give, in its answer to (1f), an unlimited scope. We can now summarize this classic form of nationalism as follows:
Classical nationalism is the political program that seeks the creation and maintenance of a fully sovereign state owned by a given ethno-national group (‘people’ or ‘nation’) and that sees the creation and maintenance of this state as a primary duty of each member of the group. Starting from the assumption that the appropriate (or ‘natural’) unit of culture is ethno-nation, classical nationalism involves the claim that a primary duty of each member is to abide in cultural matters by one's recognizably ethno-national culture.
Classical nationalists are usually quite watchful about the kind of culture they protect and promote, and about the kind of attitude people have to their nation-state. This watchful attitude carries some potential dangers -- many elements of a given culture which are universalist or simply not recognizably national might, and will sometimes, fall prey to such nationalist enthusiasms. Classical nationalism in everyday life puts various additional demands on individuals, from buying more expensive home-produced goods in preference to the cheaper imported ones, to procreating as many future members of the nation as one can manage. (See Yuval-Davies 1997.)
The more liberal answer to question (2a), that some form of political automony less than full statehood is required to achieve nationalist goals, yields more moderate forms of nationalism. Indeed, the philosophical discussion has shifted to these moderate or even ultra-moderate forms, and most philosophers who describe themselves as nationalists propose very moderate nationalist programs. These more moderate forms involve weaker claims than the classic form, along a variety of dimensions. Indeed, a wider concept of nationalism is needed to accommodate the wide variety more moderate forms. Let us therefore define:
Nationalism in the wide sense is any complex of attitudes, claims and directives for action which ascribe a fundamental political, moral and cultural value to nation and nationality and which produce obligations (for individual members of the nation, and for any involved third parties, individual or collective) on the basis of this ascribed value.
Different forms of nationalism in this larger sense result when we vary the concept of nation involved, vary the ground and degree of its value, vary the scope of claims for action and of the prescribed obligations. (This wider concept of nationalism can also be applied to other cases not covered by classical nationalism, for instance, the hypothetical pre-state political forms that an ethnic identity might take). Moderate nationalism is a form of nationalism in the wider sense which is less demanding than classical nationalism. It sometimes goes under the name of ‘patriotism’. (A different usage, though, reserves ‘patriotism’ for valuing the civic community and loyalty to the state, in contrast to nationalism, which is centered around ethnic-cultural communities.) The various forms of nationalism most relevant for philosophy are those that influence the moral standing of claims for action and of recommended nationalist practices. The elaborate philosophical views put forward in favor of nationalism will be referred to here to as ‘theoretical nationalism’, the adjective serving to distinguish such views from the less sophisticated and more practical nationalist discourse. The central theoretical nationalist evaluative claims can usefully be put on the map of possible positions within political theory in the following somewhat simplified and schematic way.
Nationalistic claims featuring the centrality of nation for political action provide an answer to two crucial general questions. First, is there one kind of large social group (smaller than the whole of mankind) that is morally of central importance or not? The nationalist answer is that there is just one, namely, the nation. When an ultimate choice is to be made, nation has priority. (This answer is implied by rather standard definitions offered by Berlin and Smith.) Second, what is the ground of obligation that the individual has to the morally central group? Is it voluntary or involuntary membership in the group? The typical contemporary nationalist thinker answers by the latter, while admitting that voluntary endorsement of one's national identity is a morally important achievement. On the philosophical map, the pro-nationalist normative tastes fit nicely with the communitarian stance in general: most pro-nationalist philosophers are communitarians who choose nation as the preferred community (in contrast to those of their fellow-communitarians who prefer more far-ranging communities, such as those defined by global religious traditions). However, some recent writers, e.g., Kymlicka (2001), who describe themselves as liberal nationalists, reject the communitarian underpinning.
We now prepare the ground for the discussion of the normative dimension of nationalism. We shall first describe the very heart of the nationalist program, i.e., sketch and classify the typical normative and evaluative nationalist claims. These claims can be seen as answers to the normative subset of our initial questions about (1) pro-national attitudes and (2) actions.
The claims thus recommend various courses of action, centrally those meant to secure and sustain the political organization -- preferably a state -- for the given ethno-cultural national community, thereby making more specific the answers to our normative questions (1e), (1f), (2b) and (2c). Further, they enjoin the members of the community to promulgate recognizable ethno-cultural values, artifacts, and traditions as central features of the cultural life within such a state. Finally, we shall discuss various lines of pro-nationalist thought that have been put forward in defense of these claims. Let us begin with the claims which concern the furthering of the national state and culture. They are proposed by the nationalist as a guide and a norm of conduct. Philosophically the most important variations concern three aspects of such normative claims. They are as follows:
(i) The normative nature and strength of the claim. Does it promote just a right (say, to having and maintaining a form of political self-government, preferably and typically a state, or having the cultural life centered upon recognizably ethno-national culture), or a moral obligation (to get and maintain one), or a legal and political obligation? These differences can be described in professional terminology as variations in the ‘non-comparative deontic status’ of central claims. The strongest claim is typical for the classical nationalism: its norms are both moral imperatives and, once the nation-state is in place, legally enforceable obligations in regard to all parties concerned, including the individual members of the ethno-nation. A weaker, but still quite demanding version speaks only of moral obligation (‘sacred duty’). A more liberal version is satisfied simply with a right to having a state that would be ‘owned’ by the ethno-nation.
(ii) The strength of the nationalistic claim in relation to various external interests and rights. To give a real example, is the use of the domestic language so important that even international conferences should be held in it, at the cost of losing the most interesting participants from abroad? Since the force of the nationalist claim is here being weighed against the force of other claims, those of individual or group interests, or rights, one can call this dimension the ‘comparative deontic status’ of the claim. Variations in comparative deontic status take place on a continuum between two extremes. On one rather nasty extreme the nation-focused claims are seen as trumps that take precedence over any other claims, even over human rights. Further towards the center is the classical nationalism that gives nation-centered claims precedence over the interests and needs of the individual (including pragmatic collective utility), but not necessarily over general human rights. (See, for example, McIntyre 1994, Oldenquist, 1997.) On the opposite end, which is mild, humane and liberal, the central nationalistic claims are accorded prima facie status only (see Tamir, 1993).
(iii) For which groups are the nationalist claims meant to be valid, what is their scope? First, they can be valid for every ethno-nation and thereby universal. An example would be the claim "every ethno-nation should have its own state". To put it more formally, we have:
Universalist nationalism is the political program that claims that every ethno-nation should have its state which it should rightfully own, and whose interests it should promote.
Alternatively, a claim may be more particular, such as the claim "Group X ought to have a state", where this implies nothing about any other group:
Particularist nationalism is the political program that claims that some ethno-nation should have its state, without extending the claim to all ethno-nations. It does this either(A) by omission (unreflective particularist nationalism), or
(B) by explicitly specifying who is excluded: "Group X ought to have a state, but group Y should not" (invidious nationalism).
We have called the most difficult (and indeed chauvinistic) sub-case of particularism, i.e., (B), ‘invidious’ since it explicitly denies the privilege of having a state to some peoples. T. Pogge (1997) proposes a further division of (B) into the ‘high’ stance which denies statehood to some types of peoples, and the ‘low’ one which denies it to some particular peoples. Serious theoretical nationalists usually defend only the universalist variety, whereas the nationalist-in-the-street most often defends the particularist one (‘Some nations should have a state, above all mine!’). Classical nationalism comes both in particularist and universalist varieties.
Although the three dimensions of variation described above -- (i) internal deontic status, (ii) external deontic status, and (iii) scope -- are logically independent, they are psychologically and politically intertwined. People who are radical in one respect on the nationality issue tend also to be radical in other respects. In other words, attitudes tend to cluster together in stable clusters, so that extreme (or moderate) attitudes on one dimension psychologically and politically belong with extreme (or moderate) ones on others. The hybrids of extreme attitude on one dimension with moderate on the others are psychologically and socially unstable.
Recall our initial analysis, centered around (1) attitudes and (2) actions. Is national partiality justified and to what extent? What actions are appropriate to bringing sovereignty about? In particular, are ethno-national states and institutionally protected (ethno-) national cultures goods independent from the individual will of the members, and how far may one go in protecting them? The philosophical debate for and against nationalism is the debate about the moral validity of its central claims. In particular the ultimate moral issue is the following: is any form of nationalism morally permissible or justified, and, if not, how bad are particular forms of it?
Why do nationalist claims require a defense? In some situations they seem very plausible; for instance the plight of some stateless national groups -- the history of Jews and Armenians, the misfortunes of Kurds -- makes one spontaneously endorse the idea that if these groups had had their own state, serious problems would have been avoided. Still, there are good reasons to examine the general nationalist claims. The most general reason is that it should first be shown that the nation as such has some value and that claims in its favor have some normative validity. Once this is established, a further defense is needed. Some classical nationalist claims appear to clash -- at least under normal circumstances of contemporary life -- with various values that people tend to accept. Some of these values are considered essential to liberal-democratic societies, while others are important specifically for the flourishing of culture and creativity. The main values in the first set are individual autonomy and benevolent impartiality (most prominently towards members of groups culturally different from one's own). The alleged special duties towards one's ethno-national culture can interfere, and often do interfere, with individuals' right to autonomy. Also, if these duties are construed very strictly they can interfere with other individual rights, e.g., the right to privacy. Many feminist authors have noted that a suggestion typically offered by the nationalist, namely that women have a moral obligation to give birth to new members of the nation and to nurture them for the sake of the nation, clashes both with autonomy and privacy of these women (Yuval-Davis 1997). Another endangered value is diversity within ethno-national community, which can also be thwarted by the homogeneity of a central national culture.
The nation-oriented duties also interfere with the value of unconstrained creativity, e.g., telling writers or musicians or philosophers that they have a special duty to promote national heritage interferes with the freedom of creation. (The question here is not whether these individuals have the right to promote their national heritage, but whether they have a duty to do so.)
In between these two sets of endangered values, the autonomy-centered and creativity-centered ones, are the values that seem to arise from ordinary needs of people living under ordinary circumstances. In many modern states citizens of different ethnic background live together, and very often value this kind of life. This very fact of cohabitation seems to be a good that should be upheld. Nationalism does not tend to foster this kind of multiculturalism and pluralism, judging from both theory (especially the classical nationalist one) and experience. But the problems get worse. In practice, a rather widespread variant of nationalism is the invidious particularist form claiming rights for one's own people and denying them to others, for reasons that seem to be far from accidental. The source of the problem is the competition for scarce resources; as Gellner (1983) has famously pointed out, there is too little territory for all candidate ethnic groups to have a state and the same goes for other goods demanded by nationalists for the exclusive use of their co-nationals. According to some authors (McCabe 1997) the invidious variant is more coherent than any other form of nationalist; if one values highly one's own ethnic group the simplest way is to value it tout court. If one definitely prefers one's own culture in all respects to any foreign one, it is a waste of time and attention to bother about others. The universalist, non-invidious variant introduces enormous psychological and political complications. They arise from a tension between spontaneous attachment to one's own community and the demand to regard all communities with an equal eye. This tension might make the humane, non-invidious position psychologically unstable, and hard to uphold in situations of conflict and crisis. This psychological weakness renders it politically less efficient.
The philosophical authors sympathetic to nationalism are aware of the evils that historical nationalism has produced, and usually distance themselves from them. They usually speak of "various accretions that have given nationalism a bad name," and they are eager to "separate the idea of nationality itself from these excesses" (Miller 1992, 87). Such thoughtful pro-nationalist writers have put forward several lines of thought in defense of such a nationalism, thereby initiating an ongoing philosophical dialogue between the proponents and the opponents of the claim (see the anthologies McKim & McMahan 1997, Couture, Nielsen, & Seymour 1998, and Miscevic 2000). In order to help the reader find his or her way through the rather involved debate, we shall briefly summarize the considerations which are open to the ethno-nationalist to defend his or her case. (Compare the useful overview in Lichtenberg 1997.) The considerations and lines of thought built upon them can be used to defend very different varieties of nationalism, from radical to very moderate ones.
It is important to offer a warning concerning the key assumptions and premises which figure within each of the lines of thought summarized below, namely, that the assumptions often live an independent life in the philosophical literature. Some of them figure in the proposed defenses of various traditional views which have little to do with the concept of nation in particular.
For brevity, I shall reduce each line of thought to a brief argument (these arguments will be listed and discussed in Sections 3.2 and 3.3). The actual debate is, however, more involved than one can represent in a sketch. I shall sometimes indicate, in brackets, some prominent lines of criticism that have been put forward in the debate. (These are discussed in greater detail in Miscevic 2001.) The main arguments in favor of nationalism, which purport to establish its fundamental claims about state and culture, will be divided into two sets. The first set of arguments (listed in Section 3.2) defend the claim that national communities have a high value, often seen as non-instrumental and independent of the wishes and choices of their individual members, and argue that therefore they should be protected by means of state and official statist policies. The second set (listed in Section 3.3) is less deeply ‘philosophical’ (or ‘comprehensive’), and encompasses arguments from requirements of justice which are rather independent of substantial assumptions about culture and cultural values.
The first set will be presented here in more detail, since it has formed the center of the debate. The arguments in this set depict the community as the source of value or as the unique transmission device that connects the members to some important values. In this sense, the arguments from this set are communitarian in the ‘deep’ sense of being grounded in basic features of the human condition. Here is a characterization.
The deep communitarian perspective is a theoretical perspective on political issues which justifies a given political arrangement (e.g., a nation-state) by appeal to philosophical assumptions about human nature, language, community ties and identity (in the philosophical sense).
The general form of the arguments in the first set is the following. First, the deep communitarian premise: there is some uncontroversial good (e.g., a person's ethnic identity), and some kind of community is essential for acquisition and preservation of it. Then comes the claim that ethno-cultural nation is the kind of community ideally suited for this task. Unfortunately, this crucial claim is rarely defended in detail in the literature. But here is a sample from Avishai Margalit:
The idea is that people make use of different styles to express their humanity. The styles are generally determined by the communities to which they belong. There are people who express themselves ‘Frenchly’, while others have forms of life that are expressed ‘Koreanly’ or ... ‘Icelandicly’. (Margalit 1997, 80)
The argument ends with the statist conclusion: in order that such a community should preserve its own identity and support the identity of its members, it has to assume (always or at least normally) the political form of a state. The conclusion of this type of argument is that the ethno-national community has the right, in respect to any third party and to its own members, to have an ethno-national state, and the citizens of the state have the right and obligation to favor their own ethnic culture in relation to any other.
Although the philosophical assumptions in the arguments stem from the communitarian tradition, weakened forms have also been proposed by more liberally-minded philosophers. The original communitarian lines of thought in favor of nationalism suggest that there is some value in preserving ethno-national cultural traditions, in feelings of belonging to a common nation and in solidarity between its members. A liberal nationalist might accept that these may not be the central values of political life, but claim that they are values nevertheless. Moreover, the diametrically opposite views, pure individualism and cosmopolitanism, do seem arid and abstract, and may appear unmotivated. Compare, for example, the notion of cosmopolitanism:
Cosmopolitanism is the moral and political doctrine which asserts that (a) one's primary moral obligations are directed to all human beings (regardless of geographical or cultural distance), and (b) political arrangements should faithfully reflect this universal moral obligation (in the form of supra-statist arrangements that take precedence over nation-states).
Confronted with these opposite pulls, many philosophers opt for a mixture of liberalism-cosmopolitanism and patriotism-nationalism. B. Barber in his writings glorifies "a remarkable mixture of cosmopolitanism and parochialism" which, in his view characterizes American national identity (in Cohen 1996, 31). Charles Taylor claims that "we have no choice but to be cosmopolitan and patriots" (ibid., 121). Hilary Putnam proposes loyalty to what is best in the multiple traditions that each of us participates in; apparently a middle way between a narrow-minded patriotism and a too abstract cosmopolitanism (ibid., 114). The compromise has been foreshadowed by Berlin (1979) and Taylor (1989, 1993), and its various versions worked out in considerable detail by authors such as Tamir (1993), Miller (1995), Nielsen (1998) and Seymour. In recent years it occupies the center stage of the debate. Most liberal nationalist authors accept various weakened versions of the arguments we list below, taking them to support moderate or ultra-moderate nationalist claims.
Here are the main weakenings of classical ethno-nationalism that the liberal, limited-liberal and cosmopolitan nationalists propose. First, ethno-national claims have only prima facie strength, and cannot trump individual rights. Second, legitimate ethno-national claims do not, in themselves and automatically, amount to a right to having a state, but rather a right to have a certain level of cultural autonomy. Third, ethno-nationalism is subordinate to civic patriotism, and this has little or nothing to do with ethnic criteria. Fourth, ethno-national mythologies and similar ‘important falsehoods’ are to be tolerated only if benign and inoffensive, in which case they are morally permissible in spite of their falsity. Finally, any legitimacy that ethno-national claims may have is to be derived from the choices the concerned individuals should be free to make.
Consider now the particular arguments from the first set. The first argument depends on assumptions that also appear in the subsequent ones, but whereas it ascribes to the community an intrinsic value, the following ones point more towards an instrumental value of a nation which is derived from the value of individual flourishing, moral understanding, firm identity and the like.
(1) The Argument From Intrinsic Value. Each ethno-national community is valuable in and of itself, since it is only within the natural encompassing framework of various cultural traditions that important meanings and values are produced and transmitted. The members of such communities share a special cultural proximity to each other. By speaking the same language and sharing customs and traditions, the members of these communities are typically closer to one another in various ways than they are to those who don't share the culture. The community thereby becomes a network of morally connected agents, i.e., a moral community, with special, very strong ties of obligation. A prominent obligation of each individual concerns the underlying traits of the ethnic community, above all language and customs: they ought to be cherished, protected, preserved and reinforced. (The general assumption that moral obligations increase with cultural proximity is often criticized as problematic. Moreover, even if we grant this general assumption in theory, it breaks down in practice. Nationalist activism is most often turned against close (and, in many respects, similar) neighbors rather than against distant strangers, so that in many important contexts the appeal to proximity will not work. It might retain its potential force against culturally distant groups, however.)
(2) The Argument From Flourishing. The ethno-national community is essential for each of its members to flourish. In particular, it is only within such a community that an individual can acquire concepts and values crucial for understanding the community's cultural life in general and one's own life in particular. There has been a lot of debate on the pro-nationalist side about whether divergence of values is essential for separateness of national groups. Canadian liberal nationalists, Seymour (1999), Taylor, and Kymlicka, pointed out that the ‘divergences of values between different regions of Canada’ that aspire to separate nationhood are ‘minimal’. Taylor (1993, 155) concluded that it is not separateness of value that matters. This result is still compatible with the argument from flourishing, if ‘concepts and values’ are not taken to be specifically national, as communitarian nationalists (MacIntyre 1994, Margalit 1997) have claimed.
(3) The Argument From Moral Understanding. A particularly important variety of value is moral value. Some values are universal, but they are too abstract and ‘thin’. The rich, ‘thick’ moral values are discernible only within particular traditions, to those who have wholeheartedly endorsed the norms and standards of the given tradition. As Charles Taylor puts it, ‘the language we have come to accept articulates the issues of the good for us’ (1989, 35). The nation offers a natural framework for moral traditions, and thereby for moral understanding; it is the primary school of morals. (I note in fairness that Taylor himself is ambivalent about the national format of morality. An often noticed problem for this line of thought is that particular nations do not each have a special morality of their own. Also, the detailed, ‘thick’ morality may vary more across other divisions, such as class or gender divisions, than across ethno-national groups.)
(4) The Argument from Identity. Communitarian philosophers emphasize nurture over nature as the principal force determining our identity as persons -- we come to be the persons we are because of the social settings and contexts in which we mature. The claim certainly has some plausibility. The very identity of each person depends upon his/her participation in communal life (see MacIntyre 1994, Nielsen, 1998, and Lagerspetz 2000). For example, Nielsen writes:
We are, to put it crudely, lost if we cannot identify ourselves with some part of an objective social reality: a nation, though not necessarily a state, with its distinctive traditions. What we find in people -- and as deeply embedded as the need to develop their talents -- is the need not only to be able to say what they can do but to say who they are. This is found, not created, and is found in the identification with others in a shared culture based on nationality or race or religion or some slice or amalgam thereof. ... Under modern conditions, this securing and nourishing of a national consciousness can only be achieved with a nation-state that corresponds to that national consciousness. (1993, 32)
Given that an individual's morality depends upon their having a mature and stable personal identity, the communal conditions which foster the development of such personal identity have to be preserved and encouraged. The philosophical nationalists claim that the national format is the right format for preserving and encouraging such identity-providing communities. Therefore, communal life should be organized around particular national cultures. The classical nationalist proposes that cultures should be given their states, while the liberal nationalist proposes that cultures should get at least some form of political protection.
(5) The Argument from Diversity. Each national culture contributes in a unique way to the diversity of human cultures. The most famous contemporary proponent of the idea, Isaiah Berlin (interpreting Herder, who first saw this idea as significant) writes:
The ‘physiognomies’ of cultures are unique: each presents a wonderful exfoliation of human potentialities in its own time and place and environment. We are forbidden to make judgments of comparative value, for that is measuring the incommensurable. (1976, 206)
The carrier of basic value is thus the totality of cultures, from which each national culture and style of life that contributes to the totality derives its own value. The plurality of styles can be preserved and enhanced by tying the styles to ethno-national ‘forms of life’. The argument from diversity is therefore pluralistic: it ascribes value to each particular culture from the viewpoint of the totality of cultures available. Assuming that the (ethno-) nation is the natural unit of culture, the preservation of cultural diversity amounts to institutionally protecting the purity of (ethno-) national culture. (A pragmatic inconsistency might be threatening this argument. The issue is who can legitimately propose nationhood: the nationalist is much too tied to his or her own culture to do it, while the cosmopolitan is too eager to preserve intercultural links that go beyond the idea of having a single nation-state. Moreover, is diversity a value such that it deserves to be protected whenever it exists?)
The lines of thought in the set of arguments just presented are all linked to the importance of community life in relation to the individual. They emerged from the perspective of ‘deep’ communitarian thought, and a recurrent theme is the importance of the fact that membership in the community is not chosen but rather involuntary. As noted previously, each argument involves a general communitarian premise (a community, to which one has no choice whether or not to belong, is crucial for one's identity, or for flourishing or for some other important good). This premise is coupled with the more narrow nation-centered descriptive claim that the ethno-nation is precisely the kind of community ideally suited for the task. However, liberal nationalists do not find these arguments completely persuasive. In their view, the premises of the arguments may not support the full package of nationalistic ambitions, and may not be unconditionally valid. Still, there is a lot to these arguments, and they might support liberal nationalism and a more modest stance in favor of national cultures.
The liberal nationalist stance is mild and civil, and there is lot to be said in its favor. It strives to reconcile our intuitions in favor of some sort of political protection of cultural communities, with a liberal political morality. Of course, this raises issues of compatibility between liberal universal principles and the particular attachments to one's ethno-cultural nation. Very liberal nationalists such as Tamir divorce ethno-cultural nationhood from statehood. Also, the kind of love for country they suggest is tempered by all kinds of universalist considerations, which in the last instance trump national interest (Tamir 1993, 115). There is an ongoing debate among philosophical nationalists about how much weakening and compromising is still compatible with a stance's being nationalist at all. (For example, Canovan 1996 (ch. 10) presents Tamir as abandoning the ideal of ‘nation-state’, and thereby nationhood as such; Seymour (1999) criticizes Taylor and Kymlicka for turning their backs on genuine nationalistic programs, and proposing multiculturalism instead of nationalism.) There is also a streak of cosmopolitan interest present in the work of some liberal nationalists (Nielsen (1998/9).
The arguments in the second set concern political justice and do not rely on metaphysical claims about identity, flourishing and cultural values. They appeal to (actual or alleged) circumstances which would make nationalistic policies reasonable (or permissible or even mandatory), such as (a) the fact that a large part of the world is organized into nation states (so that each new group aspiring to create a nation-state just follows an established pattern), or (b) the circumstances of group self-defense or of redress of past injustice which might justify nationalist policies (to take a special case). Some of them also present nationhood as conducive to important political goods, such as equality.
(1) The Argument From the Right to Collective Self-determination. A group of people of a sufficient size has a prima face right to govern itself and decide its future membership, if the members of the group so wish. It is fundamentally the democratic will of the members themselves that grounds the right to an ethno-national state and to ethno-centric cultural institutions and practices. This argument presents the justification of (ethno-) national claims as deriving from the will of the members of the nation. It is therefore highly suitable for liberal nationalism and not very interesting for a deep communitarian, who sees the demands of the nation as being independent from, and prior to, the choices of particular individuals. (For extended discussion of this argument, see Moore 1998.)
(2) The Argument From the Right to Self-defense and to Redress Past Injustices. Oppression and injustice give a victimized group a just cause and the right to secede. If a minority group is oppressed by the majority, so that almost every minority member is worse off than most majority ones, simply in virtue of belonging to the minority, then the nationalist minority claims are morally plausible, and may even be compelling. The argument implies a very restrictive answer to our questions (2b) and (2c): the use of force in order to achieve sovereignty is legitimate only in the cases of self-defense and redress. It establishes a typical remedial right, which is acceptable from a liberal standpoint. (See a recent discussion in Kukathas and Poole 2000.)
(3) The Argument From Equality. Members of a minority group are often disadvantaged in relation to a dominant culture because they have to rely on those with the same language and culture to conduct the affairs of daily life. Since freedom to conduct one's daily life is a primary good, and it is difficult to change or give up reliance on one's minority culture to attain that good, this reliance can lead to certain inequalities if special measures are not taken. Spontaneous nation-building by the majority has to be moderated. Therefore, liberal neutrality itself requires that the majority provide certain basic cultural goods, i.e., granting differential rights. (See Kymlicka 1995b.) Institutional protections and the right to the minority group's own institutional structure are remedies that restore equality and turn the resulting nation-state into a more moderate multicultural one. (See Kymlicka 2001.)
(4) The Argument From Success. The nation-state has been successful in the past, promoting equality and democracy. The ethno-national solidarity is a powerful motive for a more egalitarian distribution of goods (Miller 1995, Canovan, 1996). The nation-state also seems to be essential to safeguard the moral life of communities in the future, since it is the only form of political institution capable of protecting communities from the threats of globalization and assimilationism. (For a detailed critical discussion of this argument see Mason 1999.)
These political arguments can be combined with deep communitarian ones. However, taken in isolation, they offer the more interesting perspective of a ‘liberal culturalism’ that is more suitable for ethnically and culturally plural societies. It is more remote from classical nationalism than the liberal nationalism of Tamir and Nielsen, since it eschews any communitarian philosophical underpinning (see the detailed presentation and defense in Kymlicka 2001, who still occasionally calls such culturalism ‘nationalistic’). The idea of moderate nation-building points to an open multi-culturalism, in which every group receives its share of remedial rights, but instead of walling itself up against others, participates in a common, overlapping civic culture in open communication with other sub-communities. Given the variety of pluralistic societies, and intense trans-national interactions, such openness seems to many to be the only guarantee of stable social and political life (see the debate in Shapiro and Kymlicka 1997). The dialectics of moderating nationalist claims in the context of pluralistic societies might thus lead to a stance which is respectful of cultural differences, but liberal and potentially cosmopolitan in its ultimate goals.
The philosophy of nationalism nowadays does not concern itself very much with the aggressive and dangerous form of invidious nationalism that often occupies center stage in the news and in sociological research. Although this pernicious form can be of significant instrumental value mobilizing oppressed people and giving them a sense of dignity, its moral costs are usually taken by philosophers to outweigh its benefits. Nationalistic-minded philosophers distance themselves from such aggressive nationalism, and mainly seek to construct and defend very moderate versions and these have therefore come to be the main focus of recent philosophical debate.
In presenting the claims that nationalists defend, we have started from more radical ones and have moved towards liberal nationalistic alternatives. In examining the argument for these claims, we have first presented metaphysically demanding communitarian arguments, resting upon deep communitarian assumptions about culture, such as the premise that the ethno-cultural nation is universally the central and most important community for each human individual. This is an interesting and respectable claim, but its plausibility has not yet been established. The moral debate about nationalism has resulted in various weakenings of the cultural arguments, proposed by liberal nationalist, which render the arguments less ambitious but much more plausible. Having abandoned the old nationalistic ideal of a state owned by its ethno-cultural dominant group, liberal nationalists have become receptive to the idea that identification with a multitude of cultures and communities is important for a person's social identity. They have equally become sensitive to trans-national issues, and more willing to embrace a partly cosmopolitan perspective.
Liberal nationalism has also brought to the fore more modest, and less philosophically charged, arguments which are grounded in the concerns of justice and which stress the practical importance of ethno-cultural membership, various rights to redress injustice, democratic rights of political association, and the role that ethno-cultural ties and associations can play in promoting just social arrangements. Liberal culturalists such as Kymlicka have proposed minimal and pluralistic versions of nationalism built around such arguments. In these minimal versions, the project of building classical nation-states is moderated or abandoned, and replaced by a more sensitive form of national identity which can thrive in a multicultural society. This new project, however, might demand a further widening of moral perspectives. Given the experiences of the twentieth century, one can safely assume that culturally-plural states divided into isolated and closed sub-communities glued together only by arrangements of mere modus vivendi are inherently unstable. Stability might therefore require that the plural society envisioned by liberal culturalists promote quite intense interaction between cultural groups in order to forestall mistrust, reduce prejudice and create a solid basis for cohabitation. On the other hand, once membership in multiple cultures and communities is admitted as legitimate, social groups will spread beyond the borders of a single state (like many religious or racial ties) as well as within them, thus creating an opening for at least a minimal cosmopolitan perspective. The internal dialectic of the concern for ethno-cultural identity might thus lead to pluralistic and potentially cosmopolitan political arrangements that are rather distant from what was classically understood as nationalism.
This is a short list of books on nationalism that are readable and useful as introductions to the literature. First, the two opposing social science contemporary classics:
The two best recent anthologies of high-quality philosophical papers on the morality of nationalism, are:
The debate continues in:
A good sociological introduction to the gender-inspired criticism of nationalism is:
The best general introduction to the communitarian-individualist debate is still:
For a non-nationalist defense of culturalist claims see
Two very readable philosophical defenses of very moderate nationalism are:
An influential critical analysis of group solidarity in general and nationalism in particular, written in the tradition of rational choice theory is:
There is a wide offer of interesting sociological and political science work on nationalism, which is beginning to be summarized in
A detailed sociological study of life under nationalist rule is:
The most readable short anthology of brief papers for and against cosmopolitanism (and nationalism) by leading authors in the field is: