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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Questions about moral character have recently come to occupy a central place in philosophical discussion. Part of the explanation for this development can be traced to the publication in 1958 of G. E. M. Anscombe's seminal article "Modern Moral Philosophy." In that paper Anscombe argued that Kantianism and utilitarianism, the two major traditions in western moral philosophy, mistakenly placed the foundation for morality in legalistic notions such as duty and obligation. To do ethics properly, Anscombe argued, one must start with what it is for a human being to flourish or live well. That meant returning to some questions that mattered deeply to the ancient Greek moralists. These questions focussed on the nature of "virtue" (or what we might think of as admirable moral character), of how one becomes virtuous (is it taught? does it arise naturally? are we responsible for its development?), and of what relationships and institutions may be necessary to make becoming virtuous possible. Answers to these ancient questions emerge today in various areas of philosophy, including ethics (especially virtue ethics), feminist ethics, political philosophy, philosophy of education, and philosophy of literature. Interest in virtue and character was also indirectly the result of a more practical turn in political philosophy, inspired by the publication of John Rawls's A Theory of Justice in 1971. In Part III of A Theory of Justice, Rawls provided a picture of how individuals might be brought up in a just state to develop the virtues expected of good citizens. Although his interest was not in moral education per se, his discussion of the nature and development of what he called self-respect stimulated other philosophers to explore the psychological foundations of virtue and the contributions made by friendship, family, community, and meaningful work to good moral character.
This entry provides a brief historical account of some important developments in philosophical approaches to good moral character. Approximately half the entry is on the Greek moralists Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics. Of these, most attention is given to Aristotle's views, since most other philosophical discussions of character are indebted to his analysis. The latter half of the entry explores how other philosophers have responded to the concerns first raised by the Greeks. Some philosophers, such as Hugo Grotius and Immanuel Kant, represent a "modern" approach to character that subordinates it to other moral notions such as duty and obedience to law. Other philosophers, such as David Hume, Karl Marx, and John Stuart Mill, take an interest in the psychology of moral character that is more reminiscent of the Greeks. Finally, this entry indicates the directions taken by some contemporary philosophers in recent work on or related to moral character.
The English word "character" is derived from the Greek charaktêr, which was originally used of a mark impressed upon a coin. Later and more generally, "character" came to mean a distinctive mark by which one thing was distinguished from others, and then primarily to mean the assemblage of qualities that distinguish one individual from another. In modern usage, this emphasis on distinctiveness or individuality tends to merge "character" with "personality." We might say, for example, when thinking of a person's idiosyncratic mannerisms, social gestures, or habits of dress, that "he has personality" or that "he's quite a character."
As the Introduction above has suggested, however, the philosophical use of the word "character" has a different linguistic history. At the beginning of Book II of the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle tells us that there are two different kinds of human excellences, excellences of thought and excellences of character. His phrase for excellences of character -- êthikai aretai -- we usually translate as "moral virtue(s)" or "moral excellence(s)." The Greek êthikos (ethical) is the adjective cognate with êthos (character). When we speak of a moral virtue or an excellence of character, the emphasis is not on mere distinctiveness or individuality, but on the combination of qualities that make an individual the sort of ethically admirable person he is.
This entry will discuss "moral character" in the Greek sense of having or lacking moral virtue. If someone lacks virtue, she may have any of several moral vices, or she may be characterized by a condition somewhere in between virtue or vice, such as continence or incontinence.
The views of moral character held by Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics are the starting point for most other philosophical discussions of character. Although these ancient moralists differed on some issues about virtue, it makes sense to begin with some points of similarity. These points of similarity will show why the Greek moralists thought it was important to discuss character.
Many of Plato's dialogues (especially the early or so-called "Socratic" dialogues) examine the nature of virtue and the character of a virtuous person. They often begin by having Socrates ask his interlocutors to explain what a particular virtue is. In reply, the interlocutors usually offer behavioral accounts of the virtues. For example, at the beginning of Plato's Laches the character Laches suggests that courage consists of standing one's ground in battle. In the Charmides, Charmides suggests that temperance consists in acting quietly. In the Republic, Polemarchus suggests that justice consists in giving back what one has borrowed. In each of these cases, Plato has Socrates reply in the same way. In the Republic Socrates explains that giving back what one has borrowed cannot be what justice is, for there are cases where giving back what one has borrowed would be foolish, and the just person recognizes that it is foolish. If the person from whom one has borrowed a sword goes mad, it would be foolish for you to return the sword, for you are then putting yourself and others in danger. The implication is that the just person can recognize when it is reasonable to return what one has borrowed. Similarly, as Socrates explains in the Laches, standing firm in battle cannot be courage, for sometimes standing firm in battle is simply a foolish endurance that puts oneself and others at needless risk. The courageous person can recognize when it is reasonable to stand one's ground in battle and when it isn't.
The trouble one encounters in trying to give a purely behavioral account of virtue explains why the Greek moralists turn to character to explain what virtue is. It may be true that most of us can recognize that it would be foolish to risk our lives and the lives of others to secure a trivial benefit, and that most of us can see that it is unjust to harm others to secure power and wealth for our own comfort. We don't have to be virtuous to recognize these things. But the Greek moralists think it takes someone of good moral character to determine with regularity and reliability what actions are appropriate and reasonable in fearful situations and that it takes someone of good moral character to determine with regularity and reliability how and when to secure goods and resources for himself and others. This is why Aristotle states in the Nicomachean Ethics that it is not easy to define in rules which actions deserve moral praise and blame, and that these matters require the judgment of the virtuous person.
Most of the Greek moralists think that, if we are rational, we aim at living well (eu zên) or happiness (eudaimonia). Living well or happiness is our ultimate end in that a conception of happiness serves to organize our various subordinate ends, by indicating the relative importance of our ends and by indicating how they should fit together into some rational overall scheme. So the Stoics identify happiness with "living coherently" (homologoumenôs zên), and Aristotle says that happiness is "perfect" or "complete" (teleios) and something distinctively human. When we are living well, our life is worthy of imitation and admiration. For, according to the Greek moralists, that we are happy says something about us and about what we have achieved, not simply about the fortunate circumstances in which we find ourselves. So they argue that happiness cannot consist simply in "external goods" or "goods of fortune," for these goods are external to our own choosing and deciding. Whatever happiness is, it must take account of the fact that a happy life is one lived by rational agents who act and who are not simply victims of their circumstances.
The Greek moralists conclude that a happy life must give a prominent place to the exercise of virtue, for virtuous traits of character are stable and enduring and are not products of fortune, but of learning or cultivation. Moreover, virtuous traits of character are excellences of the human being in that they are the best exercise of reason, which is the activity characteristic of human beings. In this way, the Greek philosophers claim, virtuous activity completes or perfects human life.
Although the Greek philosophers agree that happiness requires virtue and hence that a happy person must have virtuous traits of character such as wisdom, bravery, temperance, and justice, they disagree about how to understand these traits. As explained in III (i) above, several of Plato's dialogues criticize the view that virtues are merely tendencies to act in particular ways. Bravery requires more than standing up against threats to oneself and others. Bravery also requires recognizing when standing up to these threats is reasonable and appropriate, and it requires acting on one's recognition. This led the Greek moralists to conclude that virtuous traits of character have two aspects: (a) a behavioral aspect -- doing particular kinds of action and (b) a psychological aspect -- having the right motives, aims, concerns, and perspective. The Greek philosophers disagree mostly about what (b) involves. In particular, they differ about the role played in virtuous traits of character by cognitive states (e.g., knowledge and belief) on the one hand and affective states (e.g., desires, feelings, and emotions) on the other. Socrates and the Stoics argued that only cognitive states were necessary for virtue, whereas Plato and Aristotle argued that both cognitive and affective states were necessary.
Aristotle accepts Plato's division of the soul into two basic parts (rational and non-rational) and agrees that both parts contribute to virtuous character. Of all the Greek moralists, Aristotle provides the most psychologically insightful account of virtuous character. Because most modern philosophical treatments of character (see IV below) are indebted to Aristotle's analysis, it is best to discuss his position in some detail.
Excellence [of character], then, is a state concerned with choice, lying in a mean relative to us, this being determined by reason and in the way in which the man of practical wisdom would determine it. Now it is a mean between two vices, that which depends on excess and that which depends on defect. (1106b36-1107a3)
By calling excellence of character a state, Aristotle means that it is neither a feeling nor a capacity nor a mere tendency to behave in specific ways. Rather it is the settled condition we are in when we are well off in relation to feelings and actions. We are well off in relation to our feelings and actions when we are in a mean or intermediate state in regard to them. If, on the other hand, we have a vicious character, we are badly off in relation to feelings and actions, and we fail to hit the mean in regard to them.
Aristotle seems to think that, at bottom, any non-virtuous person is plagued by inner doubt or conflict, even if on the surface she appears to be as psychologically unified as virtuous people. Although a vicious person may appear to be single-minded about her disdain for justice and her pursuit of material goods and power, she must seek out others' company to forget or ignore her own actions. Aristotle seems to have this point in mind when he says of vicious people in Nicomachean Ethics IX.4 that they are at odds with themselves and do not love themselves. Virtuous persons, on the other hand, enjoy who they are and take pleasure in acting virtuously.
Like the morally vicious person, the continent and inctontinent person are internally conflicted, but they are more aware of their inner turmoil than the morally vicious person. Continence is essentially a kind of self-mastery: the continent person recognizes what she should do and does it, but to do so she must struglle against the pull of recalcitrant feelings. The incontinent person also is some way knows what she should do, but she fails to do it because of recalcitrant feelings.
Aristotle's position on incontinence seems to incorporate both Socratic and Platonic elements. Recall that Socrates had explained apparently incontinent behavior as the result of ignorance of what leads to the good. Since, he thought, everyone desires the good and aims at it in his actions, no one would intentionally choose a course of action believed to yield less good overall. Plato, on the other hand, argued that incontinence can occur when a person's non-rational desires move him to act in ways not endorsed by his rational desire for the greater good. Aristotle seems to agree with Socrates that the cognitive state of the incontinent person is defective at the moment of incontinent behavior, but he also agrees with Plato that a person's non-rational desires cause the incontinent action. This may be what Aristotle means when he writes that "the position that Socrates sought to establish actually seems to result; for it is not what is thought to be knowledge proper that the passion overcomes . . . but perceptual knowledge." (NE 1147b14-17)
To explain what the virtuous person's pleasures are like, Aristotle returns to the idea that virtue is an excellent state of the person. Virtue is the state that makes a human being good and makes him perform his function well. His function (his ergon or characteristic activity), Aristotle says in Nicomachean Ethics I.7, is rational activity, so when we perform rational activity well, we are good (virtuous) human beings and live well (we are happy).
Scholars disagree about what kind of rational activity Aristotle means. Some scholars think Aristotle is referring to theoretical rational activity ("contemplation" or theôria), the kind we engage in when we consider metaphysical and scientific truths of the universe. Others think Aristotle is referring to practical rational activity, the kind we engage in when we think about and solve ethical problems and consider the truths of how to live. (For a discussion of theoretical and practical reason in Aristotle, see the related entry on Aristotle's ethics.) For the purposes of this discussion, we will assume that theoretical and practical rational activity are at least related types of rational activity, in that each involves exercising one's abilities to think and to know and to consider truths that one has figured out.
When someone has developed his abilities to think and to know to the point where they are indefinitely extendable with no natural stopping points, he has realized these abilities fully. When that happens, his exercise of these abilities is a continuing source of self-esteem and enjoyment. He comes to like his life and himself and is now a genuine self-lover. In Nicomachean Ethics IX.8, Aristotle takes pains to distinguish true self-love, which characterizes the virtuous person, from vulgar self-love, which characterizes morally defective types. Morally defective types love themselves in the sense that they love material goods and advantages. They desire to secure these things even at the expense of other people, and so they act in ways that are morally vicious. Genuine self-lovers, on the other hand, love most their characteristic human activity, which is rational activity. When they enjoy and recognize the value of developing their rational powers, they can use this recognition to guide their decisions and to determine which actions are appropriate in which circumstances. This is the reasoning of those who have practical wisdom (phronêsis). Moreover, because they now take pleasure in the right things (they enjoy most figuring things out rather than the accumulation of wealth or power), they will avoid many of the actions, and will be unattracted to many of the pleasures, associated with the common vices. In other words, they will act as a virtuous person would.
Aristotle thinks that, in addition to friendships, wider social relations are required for the full development of our rational powers. He says we are by nature political beings, whose capacities are fully realized in a specific kind of political community (a polis or city-state). Aristotle's ideal political community is led by citizens who recognize the value of living fully active lives and whose aim is to make the best life possible for their fellow citizens. When political leaders deliberate and legislate about the community's health, education, defense, finance, and other matters, their goal is to determine and promote the conditions under which citizens can be fully active. If they are practically wise, they consider how institutions should be set up so as to promote the development of citizens' powers to think and to know. Aristotle's criticisms of deviant political states take a related line: states that encourage the consumption and accumulation of external goods for their own sake, or states that promote warfare and military supremacy as an end in itself, mistake the nature of the best human life. Citizens of such states will grow up to love most something other than the realization of human rational powers, and as a result they will be prone to traditional vices of injustice, lack of generosity, and intemperance, among others.
The Stoic school of philosophy existed for about five centuries, from its founding around 300 BCE to the second century CE. Like Socrates, Plato, and Aristotle, the Stoic philosophers differed on some issues about the virtues, but they seemed also to have shared a common core of views. This section of the entry on character will briefly discuss their common views.
The Stoic philosophers have a view of character that is close to Socrates', but they reach it through agreement with Aristotle. The Stoics assume that the good life for human beings is a life in accord with nature. They agree with Aristotle that the human being's essence is a life in accord with reason. So to find what accords with nature, they look to the development of the human being's rational powers. They think that as a person begins to use reason instrumentally to satisfy and organize his desires and appetites, he comes to value the exercise of reason for its own sake. He realizes that conduct that exhibits a rational order is far more valuable than any of the natural advantages (such as health, friendship, or community) pursued by his individual actions. Human good, after all, as Aristotle argued, should be stable, under our control, and hard to take from us. The Stoics conclude that human good consists in excellent rational activity, for a person can guide his actions by rational choice, no matter what misfortunes he may encounter. The virtuous person becomes the sage (sophos) who has and acts on knowledge of the good. His actions are informed by his insights about the advantages of perfecting one's rationality by acting in agreement with the rational order of nature. Like Socrates, the Stoic view of virtue focuses on the virtuous person's cognitive state: it is his knowledge of the rational order of the universe and his desire to accord with that rational order that leads him to act as he does.
To be virtuous, there is no need to develop any capacities other than cognitive capacities, for the Stoics claim against Plato and Aristotle that there is really no non-rational part of the soul. Although the Stoics admit that there are passions such as anger, fear, and so on, they treat them as mistaken judgments about what is good and evil. Since the sage or virtuous person is wise and has no mistaken judgments about the good, he has no passions. So if the sage loses any natural advantages in misfortune, he has no emotion about them. Rather, he views them as "indifferents" (adiaphora). One might wonder, then, how the sage can truly be said to be virtuous. For if he views the health and welfare of himself and others as indifferents, why would he act to secure or protect his or others' welfare, as presumably a virtuous person would? The Stoics reply that natural advantages are still pursued, but only to achieve agreement with nature and to realize fully one's rational powers. They are "preferred indifferents."
Unlike Plato and Aristotle, the Stoics did not think virtue was developed and sustained by any particular kind of community. Granted, social relationships and community are among the preferred indifferents in that they are to be preferred to the opposite conditions of hostility, war, and enmity. But they are not necessary for anyone's happiness. If we lose them, it is not a loss of a genuine good. So the Stoic Epictetus (c. 55-c.135), a freed slave, argued that the death of one's family members is no real loss and is no worse than the breaking of a cup. The community that did matter to the Stoics was cosmic. When persons achieve perfect rationality, they accord with the rational order of a universe ruled by divine reason. This shows that all of us, virtuous or not, are ruled by one law and so belong to one universal community. As rational beings, we recognize this for we recognize that we share reason with other human beings. The Stoic Marcus Aurelius (121-180), a Roman emperor, makes the connections in this way: "If this be so [i.e., that reason is shared], then also the reason which enjoins what is to be done or left undone is common. If this be so, law also is common; if this be so, we are citizens; if this be so, we are partakers in one constitution; if this be so, the Universe is a kind of Commonwealth." (Marcus Aurelius 1944, iv.4) The Stoics concluded that, as rational beings, we have no reason not to extend our concern beyond our family, friends, and immediate community to our fellow-citizens of the world community.
The Stoics came to represent a way of life according to which someone might strive for the well-being of others, whether friend or stranger, without caring about material rewards or worldly success. Because their view of virtue was independent of any particular social or political structure, their message held an appeal for all sorts of people, Greek or non-Greek, slave or free, rich or poor.
For more detailed discussion of Greek views of character, see (Dent 1975), (Irwin 1989), and (Sherman 1989).
Since the publication of Anscombe's "Modern Moral Philosophy" in 1958 (see Introduction above), it has become routine to say that virtue and moral character have been neglected topics in the development of western moral philosophy since the Greeks. Rather than thinking about what it is to flourish and live well, moral philosophers, it is argued, became focused on a different set of notions: obligation, duty, and law.
Anscombe and others have suggested how such a move might have taken place. The Stoic ideas outlined above may have influenced early Christians such as St. Paul to develop the idea of a natural law that applies to all human beings. Once Christianity became more widespread, natural law could be understood in terms of God's directives in the Bible. Still later, after the European political revolutions of the 17th and 18th centuries, there was intellectual room for secularized versions of the same idea to take hold: duty or obligation was understood in terms of obedience to moral law(s) or principles that do not come from God but are devised by human beings. Morally right action was action in accord with moral law(s) or principles. On such a view, where the central focus is on obedience to moral law, the virtues and moral character are secondary to action in accordance with law. Someone who acts rightly may develop standing habits or dispositions of doing so, and these habits then constitute the virtues or good character.
This section of the entry on moral character will provide a brief summary of some important developments both in this "modern" approach to moral character and in what appear to be revivals of the pre-Christian Greek interest in the psychological foundations of character.
Even though the natural law theorists tended to assimilate virtue to continence, they still admitted that that there was an area of moral life in which motive and character mattered. That was the area of "imperfect duty" (as contrasted with "perfect duty"). Under a perfect duty what is owed is specific and legally enforceable by political society or courts; but action in accord with imperfect duty cannot be compelled, and what is owed under an imperfect duty is imprecise. Generosity is an example of the latter, justice of the former. In the case of generosity, one has a duty to be generous, but one cannot be legally compelled to be generous, and when or how generosity is shown is not precisely specifiable. But in the case of generosity, the motive of the agent counts. For if I give money to a poor person I encounter on the street and do so because I want others to think well of me, I have not acted generously and performed my imperfect duty. When I give generously, I must do so out of concern for the good of the person to whom I give the money.
For more detailed discussion of Grotius and the natural law theorists, and of the modern developments Anscombe attacked, see (Schneewind 1990, 1998).
That virtue is a form of continence for Kant is also suggested by his treatment of other traits such as gratitude and sympathy. Although Kant thinks that feelings cannot be required of anyone, some feelings are nevertheless associated with the moral ends we adopt. If we adopt others' happiness as an end, we will not take malicious pleasure in their downfall. On the contrary, we will naturally feel gratitude for their benevolence and sympathy for their happiness. These feelings will make it easier for us to perform our duties and are a sign that we are disposed to do so. Kant remarks of sympathy that "it is one of the impulses that nature has implanted in us to do what the representation of duty alone would not accomplish." (Kant 1991, 251)
Thus it matters to Kant that we perform the duties of virtue with the properly cultivated emotions. But to do so is not to develop our nature so that the two parts of us, reason and passion, are unified and speak with the same voice. Rather, if we perform our duties of virtue in the right spirit, one part of us, reason, retains control over the other part, passion. Kant writes that virtue "contains a positive command to a man, namely to bring all his capacities and inclinations under his (reason's) control and so to rule over himself . . . for unless reason holds the reins of government in its own hands, man's feelings and inclinations play the master over him." (Kant 1991, 208)
For more detailed discussion of Kant's views on virtue, see (O'Neill 1996).
Yet there are other philosophers for whom an interest in virtue or good character takes a turn more reminiscent of the Greeks. This revival of Greek ideas can be seen in philosophers who show an interest in the psychological foundations of good character.
Hume divides the virtues into two types: artificial and natural. Artificial virtues include justice, promise-keeping, and allegiance to legitimate government. Natural virtues include courage, magnanimity, ambition, friendship, generosity, fidelity, and gratitude, among many others. Whereas each exercise of the natural virtues normally produces good results, the good of artificial virtues is indirect in that it comes about only as a result of there being an accepted practice of exercising these virtues.
Hume's discussion of justice illustrates how the artificial virtues emerge from our feelings and desires. Hume notes that following the rules of justice does not always produce good results. Consider the judges who "bestow on the dissolute the labour of the industrious; and put into the hands of the vicious the means of harming both themselves and others." (Hume 1988, 579) Hume thinks that as persons become aware that stability of possessions is advantageous to each individually, they also realize that stability is not possible unless everyone refrains from disturbing others' possessions. As this awareness becomes more widespread and effective in people's behaviors, there arises a convention to respect the possessions of others. This redirection of self-interest, aided by our natural tendency to sympathize with the feelings of others who benefit from stability of possession, gives rise to our approval of justice. In this way, Hume argues, the virtue of obeying laws arises naturally from our feelings and desires.
Hume's indebtedness to Greek ethics can be seen even more clearly in his discussion of the natural virtues. Of these, one important group (consisting of courage, magnanimity, ambition, and others) is based on, or may even be a form of, self-esteem: "[W]hatever we call heroic virtue, and admire under the character of greatness and elevation of mind, is either nothing but a steady and well-established pride and self-esteem, or partakes largely of that passion. Courage . . . and all the other shining virtues of that kind, have plainly a strong mixture of self-esteem in them, and derive a great part of their merit from that origin." (Hume 1978, 599-600) Yet these virtues based on self-esteem must be tempered by a second group that includes generosity, compassion, fidelity, and friendship; otherwise traits like courage are "fit only to make a tyrant and public robber." (Hume 1978, 603) This second group of virtues is based on broadly-based feelings of good will, affection, and concern for others.
Hume acknowledges that his second group of virtues owes a debt to the Stoic view that a virtuous person ought to be concerned with the welfare of all human beings, whether they be intimate or stranger; and in describing the first group of virtues, Hume looks to Socrates as someone who has achieved a kind of inner calm and self-esteem. In addition, his general approach to the virtues, that some are based on self-esteem and others on friendly feelings and good will, is reminiscent of Aristotle's exploration of the psychological foundations of virtue.
Hume believes that we develop self-esteem from what we do well, if what we do well expresses something distinctive and durable about us, and he seems to recognize that realized deliberative abilities are among the most durable features of ourselves. As we gain a facility at deliberation, we come to develop self-esteem and enjoy who we are, like Aristotle's virtuous person who enjoys most the exercise of his deliberative powers. Moreover, Hume's recognition that self-esteem must be tempered by benevolence is reflected in Aristotle's argument that the development and preservation of proper self-love requires friendships in which persons come to care for others for others' own sakes.
In addition to exploring these psychological foundations of virtue, Hume seems to accord them a role that is reminiscent of the Aristotelian view that virtue is a state in which reason and passion speak with the same voice. Instead of making virtue and good character subordinate to the requirements of reason, as we saw in the natural law theorists and in Kant, Hume appears to give virtue and good character room to guide and constrain the deliberations of agents so as to affect what they determine to be best to do. By doing so, Hume goes some way toward indicating how good character is different from continence.
Hume's account of how we determine what is right and wrong illuminates the role character plays. When Hume's "judicious spectator" determines what is right and wrong, she fixes on some "steady and general" point of view and "loosens" herself from her actual feelings and interests. It appears that someone who has developed an enjoyment in the activities of deliberating and reflecting, and whose self-esteem is based on that enjoyment, will be more likely to take up the point of view of the judicious spectator and to perform the subtle corrections in response that may be necessary to loosen oneself from one's own perspective and specific passions. Someone whose self-esteem is based on an enjoyment taken in deliberation will be attuned to wider complications and will have the wider imaginative powers needed for correct deliberation from a steady and general point of view. Hume's view of the relation between passion and deliberation is reminiscent of the Aristotelian view that someone with proper self-love will also be practically wise, in that his self-love will enable him to size up practical situations correctly and determine correctly what it is best to do.
For more detailed discussion of Hume's view of the virtues, see (Baier 1991).
Marx's early Economic and Philosophic Manuscripts of 1844 is famous for the discussion of how the organization of work under capitalism alienates workers and encourages them to accept the values of capitalist society. Workers who are committed to capitalist values are characterized primarily by self-interested attitudes. They are most interested in material advancement for themselves, they are distrustful of others' seemingly good intentions, and they view others primarily as competitors for scarce positions. Given these attitudes, they are prone to a number of vices, including lack of generosity, cowardice, and intemperance.
Marx's discussion of alienated labor suggests how work can be re-organized to eliminate alienation, undermine commitment to traditional capitalist values and goals, and produce attitudes more characteristic of Aristotle's virtuous person. The key to this transformation lies in re-organizing the nature of work so that workers can express what Marx calls their "species-being" or those features of the self that are characteristically human. Very much like Aristotle, Marx seems to mean by this an individual's ability to reason, and in particular his powers of choosing, deciding, discriminating, judging, and so on. If work is re-organized to enable workers to express their rational powers, then each worker will perform tasks that are interesting and mentally challenging (no worker will perform strictly monotonous, routine, unskilled tasks). In addition, each worker will participate in deliberations about the ends to be achieved by the work they do and how to achieve those ends. And, finally, these deliberations will organized democratically so that the opinions of each worker are fairly taken into account. When these conditions are put into place, labor is no longer "divided" between skilled and unskilled or between managerial and non-managerial. Marx suggests that if work is reorganized in these ways, it will promote feelings of solidarity and camaraderie among workers and eventually between these workers and those in similar situations elsewhere. For the fact that workers can express their characteristic human powers in action, coupled with the egalitarian conditions in the workplace, can upset competitive feelings and promote respect by removing the bases for inferiority and superiority. Workers then come to exhibit some of the more traditional virtues such as generosity and trustfulness, and avoid some of the more traditional vices such as cowardice, stinginess, and self-indulgence.
That Marx's views seem derivative of Aristotle's in important ways is not surprising, for, unlike Hume whose knowledge of Aristotle is not fully known, Marx explicitly drew upon Aristotle's works. For further discussion of the extent to which Marx drew on Aristotle, see (DeGolyer 1985).
John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) defended a version of liberal utilitarianism, but scholars disagree about what kind of utilitarianism that was. We can safely say that, as a utilitarian, Mill thought human conduct should promote the happpiness or welfare of those affected. But was Mill an act-utilitarian, who thought that right acts are those that promote happiness as much as can be done on the particular occasion, given the alternatives available to the agent? Or was he a rule-utilitarian, who thought that right conduct was conduct permitted by rules that, when generally accepted or followed, would maximize happiness or welfare? Or was he a motive-utilitarian, who thought that one should act as the person with the motives or virtues most productive of happiness should act? (For a discussion of these interpretive questions, see the related entry on John Stuart Mill) Although this entry will steer clear of these interpretive hurdles and will concentrate on Mill's discussion of the nature of happiness and of some of the institutional structures that can promote happiness, these questions of interpretation will be relevant to a final assessment of Mill in Section 4, below.
In his essay On Liberty Mill claims that this version of utilitarianism rests on a conception of happiness that is appropriate to people as "progressive" beings. (Mill 1975, 12) And in Utilitarianism he suggests that this conception is focused on the "higher pleasures" that serve to distinguish humans from animals. (Mill 1979, 7-11) These higher pleasures turn out to be the activities and pursuits that exercise what in Aristotle's view are our powers of practical deliberation -- of choosing, judging, deciding, and discriminating. In On Liberty, Mill writes: "He who lets the world . . . choose his plan of life for him has no need of any other faculty than the ape-like one of imitation. He who chooses his plan for himself employs all his faculties. He must use observation to see, reasoning and judgment to foresee, activity to gather materials for decision, discrimination to decide, and when he has decided, firmness and self-control to hold his deliberate decision." (Mill 1975, 56) As a person develops his powers of practical deliberation and comes to enjoy their exercise, he gains the self-esteem that is the basis of a virtuous and well-lived life. (For further discussion of Mill's view of happiness, see (Brink 1992).)
Mill argued that seriously unequal societies, by preventing individuals from developing their deliberative powers, mold individuals' character in unhealthy ways and impede their ability to live virtuous lives. In particular, Mill argued that societies that have systematically subordinated women have harmed both men and women, making it almost impossible for men and women to form relationships of genuine intimacy and understanding. In The Subjection of Women, he went so far as to claim that the family, as constituted at his time, was a "school of despotism" in that it was the nursery of the vices of character. "A man who is morose or violent to his equals," Mill claimed, is sure to be one who has lived among inferiors, whom he could frighten or worry into submission." (Mill 1988, 38) For moral lives and psychologically healthy relationships to be possible, Mill called for altered marital arrangements, supported by changes in law, that would promote the development and exercise of women's deliberative powers along with men's. Only under such conditions could women and men acquire feelings of real self-esteem rather than feelings of false inferiority and superiority.
Both Mill and Marx show how character can be molded by antecedent circumstances - Marx by economic structures, Mill by family relationships. And both see that for individuals to become decent, they need a healthy self-esteem rooted in the development of their own powers. Yet these insights about the effect of institutions on character seem to raise other, more troubling questions: if our character is the result of social and political institutions beyond our control, then perhaps we are not in control of our characters at all and becoming decent is not a real possibility.
There is also reason to think such skepticism may be misplaced. On Aristotle's view, good character is based on two naturally occurring psychological responses which most people experience without difficulty: our tendency to take pleasure from self-realizing activity and our tendency to form friendly feelings toward others under specific circumstances. There may be some people who cannot experience the pleasures of self-expression or who cannot respond to others' efforts to help with friendly feelings. But it is not obvious that persons brought up to embrace racist or sexist beliefs, for example, lack these psychological resources. On Aristotle's view, virtually everyone is capable of becoming better, and so practically everyone is, on Aristotle's view, responsible for actions that express (or could express) their character.
Still, this is not to say that changing one's character is easy, straightforward, or quickly achieved. If character is formed or malformed by the structures of political, economic, and family life, then changing one's character may require access to the appropriate transforming forces, which may not be available. In modern societies, for example, many adults still work at alienating jobs that do not afford opportunity to realize the human powers and to experience the pleasures of self-expression. Women in particular, because of unequal domestic arrangements, nearly total responsibility for childcare, and sex segregation in the workplace, often endure low-paying, dead-end jobs that encourage feelings of self-hatred. In a family where economic, and hence psychological, power is unequal between women and men, affection, as Mill recognized, may harm both parties. Thus many women and men today may not be well-positioned to develop fully either of the capacities Aristotle considered central to virtuous character.
These considerations indicate why character has become a central issue not only in ethics, but also in feminist philosophy, political philosophy, philosophy of education, and philosophy of literature. If developing good moral character requires being members of a community in which citizens can fully realize their human powers and ties of friendship, then one needs to ask how educational, economic, political, and social institutions should be structured to make that development possible. Some contemporary philosophers are now addressing these issues. For example, Martha Nussbaum uses Aristotelian virtues to outline a democratic ideal in (1990b). In (1996) Andrew Mason explores how capitalist market forces make it difficult for virtues to flourish. Rosalind Hursthouse applies an Aristotelian view of the emotions to an investigation of racist attitudes in (2001). Laurence Thomas (1989) uses Aristotle's discussions of self-love and friendship to argue that friendship helps to develop and maintain good moral character. And if one is interested in understanding what the nature of moral character is and the extent to which it can be altered, one will find useful examples of both good and bad moral character in literary writers. For philosophical discussion of literary writers' use of character, see (Taylor 1996) and (Nussbaum 1990a).
Finally, it might be useful to note that this brief discussion of the history of philosophical views of character indicates that character has played, or can play, an important role in a variety of western ethical traditions, from Greek virtue-centered views to Kantianism to utilitarianism to Marxism. So Anscombe's provocative claim with which this entry began -- that the two major traditions in modern moral theory (Kantianism and utilitarianism) have ignored questions of virtue and character to their detriment -- does not seem altogether true. Nevertheless, some of the views sureyed here seem to give a more prominent role to character and virtue than do others. It is not easy to explain precisely what this prominence consists in. Although a full treatment of these issues is beyond the scope of this essay, this entry will end with a preliminary indication of how they might be addressed. (For further discussion of these questions, see Trianosky 1990, Watson 1990, Homiak 1997, and Hursthouse 2001.)
As this entry has indicated, Kant's views do provide a role for virtue, for it matters to Kant that we perform our imperfect duties with the right spirit. The virtuous person has the properly cultivated dispositions to feel that make it easier for her to perform her imperfect duties. These feelings support her recognition of what is right and are a sign that she is disposed to perform her duties. Because Kant views the emotions as recalcitrant and in continual need of reason's control, virtue amounts to a kind of self-mastery or continence. One might put this point by saying that, for Kant, virtuous character is subordinate to the claims of practical reason.
Aristotle's view, on the other hand, is usually considered a paradigm example of a "virtue ethics", an ethical theory that gives priority to virtuous character. To see what this might mean, recall that Aristotle's virtuous person is a genuine self-lover who enjoys most the exercise of her abilities to think and know. This enjoyment guides her practical determinations of what actions are appropriate in what circumstances and renders her unattracted to the pleasures associated with the common vices. Her properly cultivated emotional dispositions are not viewed as recalcitrant aspects of her being that need to be controlled by reason. Rather, her practical decisions are informed and guided by the enjoyment she takes in her rational powers. One might put this point by saying that, in Aristotle's view, practical deliberation is subordinate to character.
One might then ask of other ethical views whether they take practical deliberation to be subordinate to character or vice versa. As this entry has indicated, Hume appears to side with Aristotle and to give character priority over practical deliberation. For he suggests that someone with the natural virtues based on self-esteem will have the wider imaginative powers needed for correct deliberation from the standpoint of the judicious spectator. Whether character is subordinate to reason for Mill may depend on what sort of utilitarianism Mill can be shown to espouse. If he is a motive-utilitarian who thinks that one should act as the person with the motives or virtues most productive of happiness would act, then a case could be made for his giving character priority over practical reason. If, on the other hand, he is an act- or rule-utilitarian, he would seem to give character a role that is subordinate to reason. These brief remarks indicate that the question of whether an ethical theorist gives priority to character can only be determined by a thorough analysis of the various critical elements of that philosopher's view.