|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
The sources and history of these different forms will be discussed under each of the forms considered. After the discussion of the individual forms, the overall development of literary form will be considered.
In the Latin West, philosophical allegory flourished in the 12th century. One of the most important, Bernard of Chartres's Cosmographia, is an allegorical account of the origins of the world, both narrative and structural. Bernard tells the story of Natura asking Noys to bring some order to prime matter. Book I traces the creation of the material world, and book II, the creation of man. Bernard's main source for this myth of creation is Plato's Timaeus but his myth making is combined with philosophical and scientific speculation. Like Alan of Lille's allegories, De Planctu Naturae and Anticlaudianus, Bernard's work is both allegorical and encyclopedic, two forms which were also combined in an important classical model for these works, Martianus Cappella's The Marriage of Mercury and Philology. What is remarkable about these works is the combination of allegory with science and philosophy. These writers do not think of the mythic and the scientific as opposing discourses. Rather the creation of new myths is associated with the work of creation, linking the work of God as artifex with that of the composer of allegory. Science and allegory are also linked by the activity of de-allegorization, the process of extracting the abstract and philosophical message hidden in the allegory. According to Brian Stock, until the middle of the 12th century, it was taken as a given that allegories contained hidden philosophical information (Stock, 1972, 31).
The controversial and difficult question is why these medieval thinkers chose the allegorical form. Avicenna gives an elaborate, esoteric justification. He tells us that what he purports to do by allegory is to convey one message to the "many" in sensible imagery they can understand, while conveying a different message to the philosophically minded few (Heath, 1992, 150-153). Neoplatonic and Christian writers, although citing the importance of not ‘casting one's pearls before swine’, also cite the need to provide access through the senses to a non-sensible reality and the need to use obvious metaphors so that their language will not be taken for a literally true representation of the divine. In the secondary literature, the most common reason given for the allegorical form is that the allegory is an heuristic device that makes the difficult and abstract message easier to understand. On this view, the allegorical form can be stripped away without changing the meaning of the text. The opposite view is that the motive is esoteric. On this view, most famously propounded by Leo Strauss and his followers, writers fearing persecution and misinterpretation decided to "hide" their true views behind the façade of allegory, in order to protect both themselves and their message. Lastly, others have argued that the mystical message or account of spiritual union with the good cannot be expressed adequately in the literal language of logic and argument. On this view, the allegorical form is an essential aspect of the text and, hence, cannot be excised without detriment to the author's meaning.
The influence of this form goes beyond 12th-century attempts to
compose axiomatic philosophical/theological works in the tradition of
Boethius's De Hebdomadibus (like Alan's Regulae
caelestis iuris and Nicholas of Amiens's Ars Catholicae
Fidei). First, the form is taken up by Leibniz in his axiomatic
works. Second, early medieval notions of science are indebted to
these Neoplatonic models of science, models that continue to be
influential even after the receipt of Aristotle's Posterior
Analytics. Further, the geometric methods of "analysis" and
"synthesis" ("resolutio/compositio"), which work to and from first
principles or axioms and is linked to axiomatic method in both its
Proclusian and Euclidean forms, is important not only for later
Medieval thinkers like Aquinas, but also for Descartes, Newton, and
Boethius thus brings to the Medieval tradition of commentary both these obvious and subtle Neoplatonic distortions of the Aristotelian corpus. First, Boethius's commentaries are highly indebted to Neoplatonic sources. The thesis that Boethius simply copied his commentaries from a single codex's collection of Greek commentators' remarks is too extreme, but it is nevertheless clear that Boethius relied heavily on Neoplatonic sources. We can see this in his commentary on the Categories, where we have all of Boethius's sources. Here Boethius uses Porphyry as his main source, while supplementing this material with other Neoplatonic sources (Ebbesen, 1990, 376-77). Had Boethius managed to get to the Physics or Metaphysics for commentary, we might have seen his own Neoplatonic interpretations of Aristotle emerge more strongly. As it is, such leanings are evident, for example, in his commentary on the Peri Hermeneias. In his discussion of future contingents, Boethius follows the Neoplatonists, arguing for the view that while there is real contingency in the sub-lunar world, there is also necessity operating at other levels. Though he does not argue for providence until writing his Consolation, he does make room for such a possibility in the commentary. In the Peri Hermeneias commentary, he follows the Neoplatonic strategy of placing Aristotle's view in a larger philosophical context where it can be seen as part of but not the whole truth.
Averroes (Ibn Rushd), who comes to be known as "the commentator" in the Latin West because of his magisterial grasp of Aristotle, is another important influence in the medieval commentary tradition. He declares on numerous occasions that his aim in commenting on Aristotle is to explain the Aristotelian text, a task he adheres to fairly faithfully. He does not introduce non-Aristotelian material to explain Aristotle; he does not even, for example, make reference to Porphyry's introduction to the Categories, the Isagoge, to help make sense of the Categories. He does, however, add to the Aristotelian text in two ways. First and most ubiquitously, he divides Aristotle's text into sections and chapters, some of which follow the divisions we now have, some of which he devises himself. The origin of the modern text divisions of Aristotle's work is not known and those divisions are not authoritative. Averroes may have worked with a text that contained no divisions at all; thus he would have had to supply them all (Butterworth, 1983, 6-8). Further, Averroes adds explanations of aspects of Aristotle's text that are especially unclear or terse, and adds references to other works in the Aristotelian corpus to help explain particular texts.
Averroes wrote three different kinds of commentaries, which have come to be known as "short," "middle," and "long" commentaries. Scholars have now shown that these terms, though used to describe various kinds of commentary by Averroes or his editors, are often very fluid and do not mark off clear cut genres (Gutas, 1993, 31-42). Nonetheless, it is clear that Averroes composes different kinds of commentaries to serve different pedagogical goals. He writes summaries or synopses of Aristotle's works, as well as full-blown commentaries. Some commentaries work toward an explanation of the letter of the text; in these the source text is first cited and then interpreted virtually word for word. This is done sometimes in the form of a continuous text, other times in the form of marginal notations to the main text. Still other commentaries, the type traditionally known as "middle" commentaries, are explanations of the sense rather than the letter, paraphrasing rather than commenting thoroughly on the source text (Gutas, 1993, 33-5).
In the Latin West during the 12th and 13th centuries the goal of commentary was to explain the author's intention. However, until the end of the 13th century, the author was assumed to intend to express the truth; thus every effort was made to bring an author's text into harmony with the truth. This attitude toward texts is generally thought to emerge from the tradition of biblical exegesis, where the biblical text is assumed to be true, to be in accord with the basic articles of faith, and, hence, as needing to be interpreted from within those parameters. Moreover, as interpreters began to collect different interpretations of biblical texts, they tended to deal with conflicts between authorities by harmonizing such opinions rather than simply keeping some and discarding others. So for example, Aquinas supports Aristotle's astronomy even in the face of conflicting mathematical evidence from Ptolemy. He argues that Ptolemy's account "saves the appearances" but may not in fact be true since the phenomena could be saved in some other way (Lohr, 1982, 93-94). Also Aquinas tries to save Aristotle from holding fast to the position that the world is eternal, arguing that Aristotle's argument for the eternity of motion might be merely hypothetical. In general, medieval Latin commentators through the 13th century rarely abandon the principle that the text makes some kind of sense. Thus even when the Aristotelian text is extremely cryptic, corrupt, or terse, commentators make every effort to give the text a clear and consistent sense, even if it must be almost completely constructed. A very striking example of the commentator's art in this regard is Aquinas's commentary on Aristotle's De Anima, especially his commentary on the very difficult passages on the workings of the intellect (De Anima III, 5). Less dramatically, medieval commentators, whether before or after 1300, make divisions of the text into its parts and give a description of the overall structure and forward progression of its arguments. These divisions and outlines of the text serve to give unity and coherence to a text even if it might lack these features on its own.
Starting in 1255, study in the arts faculty at Paris officially came to be centered around the works of Aristotle. Further, the commentaries of the masters of arts rather than of theology brought a different hermeneutic to the interpretation of Aristotle. No longer committed to Aristotle as a source for the truth (the truth was possessed by theology), the masters of arts did not try to bring Aristotle into harmony with other authoritative sources and felt free to expose rather than try to save Aristotle from holding erroneous positions. Because Aristotle was thus no longer considered an essentially error-free authoritative source, commentaries shifted to an emphasis on questions arising from the text rather than the exposition of text (Lohr, 1982, 95-6). This shift is heralded by most scholars as marking an important development toward modern notions of both science and commentary.
Nonetheless, even with this change in the status of authoritative texts, medieval philosophy remains one centered on authoritative texts and, hence, on their commentaries. This emphasis on the commentary points to two important differences between medieval and much contemporary, especially Anglo-American, philosophy. First, medieval philosophical writers understood their own work as emerging out of a tradition of authorities rather than in abstraction from or opposition to a tradition (See below section 3, "Role of Authorities"). Second, their work emerges out of an encounter with texts rather than in unmediated contact with ideas, problems, or arguments. (On the assumptions and characteristics of a commentary-based notion of philosophy see Smith, 1991, 3-7.) These ways of doing philosophy do not mean that medieval philosophers were incapable of originality, only that their original thought comes out of an acknowledged connection with what went before. Nor does it mean that medieval philosophers were not engaged with ideas but only words and texts. For we can only confront ideas through the language in which they are expressed.
Other dialogue writers like Gilbert Crispin, Petrus Alphonsi, Raymund Lull, and Nicolas of Cusa also write dialogues in which the participants are representatives of the major religions, Christian, Jew, Moslem, pagan or philosopher. While some take care to give the victory to the Christian, even transforming the other participants into converts to Christianity, Gilbert, Petrus, Abelard and Raymund Lull all opt for subtler conclusions. Abelard's dialogue sets up a "judge" for the debate who never proffers a judgment. Even if Abelard had added this final judgment, the dialogue would still not indicate a clear winner. Moreover, the judge is the only one who comes close to representing Abelard's own views, another way Abelard varies the form. When the convention of composing a dialogue between a teacher and student is used, usually the author can be identified more or less with the "teacher." Anselm's dialogue partner in Cur Deus Homo is the student Boso who as a Christian asks the questions that a non-Christian monotheist would ask about the Incarnation. Boethius, however, casts himself as student rather than teacher in the Consolatio. Of those who compose dialogues between teacher and student a good number, such as Augustine, Eriugena, Anselm, Boethius, Nicolas of Cusa, expect and trace a conversion or transformation in the "student" figure of the dialogue in a way that Plato's dialogues do not. Anselm explicitly makes of his interlocutor a partner in the dialogue who is supposed to anticipate conclusions and implications and/or who more truly motivates the entire discussion (Sweeney, 1999) . Like Anselm, other medieval dialogue writers play with the convention that the teacher takes the lead in the discussion, in effect asking as well as answering questions. In Eriugena's Periphyseon, it is sometimes the student, sometimes the teacher who moves the discussion forward. In William of Conches' dialogue, Dragmaticon philosophiae, the ‘Prince’ asks questions of the ‘philosopher’ who represents William's views. In an interesting variation, William of Ockham's dialogue has the student ask the questions while the teacher responds reluctantly and almost objectively without any attempt to transform or convert the student.
The variety of ways in which the dialogue form is taken up in the medieval period alone is enough to make the form as such quite interesting. In addition, as Jacobi points out, because the dialogue, unlike the disputation and commentary, is not a school form, it was always taken up as a choice and with some degree of self-consciousness on the part of the writer (Jacobi, 1999,10). They chose this form over some other for a reason that affects the argument and the position they take. (For bibliographical listings for some 160 dialogues written from the 4th century to the 15th as well as essays on the dialogues of 19 different medieval dialogue writers, see Jacobi, 1999.)
The disputation arises out of the lectio, the careful reading and commentary on authoritative texts. This type of reading involved the consultation of authoritative sources on those texts. From the differences among sources came the need to resolve such differences, a process eventually formalized into the posing of a question. A question is tied to a specific textual problem or conflict, but has, like the disputation, arguments on opposing sides and the response or resolution and replies to opposite objections by the writer. The disputation is centered around a systematic rather than a textual question, and the supporting and opposing arguments are supplied by students.
Quodlibetal questions differ from regular disputations in that quodlibetal questions were brought forward by students rather than masters; hence, quodlibetal questions display much less unity than disputed questions. These questions might reflect contemporary controversies or might be designed to put the master on the spot.
An important function of the master in both quodlibetal and disputed questions is the determinatio, in which the master ordered the various smaller questions into articles of a given question. Like the division of the text that is part of the work of commentary, this strategy involves both making distinctions, for which medieval scholastics are well-known, but also a synthesis, finding the unity of a text and the unity of a set of diverse questions under larger questions in disputation.
The source for Anselm's meditations is the practice of monastic meditation on texts from scripture or on one's own spiritual condition. Anselm takes these techniques for focusing the mind and uses them as mode of inquiry into problems of speculative theology and philosophy. Anselm's meditations make no direct reference to outside sources, either scriptural or philosophical, but represent Anselm's own thought process as he struggles with what he cannot quite understand or prove. In monastic style, he has so thoroughly ‘ruminated’ on his source texts, scripture and Augustine's De Trinitate, that they are essentially invisible to contemporary readers. This independence from authority and emphasis on internal exploration also characterizes Augustine's Soliloquies, a ‘dialogue’ between Augustine and ‘Reason’, as well as Abelard's Soliloquium, a ‘dialogue’ between "Peter" and "Abelard" on the meaning and overlap between the names ‘Christian’, ‘philosopher’ and ‘logician’. In his Itinararium mentis in Deum, Bonaventure draws on a particularly Franciscan form of contemplation, following the path of St. Francis's mystical ascent to God, based on Francis's vision of the six-winged seraph. In Bonaventure, as in Anselm, meditation is connected to the mystical project of achieving union with God.
Anselm retains the personal and intimate nature of meditation also characteristic of Augustine's Confessions. It is worth noting that among the other works that Anselm labels ‘meditations’ are a "meditation on lost virginity" and a "meditation on redemption." These are highly personal works, concerned with the existential conditions of sin and salvation. The Proslogion and Monologion share with them this personal or existential character. As Anselm Stolz points out, each step of Anselm's argument in the Proslogion either takes the form of or concludes in prayer (Stolz, 1967,198-201). According to scholars who take the form of the Proslogion as meditation seriously, that form makes it impossible to understand the argument as a "proof" for God's existence designed to convince any agnostic or atheist on a purely rational level. Rather, they argue, the text is an attempt by Anselm to address and approach God and is thus written by and for a believing Christian trying to understand and achieve union with God. On the other hand, other scholars take as most significant in the form not Anselm's prayers but his complete reliance on his own reason without recourse to authority, making the form itself an important model for independent and truly philosophical discourse. Both the introspective element and independence from authority are retained in Descartes' Meditations, about which similar questions have been raised concerning its form. In the Middle Ages, the importance of the form shows the continuation of philosophy or philosophical theology as what Pierre Hadot has called a "way of life." On this view, philosophy until the high scholasticism of the 13th and 14th centuries was essentially a spiritual and personal project of self-discipline and self-transformation, rather than an abstract and school-based problem-solving set of techniques (Hadot, 1995, 269-70). Christianity before the 13th century, Hadot argues, presented itself as a philosophy, a way of life, and Christian monasticism and its practices of meditations were meant to be a path into this spiritually transformative experience (See Hadot, 1995, 126-141 for the links between ancient "spiritual exercises" and "Christian philosophy.")
Peter Lombard's Sentences was such a successful instance of the form that commenting on it became an academic requirement for the master of theology in the 13th century. Though Peter claims in his prologue merely to have made a collection of the views of church fathers and most historians have taken him at his word, his advance lies in the organization of particular questions into a unified plan, based on Augustine's distinction between things to be enjoyed (God alone) and things to be used (everything else). Secondly, Peter offers his own responses to questions, engages and refutes opinions of contemporaries when necessary, and in many cases, uses the form to articulate and justify and create consensus. Besides giving theology an organization and making a place for all questions to be considered, Peter often explicitly leaves some questions open. Peter thus invites others to join in the debate and conversation rather than simply accept or reject his views. All of these features made his work especially fruitful for later commentary. Further, Peter Lombard, unlike Abelard, attempted to give substantial, metaphysical rather than merely verbal solutions to theological problems, a method more in tune with the 13th century curriculum focused on Aristotle, than the 12th, organized around the trivium arts, also positioning Peter's Sentences for the preeminence it achieved in the 13th century.
Sophismata discussed in the form of a disputation usually involve the author offering arguments both for the truth and falsity of the proposition. The writer then provides a solution, often only a statement about whether the sophism is true or false; then, he offers more elaborate replies to the objections to his view. This form can be complicated by the addition of a response offered and defended and then further attacked, and then once again defended by responses to the new set of opposing arguments.
In the obligational form of disputation, an opponent puts something forward to a respondent. The respondent then ‘obligates’ himself to take a certain position on the case put forward by the opponent throughout the dispute. There are different types of obligations based on the type of claim the opponent proposes and the stance the respondent adopts towards it. (On the different types, see Stump, 1982, 319-323.) The goal of the opponent is to trap the respondent into a contradiction and the goal of the respondent is to attempt to avoid the contradiction. The setting of the discussion is crucial since the obligation often involves the evaluation of statements that depend on the disputational context. So, for example, the respondent is often obligated to take a position on propositions which make reference to their granting or denying something within the disputation (e.g., ‘that you are in Rome must be granted [by you]’) (Stump, 1982, 327). In other cases, the difficulty is caused by reference to the passage of time within the dispute. So it is posited that something is true at A, but it becomes false and impossible that it be true later in the disputation since the instant A has passed (Stump, 1982, 328). Often, the dispute between the opponent and respondent is set up to result in a paradox. In such cases, the solution must happen outside the debate between the two parties, in which there is a further distinction or disqualification of something originally granted in the disputation.
The summa form was invented by Peter Helias. His Summa super Priscianum was written around 1150, more than a century before Peter of Spain composed his logical summa and Thomas Aquinas his theological summa. Peter Helias's summa combines a commentary on Priscian's text with a systematic consideration of all the aspects of grammar (Reilly, 1993, 16).
What Peter Lombard's Sentences are to the sentence genre, Thomas Aquinas's two great summae, the Summa Contra Gentiles and Summa Theologiae are to the summa form. As with sentence collections, there are two aspects of the form to be considered, the overall organizing structure and the method of confronting individual problems or questions. In terms of overall structure, the Contra Gentiles is a reflection of Aquinas's distinction between those things which can be known by reason alone (e.g., that God exists) and those things which cannot be arrived at without revelation (e.g., the Trinity and Incarnation). Hence the first three books of the Summa Contra Gentiles, dealing with God and creation, use arguments which depend only on reason to reach and support its conclusions. The fourth book is concerned with those things that are known only through revelation, in which revelation offers the principles from which conclusions are drawn. The form for handling individual issues and problems in the Contra Gentiles is not the quaestio but a more affirmative defense of specific positions and against specific heresies. And though it is unclear whether the title summa is original (Jordan, 1986, 182-3), the work fits the summa form in its systematic arrangement of topics and its attempt to include all possible arguments for a given position and against its contrary. It has been argued that the Contra Gentiles is not a polemical but a protreptic work, addressed to Christians, calling on them to deepen their understanding of the faith, specifically about how to persuade others to Christian belief (Jordan, 1986, 190, 194). The gentiles in the title are not Muslims and Jews but "pre- or extra-Christian man, and metaphorically, the human mind under the tutelage of nature" (Jordan, 1986, 184).
The Summa Theologiae by contrast uses an abbreviated form of the disputed question. The questions are, however, artificial, carefully composed imitations of disputations, not tied to any actual oral debate as true disputed questions are. This gives Aquinas the opportunity to arrange the objections and authorities so as to achieve a rhetorical as well as a logical effect. Moreover, this approach illustrates two important differences between Peter Lombard's Sentences and Aquinas's Summa Theologiae. The gathering of authorities around a given question is for Peter one of the main purposes of his work, to some degree an end in itself, while for Aquinas those citations serve the end of constructing an answer to the question. Further, while Peter is perfectly willing to dispense with the question format when he finds an issue uncontroversial or largely settled by consensus, Aquinas always places issues in the format of a question, always finds arguments on both sides of an issue. For Peter, the question format is more a means to an end, to finding and stating an answer to a question that will more or less settle the issue. But what Aquinas wants to teach beginning students of theology, for whom he says the work is composed, is that speculation, not fixed answers, is at the heart of the philosophical and theological enterprise. What he passes on to those students is not information so much as training in a certain way of thinking.
At the macro level, the Summa Theologiae is organized into three parts; first, a consideration of God; second, the rational creature's movement toward God; and third, of Christ as the way to God. In his prologue, Aquinas claims that the main contribution of his work is in its organization of topics and questions, following the order required by the subject instead of a book or a particular disputation. In this sense, both Aquinas's summae represent a further and almost complete emancipation from a textual order to a logical order. Within that logical structure, Aquinas devotes long passages to scripture, to the Genesis account of creation (Part I, qq. 67-74), Hebrew scripture considered as the "Old Law" (Part II, first part, qq. 98-106) and the life of Christ (Part III, qq. 27-59). Moreover, the work retains its tie to texts in individual questions which, as individual systematic questions are addressed, interpret authorities according to their response, ultimately harmonizing rather than simply discarding discordant voices.
After Aquinas, the summa remains a form for the systematic organization of an entire area of study. In some of the imitators of Aquinas's theological summa, the summa form becomes a summary, a collection of answers, a manual in which to look up answers to particular questions. Ockham's Summa Logicae shares with the summa genre in theology the attempt to organize an entire discipline systematically. Ockham's principle of organization is first to divide logic into terms and propositions and then to consider the various types of terms and propositions. Ockham's form for considering particular types of terms or propositions is generally straightforward exposition occasionally mixed with a presentation of opposing positions and responses to the arguments for that position. In form, it shows a progression toward the modern treatise, such as that of Hume or Locke on human nature or understanding.
The way in which scripture is cited is somewhat different from the way Aristotle or even church authorities like Augustine are used. First, scripture is a language in which these authors are thoroughly fluent. They cite scripture from memory, almost proverbially. Further, when scripture is cited in argumentative forms like the disputation, most often it does not carry the weight of the argument. Either scripture is cited in opposing arguments on one side or the other, in which case it must be responded to and either supported or rejected by independent argument. Or it is cited in the master's own answer, in which case it functions as a support for something for which independent rational arguments are given. Scripture is used to give a position moral and spiritual weight, to reiterate the moral and spiritual center of a writer's thought. It thus acts as an almost existential reminder of why these arguments matter and what is at stake in them.
If these are strategies that in general characterize the Latin tradition until the 13th century, there is a different strategy at work in some philosophers in the Arabic and Jewish traditions. While these authors also attempt in many cases to show the deep concordance between, for example, scripture and the philosophers, they also at times use authoritative texts to put forward views which they themselves would like to promulgate even as they leave them in the mouths of those other authors, like Aristotle or Plato.
As is clear from the development of the sentence collection, summa, and commentary, there are significant changes over time in the ways in which authorities were used and cited (see the discussion of these individual forms above). It is possible to see the evolution of the treatment of authoritative sources as growing positively toward a more modern ‘scientific’ attitude towards interpretation and commentary, one which is neutral and critical rather than dedicated to finding the ‘truth’ in a given author no matter how hidden. But while there is considerable development toward modern standards of scholarship in the 13th and 14th centuries, there are also virtues in the earlier types of approach to authoritative sources. These earlier authors are highly sophisticated interpreters of biblical and philosophical texts, finding levels of conflict and concord among different authors that modern interpreters would tend to miss.
While rejecting the extreme position Strauss takes on medieval philosophical texts, many scholars have noted the esoteric elements present in some medieval texts by Christian as well as Islamic and Jewish writers. Boethius, for example, presents his theological views not to the many but to his trusted teachers and advisors, writing in a highly dense and technical language in his De Hebdomadibus accessible only to the highly learned. As late as the end of the 12th century, Alan of Lille writes in theological texts of the need to protect the sacred truths of theology from the incursions of uneducated students in the liberal arts, and in the 11th century, Anselm complains of the work he intended only for his fellow monks in the Cur Deus Homo being disseminated without his consent and in a form he did not approve. Like many medieval authors, he expresses great concern that his work will be misunderstood and strives to protect himself from misinterpretation.
In the Latin, Christian world, though philosophy and speculative theology is accepted as a legitimate endeavor, enshrined by the 13th century in the university curriculum, philosophical writers were sometimes censured by theological authorities. This threat, some have argued, influenced some writers to pull their punches, to make concessions or professions of ignorance or humility that were not authentically part of their views. Hence, for example, some have argued that Abelard's statement in his theology disclaiming any ability or pretense to address the issues necessary for salvation or to give anything more than verisimilitudes about the divine, is a concession to his persecutors more than a sincere statement of his view of his own work. Christian writers operating before the formation of the universities and the development of acceptable university forms of writing, i.e., commentaries on Aristotle, on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, disputed questions, etc., need to justify their writing, to explain the nature of its audience, to show the author's submission to the proper authorities. Readers must consider whether these kinds of statements can simply be disregarded as obligatory but not sincere, and whether they affect the presentation of the philosophical and theological arguments in the text. While it might be tempting to see them merely as pro forma, it is clear that complete disregard of such remarks is anachronistic. Such views, for example, contributed to the now thoroughly rejected view of Abelard as pure rationalist and as a rebel against church authority. Nonetheless, concern about avoiding conflict or censure is real among these writers. For example, after the condemnation of many Aristotelian positions in 1277, authors take care to note when they are simply citing or describing a point of view in order to consider it or argue against it, signaling with a phrase like "dico recitative" that they are not subscribing to that position.
Parallel to the highly formalized and structured debate of the disputations in the later Middle Ages, there are also highly formalized ways of engaging in debate with one's contemporaries that shift to some degree over time. In the 12th and 13th centuries, for example, while it is acceptable to attach names of church teachers and authorities from earlier generations to opposing positions, even to positions opposed by the contemporary writer of a text, one's contemporaries or those of a previous generation were never directly named but merely referred to as "someone" or "certain people" who might hold a given position. However, this should not be interpreted as deference to one's contemporaries or as an attempt to quell controversy, since authors became adept at signaling their opponents without actually naming them, paraphrasing or parodying their views or catchphrases as modes of ridicule or play. In the late 13th century, Duns Scotus begins to give partial references to the contemporary thinkers and texts with which he is in conversation; Peter Aureol in the 14th century gives full and accurate citations. Gregory of Rimini (d. 1358) develops a "historico-critical approach to theology," carefully citing authoritative texts and using "common sense" arguments in opposition to the emphasis on logical subtlety of radical nominalists.
This development parallels one in some medieval sermons, where the writers find ways of referring (often by puns) to themselves as author of the sermon. The shift is from an interest in the arguments to interest in the individual thinkers. One cause for these changes might be the internationalization of the writers and texts. In a more parochial world, everyone would know who held certain positions; but in a wider context, those, for example, at Oxford might not be known and need to be named in Paris. These changes might have also been caused by the growing self-consciousness and sense of individuality historians have noticed in other aspects of medieval academic and social life.
Much more work needs to be done on the literary forms of medieval philosophy. There are so many forms instantiated in so many ways in different periods and by different authors. Consideration of these forms is especially important for a more complete understanding of medieval philosophical texts because so many of these forms are foreign to contemporary readers. Sometimes the form is important because an author was constrained by practice or academic statute to use it, as with disputations and Sentences commentaries; hence, how an author comes to use or manipulate a given form for his own ends is a significant part of understanding the text. When, in the other cases, an author uses a non-standard form, that form is self-consciously chosen and thus in a different way a significant part of an author's meaning. It would be helpful to have studies of particular authors who have used different forms, and more studies tracing the development of a given genre through different authors and periods (as in Jacobi 1999). Finally, more historical work needs to be done by individual scholars equipped to look at the different genres across different periods and from within and across different religious traditions.