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Paraconsistent Logic
The development of paraconsistent logic was initiated in order
to challenge the logical principle that anything follows from
contradictory premises, ex contradictione quodlibet (ECQ). Let
_{} be a relation of logical
consequence, defined either semantically or prooftheoretically. Let
us say that
_{} is explosive
iff for every formula A and B, {A ,
~A}
_{} B. Classical
logic, intuitionistic logic, and most other standard logics are
explosive. A logic is said to be paraconsistent iff its
relation of logical consequence is not explosive.
The modern history of paraconsistent logic is relatively short. Yet
the subject has already been shown to be an important development in
logic for many reasons. These involve the motivations for the subject,
its philosophical implications and its applications. In the first half
of this article, we will review some of these. In the second, we will
give some idea of the basic technical constructions involved in
paraconsistent logics. Further discussion can be found in the
references given at the end of the article.
A most telling reason for paraconsistent logic is the fact that there
are theories which are inconsistent but nontrivial. Clearly, once we
admit the existence of such theories, their underlying logics must be
paraconsistent. Examples of inconsistent but nontrivial theories are
easy to produce. An example can be derived from the history of
science. (In fact, many examples can be given from this area.)
Consider Bohr's theory of the atom. According to this, an electron
orbits the nucleus of the atom without radiating energy. However,
according to Maxwell's equations, which formed an integral part of the
theory, an electron which is accelerating in orbit must radiate
energy. Hence Bohr's account of the behaviour of the atom was
inconsistent. Yet, patently, not everything concerning the behavior
of electrons was inferred from it. Hence, whatever inference mechanism
it was that underlay it, this must have been paraconsistent.
The importance of paraconsistent logic also follows if, more
contentiously, but as some people have argued, there are true
contradictions (dialetheias), i.e., there are sentences, A,
such that both A and ~A are true. If there are
dialetheias then some inferences of the form {A ,
~A}
_{} B must
fail. For only true conclusions follow validly from the true
premises. Hence logic has to be paraconsistent. A plausible example of
dialetheia is the liar paradox. Consider the sentence: This
sentence is not true. There are two options: either the sentence is
true or it is not. Suppose it is true. Then what it says is the
case. Hence the sentence is not true. Suppose, on the other hand, it
is not true. This is what it says. Hence the sentence is true. In
either case it is both true and not true.
Paraconsistent logic is motivated not only by philosophical
considerations, but also by its applications and implications. One of
the applications is automated reasoning (information
processing). Consider a computer which stores a large amount of
information. While the computer stores the information, it is also
used to operate on it, and, crucially, to infer from it. Now it is
quite common for the computer to contain inconsistent information,
because of mistakes by the data entry operators or because of multiple
sourcing. This is certainly a problem for database operations with
theoremprovers, and so has drawn much attention from computer
scientists. Techniques for removing inconsistent information have been
investigated. Yet all have limited applicability, and, in any case,
are not guaranteed to produce consistency. (There is no algorithm for
logical falsehood.) Hence, even if steps are taken to get rid of
contradictions when they are found, an underlying paraconsistent logic
is desirable if hidden contradictions are not to generate spurious
answers to queries.
As a part of artificial intelligence research, belief
revision is one of the areas that have been studied
widely. Belief revision is the study of rationally revising bodies of
belief in the light of new evidence. Notoriously, people have
inconsistent beliefs. They may even be rational in doing so. For
example, there may be apparently overwhelming evidence for both
something and its negation. There may even be cases where it is in
principle impossible to eliminate such inconsistency. For example,
consider the "paradox of the preface". A rational person, after
thorough research, writes a book in which they claim
A_{1},…, A_{n}. But
they are also aware that no book of any complexity contains only
truths. So they rationally believe ~(A_{1}
&…&
A_{n}) too. Hence, principles of rational belief
revision must work on inconsistent sets of beliefs. Standard accounts
of belief revision, e.g., that of Gärdenfors et al., all
fail to do this since they are based on classical logic. A more
adequate account is based on a paraconsistent logic.
Other applications of paraconsistent logic concern theories of
mathematical significance. Examples of such theories are formal
semantics and set theory.
Semantics is the study that aims to spell out a theoretical
understanding of meaning. Most accounts of semantics insist that to
spell out the meaning of a sentence is, in some sense, to spell out
its truthconditions. Now, prima facie at least, truth is a
predicate characterised by the Tarski Tscheme:
T(A) ↔ A,
where A is a sentence and A is its name. But
given any standard means of selfreference, e.g., arithmetisation, one
can construct a sentence, B, which means that
~T(B). The Tscheme gives that
T(B) ↔
~T(B). It then follows that
T(B) & ~T(B). (This
is, of course, just the liar paradox.)
The situation is similar in set theory. The naive, and intuitively
correct, axioms of set theory are the Comprehension Schema and
Extensionality Principle:
yx(x
∈ y ↔ A)
x(x ∈ y
↔ x ∈ z) → y = z
where x does not occur free in A. As was discovered
by Russell, any theory that contains the Comprehension Schema is
inconsistent. For putting ‘y
y’
for A in the Comprehension Schema and instantiating the
existential quantifier to an arbitrary such object
‘r’ gives:
y(y ∈ r
↔ y y)
So, instantiating the universal quantifier to ‘r’
gives:
r ∈ r ↔ r
r
It then follows that r ∈ r & r
r.
The standard approaches to these problems of inconsistency are, by and
large, ones of expedience. However, a paraconsistent approach makes it
possible to have theories of truth and sethood in which the fundamental
intuitions about these notions are respected. The contradictions may be
allowed to arise, but these need not infect the rest of the theory.
Paraconsistent logic also has important philosophical
ramifications. One example of this concerns Gödel's theorem. One
version of Gödel's first incompleteness theorem states that for
any consistent axiomatic theory of arithmetic, which can be recognised
to be sound, there will be an arithmetic truth  viz., its Gödel
sentence  not provable in it, but which can be established as true by
intuitively correct reasoning. The heart of Gödel's theorem is,
in fact, a paradox that concerns the sentence, G, ‘This
sentence is not provable’. If G is provable, then it is true
and so not provable. Thus G is proved. Hence G is true
and so unprovable. If an underlying paraconsistent logic is used to
formalise the arithmetic, and the theory therefore allowed to be
inconsistent, the Gödel sentence may well be provable in the
theory (essentially by the above reasoning). So a paraconsistent
approach to arithmetic overcomes the limitations of arithmetic that
are supposed (by many) to follow from Gödel's theorem.
The foregoing discussion indicates some of the motivations for
paraconsistent logic, its applications and implications. We will now
indicate some of the main approaches to paraconsistency. There are
many different paraconsistent logics. Most of them can be defined in
terms of a semantics which allows both A and ~A to hold
in an interpretation. Validity is then defined in terms of the
preservation of holding in an interpretation, and so ECQ fails. We
will illustrate this with four kinds of propositional paraconsistent
logics: nonadjunctive, nontruthfunctional,
manyvalued, and relevant. (Paraconsistent quantified
logics are straightforward extensions of these.) In all the following
systems, not only ECQ fails, but so does the Disjunctive Syllogism
(DS), defined as the following inference rule: {A, ~A
B}
_{}
B. In particular, then, if one defines the
material conditional, A ⊃ B, as ~A
B (as usual) then modus
ponens for this fails.
Let us start with nonadjunctive systems, so called because the
inference from A and B to A & B
fails. The first of these to be produced was also the first formal
paraconsistent logic. This was Jaskowski's discussive (or
discursive) logic. In a discourse, each participant
puts forward some information, beliefs, or opinions. What is true in a
discourse is the sum of opinions given by participants. Each
participant's opinions are taken to be selfconsistent, but may be
inconsistent with those of others. To formalise this idea, take an
interpretation, I, to be one for a standard modal logic, say
S5. Each participant's belief set is the set of sentences
true in a possible world in I. Thus, A holds in
I iff A holds at some world in
I. Clearly, one may have both A and ~A (but
not A & ~A) holding in an interpretation. Since
modus ponens for ⊃ fails, Jaskowski introduced a
connective he called discussive implication, ⊃_{d},
defined as
(A ⊃ B).
It is easy to check that in S5 discussive implication
satisfies modus ponens.
The study of nontruthfunctional systems was initiated by da Costa
(who has also produced several other kinds of system). The main idea
here was to maintain the apparatus of some positive logic, say
classical or intuitionistic, but to allow negation in an
interpretation to behave nontruthfunctionally. Thus, take an
interpretation to be a function which maps formulas to 1 or 0; &,
, and → behave in the usual
(classical) way, but the value of ~A is independent of that
of A. In particular, both may take the value 1. Negation has
no significant properties under these semantics. Various properties of
negation may be obtained by adding further constraints on
interpretations. If we add the requirements that, for any A,
either A or ~A must take the value 1 (giving the Law
of Excluded Middle) and that whenever ~~A takes the value 1,
so does A, we obtain the core of da Costa's systems
C_{i} , for finite i. If we start
with an appropriate semantics for positive intuitionist logic, and
proceed in the same way, we obtain da Costa's logic
C_{ω}. If we write A° for
~(A & ~A) then it is natural to take it as
expressing the consistency of A. Further postulates
constraining how A° behaves differentiate between the
C_{i} systems for finite i.
Perhaps the simplest way of generating a paraconsistent logic, first
proposed by Asenjo, is to use a manyvalued logic, that is, a logic
with more than two truth values. The formulas which hold in a
manyvalued interpretations are those which have a value said to be
designated. A manyvalued logic will therefore be
paraconsistent if it allows both a formula and its negation to be
designated. The simplest strategy is to use three truth values:
true (only) and false (only), which function as in
classical logic, and both truth and false (which, naturally, is
a fixed point for negation). Both varieties of truth are
designated. This is the approach of the paraconsistent logic
LP. If one adds a fourth value, neither true nor false,
which behaves in an appropriate way, one obtains Dunn's semantics for
First Degree Entailment. If one takes the truth values to be the real
numbers between 0 and 1, with a suitable set of designated values, the
logic will be a natural paraconsistent fuzzy logic.
Relevant logics were pioneered by Anderson and Belnap. Worldsemantics
for them were developed by R. and V.Routley and Meyer. In an
interpretation for such logics, conjunction and disjunction behave in
the usual way. But each world, w, has an associate world,
w*; and ~A is true at w iff A is
false, not at w, but w*. Thus, if A is true
at w, but false at w*, A & ~A
is true at w. To obtain the standard relevant logics, one
needs to add the constraint that w** = w. As is
clear, negation in these semantics is an intensional operator. (There
are also versions of worldsemantics for relevant logics based on
Dunn's fourvalued semantics. In these, negation is extensional.)
The concern with relevant logics is not so much with negation as
with a conditional connective, → (satisfying modus
ponens). Semantics for this are obtained by furnishing each
interpretation with a ternary relation, R. In the
simplified semantics of Priest, Sylvan and Restall, worlds are divided
into normal and nonnormal. If w is a normal world, A
→ B is true at w iff at all worlds where
A is true, B is true. If w is nonnormal,
A → B is true at w iff for all
x, y, such that Rwxy, if A is true
at x, B is true at y. (Validity is defined
as truth preservation over normal worlds.) This gives the
basic relevant logic, B. Stronger logics, such as the logic
R, are obtained by adding constraints on the ternary
relation. Further details concerning
relevant logics can be found in the
article on that topic in this encyclopedia.
For Paraconsistent Logic and Paraconsistency in general:
 Priest, G., Routley, R., and Norman, J. (eds.) Paraconsistent
Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent, Philosophia Verlag,
München, 1989.
 Priest, G. "Paraconsistent Logic", Handbook of Philosophical
Logic (second edition), forthcoming.
On Dialetheism
 Priest, G. "Logic of Paradox", Journal of Philosophical
Logic, Vol. VIII, pp. 219241, 1979.
 Priest, G. In Contradiction: A Study of the
Transconsistent, Martinus Nijhoff, Dordrecht, 1987.
For Automated Reasoning
 Belnap, N.D., Jr. "A Useful Fourvalued Logic: How a computer
should think", Entailment: The Logic of Relevance and
Necessity, Vol II, A.R. Anderson, N.D. Belnap, Jr, and J.M. Dunn,
Princeton University Press, 1992, first appeared as "A Usuful
Fourvalued Logic", Modern Use of Multiplevalued Logic,
J.M. Dunn and G. Epstein (eds.), D.Reidel Publishing Company,
Dordrecht, 1977, and "How a Computer Should Think", Comtemporary
Aspects of Philosophy, G. Ryle (ed.), Oriel Press, 1977.
For Belief Revision
 Restall, G. and Slaney, J. "Realistic Belief Revision", Technical
Report: TRARP295, Automated Reasoning Project, Australian National
University, 1995.
 Tanaka, K. "Paraconsistent Belief Revision", to appear.
For NonAdjunctive Systems
 Jaskowski, S. "Propositional Calculus for Contradictory Deductive
Systems", Studia Logica, Vol. XXIV, pp. 143157, 1969, first
published as "Rachunek zdah dla systemow dedukcyjnych sprzecznych",
Studia Societatis Scientiarun Torunesis, Sectio A, Vol. I,
No. 5, pp. 5577, 1948.
 da Costa, N.C.A. and Dubikajtis, L. "On Jaskowski's Discussive
Logic", NonClassical Logics, Modal Theory and Computability,
A.I. Arruda, N.C.A. da Costa and R. Chuaqui (eds.), NorthHolland
Publishing Company, Amsterdam, pp.3756, 1977.
 Schotch, P.K. and Jennings, R.E. "Inference and Necessity",
Journal of Philosophical Logic, Vol. IX, pp. 327340, 1980.
For NonTruthFunctional Systems
 da Costa, N.C.A. "On the Theory of Inconsistent Formal Systems",
Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, Vol. XV, No. 4,
pp. 497510, 1974.
 da Costa, N.C.A. and Alves, E.H. "Semantical Analysis of the
Calculi Cn", Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, Vol. XVIII,
No. 4, pp. 621630, 1977.
 Loparic, A. "Une etude semantique de quelques calculs
propositionnels", Comptes Rendus Hebdomadaires des Seances de
l'Academic des Sciences, Paris 284, pp. 835838, 1977.
For ManyValued Systems
 Asenjo, F.G. "A Calculus of Antinomies", Notre Dame Journal of
Formal Logic, Vol. XVI, pp. 1035, 1966.
 Dunn, J.M. "Intuitive Semantics for First Degree Entailment and
Coupled Trees", Philosophicl Studies, Vol. XXIX, pp. 14968,
1976.
 Kotas, J. and da Costa, N. "On the Problem of Jaskowski and the
Logics of Łukasiewicz", NonClassical Logic, Model Theory and
Computability, A.I. Arruda, N.C.A da Costa, and R. Chuaqui (eds.),
North Holland Publishing Company, Amsterdam, pp. 12739, 1977.
For Relevant Systems
 Dunn, J.M. "Relevant Logic and Entailment", Handbook of
Philosophical Logic, Vol. III: Alternatives to Classical
Logic, D. Gabbay and F. Guenthner (eds.), D.Reidel Publishing
Company, Dordrecht, pp. 117224, 1986.
 Routley, R., Plumwood, V., Meyer, R.K., and Brady,
R.T. Relevant Logics and Their Rivals, Atascadero, Ridgeview,
CA, 1982.
 Restall, G. "Simplified Semantics for Relevant Logics (and some of
their rivals)", Journal of Philosophical Logic, Vol. XXII,
pp. 481511, 1993.
[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]
dialetheism [dialethism] 
logic: relevance 
mathematics: inconsistent
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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy