This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. 
version 
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

last substantive content change

The term "fuzzy logic" emerged in the development of the theory of fuzzy sets by Lotfi Zadeh [Zadeh (1965)]. A fuzzy subset A of a (crisp) set X is characterized by assigning to each element x of X the degree of membership of x in A (e.g. X is a group of people, A the fuzzy set of old people in X). Now if X is a set of propositions then its elements may be assigned their degree of truth, which may be “absolutely true,” “absolutely false” or some intermediate truth degree: a proposition may be more true than another proposition. This is obvious in the case of vague (imprecise) propositions like “this person is old” (beautiful, rich, etc.). In the analogy to various definitions of operations on fuzzy sets (intersection, union, complement, …) one may ask how propositions can be combined by connectives (conjunction, disjunction, negation, …) and if the truth degree of a composed proposition is determined by the truth degrees of its components, i.e. if the connectives have their corresponding truth functions (like truth tables of classical logic). Saying “yes” (which is the mainstream of fuzzy logic) one accepts the truthfunctional approach; this makes fuzzy logic to something distinctly different from probability theory since the latter is not truthfunctional (the probability of conjunction of two propositions is not determined by the probabilities of those propositions).
Two main directions in fuzzy logic have to be distinguished (cf. Zadeh (1994)). Fuzzy logic in the broad sense (older, better known, heavily applied but not asking deep logical questions) serves mainly as apparatus for fuzzy control, analysis of vagueness in natural language and several other application domains. It is one of the techniques of softcomputing, i.e. computational methods tolerant to suboptimality and impreciseness (vagueness) and giving quick, simple and sufficiently good solutions. The monographs Novak (1989), Zimmermann (1991), KlirYuan (1996), Nguyen (1999) can serve as recommended sources of information.
Fuzzy logic in the narrow sense is symbolic logic with a comparative notion of truth developed fully in the spirit of classical logic (syntax, semantics, axiomatization, truthpreserving deduction, completeness, etc.; both propositional and predicate logic). It is a branch of manyvalued logic based on the paradigm of inference under vagueness. This fuzzy logic is a relatively young discipline, both serving as a foundation for the fuzzy logic in a broad sense and of independent logical interest, since it turns out that strictly logical investigation of this kind of logical calculi can go rather far. A basic monograph is Hajek (1998), further recommended monographs are Turunen (1999), Novak et al. (2000); also recent monographs dealing with manyvalued logic (not specifically oriented to fuzziness), namely Gottwald (2001), Cignoli et al. (2000a); are highly relevant.
The interested reader will find below some more information on fuzzy connectives and a survey of a logical system called basic fuzzy (propositional and predicate) logic together with three stronger systems  Łukasiewicz, Gödel and product logic; a short discussion on paradoxes and fuzzy logic; some comments on other formal systems of fuzzy logic and finally, a few remarks on fuzzy computing and bibliography.
The standard set of truth degrees is the real interval [0,1] with its natural ordering ≤ (1 standing for absolute truth, 0 for absolute falsity); but one can work with different domains, finite or infinite, linearly or partially ordered. Truth functions of connectives have to behave classically on the extremal values 0,1.
It is broadly accepted that tnorms (triangular norms) are possible truth functions of conjunction. (A binary operation * on the interval [0,1] is a tnorm if it is commutative, associative, nondecreasing and 1 is its unit element. Minimum (min(x,y) is the most popular tnorm. See the Glossary at the end.) Dually, tconorms serve as truth functions of disjunction. See Klement et al. (2000) for an extensive theory of tnorms. The truth function of negation has to be nonincreasing (and assign 0 to 1 and vice versa); the function 1−x (Łukasiewicz negation) is the best known candidate.
Implication is sometimes disregarded but is of fundamental importance for fuzzy logic in the narrow sense. A straightforward but logically less interesting possibility is to define implication from conjunction and negation (or disjunction and negation) using the corresponding tautology of classical logic; such implications are called Simplications. More useful and interesting are Rimplications: an Rimplication is defined as a residuum of a tnorm; denoting the tnorm * and the residuum we have x y= max{x x*z ≤ y}. This is welldefined only if the tnorm is leftcontinuous.
Basic fuzzy propositional logic is the logic of continuous tnorms (developed in Hajek (1998)). Formulas are built from propositional variables using connectives & (conjunction), → (implication) and truth constant ⊥ (denoting falsity). Negation ¬ φ is defined as φ → ⊥. Given a continuous tnorm * (and hence its residuum ) each evaluation e of propositional variables by truth degrees for [0,1] extends uniquely to the evaluation e_{*}(φ) of each formula φ using * and as truth functions of & and →.
A formula φ is a ttautology or standard BLtautology if e_{*}(φ) = 1 for each evaluation e and each continuous tnorm *. The following ttautologies are taken as axioms of the logic BL:
(A1) (φ→ψ) → ((ψ→χ) → (φ→χ)) (A2) (φ&ψ) → φ (A3) (φ&ψ) → (ψ&φ) (A4) (φ&(φ →ψ)) → (ψ&(ψ →φ)) (A5a) (φ→ (ψ→χ)) → ((φ&ψ) → χ) (A5b) ((φ&ψ) → χ) → (φ→ (ψ→χ)) (A6) ((φ→ψ) →χ) → (((ψ→φ) →χ) →χ) (A7) ⊥ → φ
Modus ponens is the only deduction rule; this gives the usual notion of proof and provability of the logic BL. The standard completeness theorem [Cignoli et al. (2000b)] says that a formula φ is a ttautology iff it is provable in BL. There is a more general semantics of BL, based on algebras called BLalgebras (see Hajek (1998) for definition); each BLalgebra can serve as the algebra of truth functions of BL. The general completeness theorem Hajek (1998) says that a formula φ is provable in BL iff it is a general BLtautology, i.e. a tautology for each (linearly ordered) BLalgebra L.
Basic fuzzy predicate logic has the same formulas as classical predicate logic (they are built from predicates of arbitrary arity using object variables, connectives &, →, truth constant ⊥ and quantifiers , . A standard interpretation is given by a nonempty domain M and for each nary predicate P by a nary fuzzy relation on M, i.e., a mapping assigning to each ntuple of elements of M a truth value from [0,1]  the degree in which the ntuple satisfies the atomic formula P(x_{1}, …,x_{n}). Given a continuous tnorm, this defines uniquely (in Tarski style) the truth degree φ of each closed formula φ given by the interpretation M and tnorm *. (The degree of an universally quantified formula xφ is defined as the infimum of truth degrees of instances of φ; similarly xφ and supremum. See the Glossary at the end of this entry.)
This generalizes in an appropriate manner to a so called safe interpretation over any linearly ordered BLalgebra and definition of the truth value φ _{M,L} given by the Linterpretation M. A formula is a general BLtautology in the predicate logic BL if its truth value is 1 in each safe interpretation.
The following BLtautologies are taken as axioms of BL: (a) axioms of the propositional logic BL, and
(where y is substitutable for x into φ and x is not free in χ).
(1) xφ(x) → φ(y) (1) φ(y) → xφ(x) (2) x(χ→ψ) → (χ → xψ) (2) x(φ→χ) → (xφ → χ) (3) x(φχ) → (xφ χ)
Deduction rules are modus ponens and generalization as in classical logic.
The general completeness theorem says that a formula is provable in the fuzzy predicate logic BL iff it is a general BLtautology (of predicate logic). This generalizes in a natural way to provability in a theory over BL and truth in all models of the theory; see Hajek (1998) for details. But note that standard BLtautologies, i.e. formulas true in all standard interpretations w.r.t. all continuous tnorms are not recursively axiomatizable (see Hajek 2001a), Montagna (2001) for the final result).
They define three corresponding notions of tautology (being true in each evaluation w.r.t. the tnorm  standard Ltautologies, Gtautologies and Πtautologies.) On the level of propositional logic they are completely axiomatized as follows:
L  BL plus the axiom ¬¬φ → φ of double negation, G  BL plus the axiom φ → (φ & φ) of idempotence of conjunction, Π  BL plus the axiom ¬¬φ → ((φ→ (φ&ψ)) → (ψ & ¬¬ψ)).
This is standard completeness; we have also general completeness with respect to BLalgebras satisfying the corresponding additional conditions (making the additional axioms true): they are called MValgebras (for L), Galgebras (for G) and product algebras (for Π) The corresponding predicate logics L, G, Π are extensions of the basic predicate fuzzy logic BL by the just formulated axioms characterizing L,G, Π.
Analogously to BL we have the general completeness theorem for predicate logics: provability = general validity; for G we have also standard completeness, but neither standard Ltautologies nor standard Πtautologies are recursively axiomatizable.
In classical logic, the liar paradox (sentence asserting its own falsity) relies on the fact that no formula can be equivalent to its own negation. In Łukasiewicz logic this is not the case: if φ has the value 0.5 then its negation ¬φ has the same value and is equivalent to φ But one may ask if one can add to (classical) arithmetic a fuzzy truth predicate Tr satisfying, for formulas of this extended language, the disquotation schema
φ ≡ Tr(φ), (where φ denotes the Gödel number of φ)
The answer is “yes and no”: you get a theory which is consistent but has no model expanding the standard natural numbers. This is discussed in Hajek et al. (2000); see also Grim et al. (1992).
The Sorites paradox is related to notions like small, many etc.; considering them to be crisp (twovalued) leads to unnatural consequences. We shall sketch a treatment of the notion “small number” in fuzzy logic. (See Goguen (196869) for a “classic” analysis.) Without going into detail, imagine a theory inside fuzzy predicate calculus (BL or other) containing crisp arithmetic of natural numbers (as above) and an additional predicate Small with the axioms saying that 0 is small (Small(0)), that Small respects ≤, i.e.,
x,y (x≤y → (Small(y) → Small(x))),
and that for all x, the implication Small(x)→Small(x+1) is almost true; finally that there is a non small number, (x)¬Small(x). The “induction” condition can be expressed in various ways, e.g.,
x At(Small(x) → Small(x+1))
where At is an unary connective “almost true”. Its truth function has to satisfy some natural conditions, in particular At(u)→u. You can have At definable, introducing a new propositional constant r that should be interpreted by a truth value near to 1 and defining Atφ to be r→φ, thus the above formula becomes
x(r → (Small(x) → Small(x+1))), or equivalently
x((Small(x) & r) → Small(x+1)).
You see that the theory admits many interpretations (and hence is consistent). All interpretations satisfy in some sense the following: the truth degree of Small(x+1) is only slightly less than (or equal to) the truth degree of Small(x). Thus the paradox can be handled in the frame of fuzzy logic in an axiomatic way, not enforcing any unique semantics. The semantics need not be numerical and the truth values need not be linearly ordered (there are BL algebras whose order is not linear).
Several other notions can be handled similarly; for example the fuzzy notion probably can be axiomatized as a fuzzy modality, having a probability on Boolean formulas, define for each such formula φ a new formula Pφ, read “probably φ”, and define the truth value of Pφ to be the probability of φ. One gets a reasonably elegant bridge between fuzziness and probability, with a simple axiom system over Łukasiewicz logic. See Hajek (1998); for an axiomatization of “very true” see Hajek (2001b).
We mention a few: First, there is Pavelka's logic (Łukasiewicz with rational truth constants; see Pavelka (1979), Novak et al. (2000)); V. Novak systematically develops this logic as a logic with evaluated syntax (working with pairs (formula, truth value)), fuzzy theories (sets of evaluated formulas) and fuzzy modus ponens [from (φ,u), (φ→ψ,v) derive (ψ,u*v) where * is Łukasiewicz tnorm]. Second, several theories in the spirit of the logic BL (BL) described above: logics with an additional involutive negation [Esteva et al. (2000)], a logic putting Łukasiewicz product and Gödel logic together [Esteva et al. (1999), Cintula (2001)], and a logic based on leftcontinuous tnorms, more general than BL [Esteva et al. (2001)].
We briefly comment on socalled fuzzy IFTHEN rules as an example of fuzzy logic in a broad sense. They may be understood as partial imprecise knowledge on some crisp function and have (in the simplest case) the form IF x is A_{i} THEN y is B_{i}. They should not be immediately understood as implications; think of a table relating values of a (dependent) variable y to values of an (independent variable) x:
x A_{1} ... A_{n} y B_{1} ... B_{n}
A_{i}, B_{i} may be crisp (concrete numbers) or fuzzy (small, medium, …) It may be understood in two, in general nonequivalent ways: (1) as a listing of n possibilities, called Mamdani's formula:
MAMD(x,y) ≡ n
i=1(A_{i}(x) & B_{i}(y)).
(where x is A_{1} and y is B_{1} or x is A_{2} and y is B_{2} or …). (2) as a conjunction of implications:
(if x is A_{1} then y is B_{1} and …).
RULES(x,y) ≡ n
i=1(A_{i}(x) → B_{i}(y)).
Both MAMD and RULES define a binary fuzzy relation (given the interpretation of A_{i}'s, B_{i}'s and truth functions of connectives). Now given a fuzzy input A^{*}(x) one can consider the image B^{*} of A^{*}(x) under this relation, i.e.,
B^{*}(y) ≡ x(A(x) & R(x,y)),
where R(x,y) is MAMD(x,y) (most frequent case) or RULES(x,y). Thus one gets an operator assigning to each fuzzy input set A^{*} a corresponding fuzzy output B^{*}. Usually this is combined with some fuzzifications converting a crisp input x_{0} to some fuzzy A^{*}(x) (saying something as "x is similar to x_{0}") and a defuzzification converting the fuzzy image B^{*} to a crisp output y_{0}. Thus one gets a crisp function; its relation to the set of rules may be analyzed. For detailed information on fuzzy control see Driankov et al. (1993). (But be sure not to call minimum "Mamdani implication"  minimum is not an implication at all! For logical analysis, see e.g., Hajek (2000).)
To help the reader not familiar with the basic notions of higher mathematics I comment here on two notions used:
Continuous tnorm. A tnorm is a particular operation x*y with arguments and values in the real unit interval [0,1]. Such an operation is continuous, intuitively speaking, if small changes of the arguments lead only to small changes of the result of the operation. Precisely, for each ε>0 there is a δ>0 such that wherever x_{1}−x_{2}<δ and y_{1}−y_{2}<δ then (x_{1}*y_{1}) − (x_{2}*y_{2})<ε.
Infimum and supremum of a subset of the real unit interval [0,1]. Let A be a set of truth values, hence a subset of [0,1]. A truth value x is a lower bound of A if x≤y for each element y of A; it is the infimum of A if it is the largest lower bound (notation: x = inf(A)). Clearly, if A has a least element then this element is its infimum; but if A has no least element then its infimum is not its element. For example if A is the set of all positive truth values (x>0) then inf(A)=0. Dually, x is an upper bound of A if x≥y for all y in A; the supremum of A is its least upper bound.
Petr Hajek hajek@cs.cas.cz 