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Notes to The Kochen-Specker Theorem


[1] Note that if we understand the ‘expectation’ values deriving from the hidden states as what someone knowing such a state should expect as the average measurement result, then this claim is correct only given an assumption of faithful measurement (FM). FM is another typical assumption of a realist (or noncontextualist HV) interpretation of QM. The KS argument can be given without FM, since it makes claims about possessed values, not measured values. Only in statistical arguments, like von Neumann's and Clifton's, must FM be assumed. We suppress FM in the main text with the exception of Contextuality (see Section 5.3).

[2] See Bell (1966: 4) and Jammer (1974: 274, 304); see also Kochen and Specker (1967: 82/322, theorem 3) for a parallel example and criticism of von Neumann.

[3] Mermin is right insofar as Bell (1966) appeared before Kochen and Specker (1967). However, KS establish even the first step in the argument (two points being assigned different numbers (1 or 0) cannot be arbitrarily close) by an argument differing from Bell's proposal and refer to Specker (1960) which effectively establishes that step as a consequence of Gleason's theorem. So it is probably right to say that Specker and Bell independently saw and exploited that theorem.

[4] For a discussion of the relationship between contextuality and nonlocality, see Mermin (1990a) and Clifton (1993).

[5] See Kochen and Specker (1967: 71-72/310-11).

[6] By elementary vector algebra, viz.: adot productb=|a| |b| cos phi, where adot productb is the inner product of vectors a and b and phi is the angle between them.

[7] Both arguments, i.e., von Neumann's and Clifton's, presuppose faithful measurement (FM) (see also fn 1). Indeed, an eventual failure of FM would be the natural way to explain why a certain constraint on possessed values does not show up in the measurement statistics.

[8] A state of a spin-1 particle where prob(v(Sx2)=0)=1 is |Sx=0>. Expanding this state in the eigenvectors of Sx' yields

cos phi (1 + sin2 phi) -1/2 |Sxmissing text, please inform = 0> + sin phi (1 + sin2 phi) -1/2 (|Sxmissing text, please inform = -1> missing text, please inform |Sxmissing text, please inform = +1>)
Now, with cos phi=1/3, we get:
prob(v(Sxmissing text, please inform2) = 0) = prob(v(Sxmissing text, please inform) = 0)
  = (cos phi)2 / (1 + sin2 phi)
  = 1/9 (1 + 8/9)-1
  = 1/17

[9] See Redhead (1987: 121). See also Kochen and Specker (1967: 64/299, eq. 4) and Fine and Teller (1978: 631) where the principle appears under the name "functional relation condition".

[10] It is not exactly true that the QM formalism prescribes any observable to have a value. In fact, the formalism itself is entirely silent about values, apart from the statistical predictions it entails via the statistical algorithm (see Redhead 1987: 8). But a crucial assumption of orthodox interpretations is the eigenstate-eigenvalue link (see Fine 1973: 20): Observable A on a system has value ak iff the system is in state |ak>. The ’if’ direction of this principle, which leads to a minimum of value ascriptions, is endorsed by modal interpreters (this direction is equivalent to the Eigenvector Rule in Redhead 1987: 73, 120). What they usually deny is the ’only if’ direction, which thereby allows them to attribute values to more observables than allowed by orthodox interpretations.

[11] This is Redhead's (1987: 135-36) construal of a proposal by Fine (1974).

[12] See Fine and Teller (1978: 636), Redhead (1987: 138) and references therein.

[13] What we mean here is the following. A definition of observable f(A) (or observable A + B, or observable Adot productB, both constructed from observables A and B) would be that it is an observable which takes a value calculated by measuring v(A) (or measuring v(A) and v(B)) and applying f to the result (or calculating v(A) + v(B), or calculating v(A) v(B)). FUNC, the Sum Rule and the Product Rule, as restricted to one measurement context, trivially repeat these definitions, and there obviously is no point in testing, e.g., whether v(Adot productB) really equals v(A) v(B), if the former expression is defined by the latter.

[14] It should be noted here that Meyer and Clifton / Kent have quite different intentions. Meyer really criticizes the KS argument against HV as being invalid. Clifton and Kent, however, by presenting HV constructions along Meyer's lines do not mean to bring forth a physically plausible HV theory, but only intend to show that QM statistics for KS-type sets of observables can be simulated by a noncontextual HV model, thus in an entirely classical way.

[15] The proviso ‘in a sense’ comes from the fact that a colourable subset of the set of observables corresponding to all directions in R3, since it is a proper subset of the latter, is not itself continuous in the intuitive sense. We can, however, define a probability function from such a colourable subset into [0, 1] which obeys the usual continuity definition of elementary calculus.

Copyright © 2000
Carsten Held

Notes to The Kochen-Specker Theorem
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy