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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Do justice considerations apply to intergenerational relations, that is, to relations between non-contemporaries? If we follow a broad understanding of justice, this is the case if future or past generations can be viewed as holding legitimate claims or rights against present generations, who in turn stand under correlative duties to future or past generations. One of the legitimate claims of future generations vis-à-vis present generations appears to be a claim of distributive justice: Depending on the understanding of the relevant principles of distributive justice to be applied, if there is an intergenerational conflict of interests, present generations may be obligated by considerations of justice not to pursue policies that create benefits for themselves but impose costs on those who will live in the future.
This entry will focus on two questions: first, whether present generations can be duty-bound because of considerations of justice to past and future people; and second, whether other moral considerations should guide those currently alive in relating to both past and future people. Concerning the first question, the entry will suggest that present generations have duties of justice to future people but not to past people. Concerning the second question, the entry will suggest that present generations also have additional moral duties (duties not grounded in correlative rights) to future people as well as moral duties to past people owing, in part, to the rights these people had while alive.
While we owe to John Rawls the first systematic discussion of obligations to future people (see sec. 3.3), Derek Parfit's work has defined the problems of how we can and should relate to future people. (See esp. sects. 3 and 4)
It may seem that considerations of justice do not apply to intergenerational relations, because there is a lack of reciprocity between generations of people who are not contemporaries. Among non-contemporaries, there is no mutual cooperation and there are no exchanges in kind. This fact about the relations between present and remote past or future generations is closely related to a second feature of intergenerational relations: the permanent asymmetry in power-relation between living people and those who will live in the (remote) future.
First, present generations may be said to exercise power over (remote) future generations when, for example, they create conditions that make it costly for future generations to decide against continuing to pursue present generations' projects. In this way, present generations effectively manipulate the desires and interests of future generations, and can successfully achieve the intended result of having their projects continued. Remote future generations cannot exercise such an influence on presently living people, and in this sense the power-relation between present generations and remote future generations is radically asymmetrical: remote future people do not even have the potential for exercising such power over presently living people. Analogously, presently living people cannot exercise influence over past people.
Second, not only can the present generation influence the conduct of future people by affecting their desires and circumstances, it can also exercise power by harming future generations. It can, for example, pursue a natural-resource policy with long-term negative consequences. In this case, the present generation (knowingly) makes future generations suffer by reducing their range of choices. By contrast, remote future people cannot at all affect the value of the lives of the presently living, at least while the latter are alive. Still, such future people might nevertheless be considered able to harm or wrong present or past persons insofar as the latter have, or had, interests with respect to posthumous future states of affairs. In the same way, the presently living may be morally constrained in their actions that relate to people who lived in the remote past. These power relations are quite different from those among contemporaries, which are relatively fluid and subject to change.
Third, those presently alive can affect the very existence of future people (whether or not future people will exist), the number of future people (how many future people will exist), and the identity of future people (who will exist). A decision taken by present generations could conceivably result in the termination of human life; there is a long tradition of institutionalized population policy whose goal is to control the size of future generations; and, more prosaically, a couple can certainly decide whether or not to have children. Furthermore, many of our decisions have indirect effects on how many people will live and who they are, for many of our decisions affect who meets whom and who decides to have children with whom. To explain such “different people choices”, Parfit adopts the genetic identity view of personal identity: the identity of a person is at least in part constituted by the DNA the person has as a result of which ovum was fertilized by this or that spermatozoon in the creation of this person. Our actions thus have an effect on the genetic identity of future people in so far as they affect from which particular pairs of cells future people will grow -- and any action that affects people's reproductive choices, directly or indirectly, will do that. Many of our actions in fact have an indirect effect on when future people will be conceived. If we decide between two long-term policies regarding use of natural resources, for example, we know that depending on which we choose, different (and most likely also a different number of) future people will come into existence.
By contrast, when we make decisions affecting our contemporaries, we do not face different people choices. Our decisions may affect their existence only with respect to their survival; their number only with respect to how many survive; their identity only in the sense that we might be in a position to change their conditions of life, character, and self-understanding. Of course, we can affect neither the number nor the identity of past generations.
Lastly, our knowledge of the future is limited. While we can know the particular identities of both previously and presently existing people, we are normally not in a position to refer to specifically identifiable future persons. It is not that all predictions about the future decrease in certainty at some constant rate. Indeed, many predictions are more likely to be true concerning the further future than the more immediate future. For example, the prediction that some policy will have changed or that certain resources will have been exhausted is more likely to be true in the further future. Nonetheless, we cannot know the specific identities of persons in the further future.
These differences between our relations to one another and our relations to subsequent or antecedent generations give rise to the following important normative problems. First, if and insofar as the existence, identity, or number of future people depend upon present decisions and actions, to what extent can the former be said to be harmed by the latter? Furthermore, can presently existing persons, in making such decisions, be guided by the interests of future persons? These are the questions that underlie the ‘Non-Identity-Problem&146;. (See sects. 2.3, 2.4, 3.1, 3.2, and 4) Second, given our limited knowledge of people who will live in the future, how should we relate to them under conditions of risk and uncertainty? Third, what motivation could we have for fulfilling our duties to future people, given that we know neither their individual identities nor their particular preferences? Fourth, is it possible for us to harm past people, and do we have duties toward them? (See sec. 5)
In discussing these questions, we will presuppose a person-affecting view of ethics, which holds that the moral quality of an action has to be assessed on the basis of how it affects the interests of persons (or, say, sentient beings). This is a claim about what are the units of moral concern. In the context of intergenerational justice, the person-affecting view has the implication that only the rights and interests of actually existing persons are to be regarded as morally relevant. Those people who actually exist at some time count; potentially existing people do not count. The person-affecting view stands in contrast to an impersonal view according to which the value of states of affairs is not reducible to their effect on the interests of actual people. The differences between these positions will come to the fore in sec. 2.4 on procreational duties.
On a person-affecting view, future people count if, and insofar as, they have interests, just claims, or rights vis-à-vis us. Some philosophers deny that this can ever be the case. At least two arguments for this view need to be distinguished: the first argument is based simply on the fact that future people will live in the future; the second argument is based on the contingency of future people upon our decisions -- on the fact that the existence, number, and identity of future people depend upon our decisions. In the following two sections, we will examine these positions.
First, some philosophers have denied that future people can have rights (or just claims), based simply on the fact that they will live in the future. Consider the following claim: “Future generations by definition do not exist now. They cannot now, therefore, be the present bearer or subject of anything, including rights.” Claiming that we can violate future people's rights now does not, however, imply that future people have rights now. That implication would hold only if it were conceded that presently existing rights alone constrain present action. But we can safely assume, first, that future people will be bearers of rights in the future, second, that the rights they have will be determined by the interests they have then, and third, that our present actions and policies can affect their interests. If we can violate a person's right by harming her interests, and if we can adversely affect future people's interests, we can violate their future rights. Their future existence itself is thus insufficient to ground the claim that we cannot now violate the rights of future persons.
The contingency of future people's existence upon our decisions has also fueled doubts about whether they can be said to have any rights whatsoever that ground corresponding duties owed by us. As we have seen, the very existence of future people and their identities (as well as their number) can depend upon our decisions. Indeed, it is not only long-term policy choices that have these effects on the composition of the future human population. Rather, most, if not all, present actions have some effect on the identity and number of future people. In this section (and in sec. 2.4) we will consider the moral significance of that fact.
First, it is worth pointing out that there are, plausibly, at least some future persons whose existence and identity is altogether independent of our actions (although this claim may, admittedly, be implausible in the case of public policy choices). For example, somebody now set a booby-trap that would cause harm to some future persons. Performing the action may harm the bodily integrity of future people who will live quite independently of his having performed the action and thus the contingency of future persons existence on present actions can in no way exempt this particular action from moral condemnation.
Second, we are not committed to the claim that if we are able now to violate the rights of future generations, it is their rights to existence that we violate. Since it is implausible that anyone has a right to existence as such, it is implausible that future persons have rights to existence. Furthermore, when we prevent someone's existence, we do not thereby harm the hypothetical interests of this potential subject. Thus, claiming that actual future people have rights vis-à-vis us now cannot commit us to claiming that possible future people have a right to existence.
Are our present actions nonetheless constrained by rights of future generations that are based on interests other than existence as such, interests such as subsistence, etc.? This is possible only if attributing rights to people does not require us to make reference to individual persons. When we consider which natural-resource policy they ought to adopt, we cannot possibly be guided by obligations to concrete (genetically identifiable) people living in the (remote) future. From this fact, however, it does not follow that we have no obligations to future people. All that follows is that such obligations do not depend on the particular identity of future persons. Rather, such obligations would be grounded in the fact that future persons are human beings; that is, they share those properties of being human that permit and require us to relate morally to them as fellow humans. In evaluating a natural-resource policy, we can safely assume that future people will exist to whom we owe obligations as human beings -- for example, the obligation to protect their interests in having the means of subsistence. We may also be able to predict with some accuracy the effects of our present actions on future generations' means of subsistence. Thus, if we decide to deplete rather than conserve resources, this will in all likelihood increase the chances that people do not have the means of subsistence; if there are rights to subsistence based on humanity alone, then, those people who will exist under our policies of depletion are more likely than those who will exist under our policies of conservation to have such rights violated. This would be a rights-based consideration for not choosing a policy of depletion. As will be shown in sec. 3, the claim that rights considerations can guide us in choosing among policies or actions that have an impact on the composition of the future human population relies upon an interpretation of harm that does not depend upon a comparison of the state of the supposedly harmed person to a counterfactual state of this person had the harmful action not occurred.
Can prospective children be said to have an interest that their parents not act in a way likely to lead to their birth when the parents are in a position to know that the life of the child, should it be born, would fall below the decency threshold? It is a widely held belief that under certain circumstances prospective parents should refrain from procreating owing to the predicted plight of the would-be child.
Since the publication of Narveson's seminal paper “Utilitarianism and New Generations” many have contributed to the debate on whether a person-affecting approach can account for the asymmetry of our procreational duties. The claimed asymmetry is the following: while prospective parents have no obligation to procreate out of regard for the interests of possible future children, they have an obligation not to beget children who are going to be miserable.
Some have argued that belief in such an asymmetry is incompatible with a person-affecting view and, more particularly, with the claim that possible people cannot be said to have, against us, a right to existence. It is helpful at this point to make a distinction between the reasoning of potential parents that involves a possible future child and reasoning that involves their future child. For instance, in deciding not to procreate at all people do not thereby harm the children they could have brought into existence (see sec. 2.2) since such are merely possible individuals. Thus, much reasoning about whether or not to have a child should concern the interests of those already alive; it is actual people's lives that would be affected by whether or not the child comes into existence. Nonetheless, people might make choices about procreation based on the welfare of their future child; that is, the welfare of that as yet non-existent individual would feature in their reasoning. When prospective parents decide in favor of having a child and now learn that this child, if born, would have a life that falls below the decency threshold they might reason in this sort of way -- considering the effects of their actions on their child -- and decide not to have a child after all.
Objections to the asymmetry view presented above concern, in particular, the claim that after having made a decision to have children, prospective parents should revise their decision out of regard for their would-be child(ren) when they learn that the prospective child(ren) would have a life that falls below the decency threshold. Why, under these circumstances, should parents revise their decision to have children out of regard for the children? The reason is that they would harm the would-be child, and, thus, arguably, would act wrongly towards it. To inflict a wrong on someone is to harm that person. When prospective parents learn that their child would have a life that falls below the decency threshold, they should refrain from having it, for by bringing the child into existence they would cause harm to it. In bringing about a child's existence we can harm this child.
This claim has been said to be incompatible with a person-affecting view. In the following sec. 3, two ways of understanding harm will be distinguished. The first relies on comparing a person's actual state to a counterfactual (or historical) state of the same person. The second relies on no such comparison. Both understandings of harm require us to ask: for whom is the action worse? However, while both are person-affecting in the second sense specified above (sec. 1), only the first fulfills the stronger conditions of Parfit's “two-state requirement” or “better-or-worse-for-the-same-person” requirement: “we benefit or harm someone only if we cause him to be better off than he would otherwise at that time have been”. As will be shown in sec. 3.2 below, in applying the second understanding, we do not have to compare the value of life below the decency threshold with nonexistence in order to be able to claim that we can cause harm to a person by bringing about that person's existence.
Let us note that one can also defend the asymmetry of our procreational duties from an impersonal view, according to which the value of states of affairs is not reducible to how these states affect the interests of people. From an impersonal view one does not have to claim that prospective parents should refrain from procreation out of regard for the children they would have. Based on this view, two alternative interpretations of the asymmetry of our procreational duties have been discussed in the literature. One could adopt a version of negative consequentialism and argue that the universe would be better if present generations were guided by a criterion of right action that requires them to give priority to the prevention of suffering over the creation of good and happiness. Alternatively, an impersonal approach could argue that we have a prima facie duty to promote over-all happiness by creating new well-off people -- which duty, however, may be more easily overridden than duties not to cause harm. The paradoxical implications of the latter view have been prominently explored by Derek Parfit.
Both claims thus far defended -- namely that rights considerations can guide us in choosing among long-term policies and that such considerations can guide prospective parents in deciding whether they should revise their decision to conceive out of regard for the children they would otherwise have -- rely upon an interpretation of harm that requires a subjunctive comparison with a decency threshold as its baseline (hereinafter, subjunctive-threshold interpretation).
Consider the first claim. The contingency of the number of future people upon our decisions, and their specific identity, do not matter when we potentially harm future people's interests and violate their rights. We know, of course, that when such instances of harm occur, specific people are harmed. But the decision we take counts as a necessary condition of the very existence of this genetically and numerically specific set of people at some future point in time. A subjunctive-threshold interpretation of harm, as suggested by the discussion in sec. 2.3, can be expressed in the following formula:
(I) (subjunctive-threshold) An action (or inaction) at time t1 harms someone only if the agent thereby causes (allows) this person's life to fall below some specified threshold.
This interpretation of harm differs from both a diachronic interpretation of harm and an interpretation that requires a subjunctive comparison with a historical baseline (hereinafter subjunctive-historical interpretation of harm). Both the diachronic and the subjunctive-historical interpretations of harm require that the existence of the harmed person or people qua individuals is independent of the harming act or policy. The diachronic interpretation of harm can be expressed in the following formula:
(II) (diachronic) An action (or inaction) at time t1 harms someone only if the agent causes (allows) this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person was before t1.
The subjunctive-historical interpretation of harm can be expressed in the following formula:
(III) (subjunctive-historical) An action (or inaction) at time t1 harms someone only if the agent causes (allows) this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person would have been at t2 had the agent not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all.
When considering future individuals as possible individuals both the diachronic and the subjunctive-historical interpretations of harm will exclude the possibility of our people harming future people, for the (future) people whose interests and rights they are required to respect are not in a particular state of well-being at the time they take their decision -- they do not, at that time, exist. But according to (II) unless we can claim that the person is in a particular state of well-being at the time of our decision, that is, at t1, we cannot say that the person is worse off at t2 owing to our decision at t1. And likewise with (III): unless we can claim that there is a specific person who would have been better off at t2 than this person would have been at t2 had we not acted with respect to this person at all, this notion of harm makes no sense.
Adopting either the diachronic or the subjunctive-historical interpretations of harm excludes the possibility of our harming future people when we choose among long-term policies with significantly differing consequences for the quality of life of future people. But if we adopt the subjunctive-threshold reading of harm at (I), future people can be said to be wronged by our choice of a policy that harms them, notwithstanding the fact that the existence of the specific people who are said to be harmed is causally dependent on our decision to pursue this policy.
Choosing among these three notions of harm as distinguished above (sec. 3.1) is also crucial for understanding the second claim at issue: Considerations based upon the rights of future people can guide prospective parents in deciding whether they should revise their decision to conceive out of regard for the children they would otherwise have. Our choice may be helped by investigating what each these notions of harm presupposes when they are used to explicate the claim that by bringing about the existence of a child we can cause harm to this child. Consider the following claims:
(a) A living person can be worse off than that person was before she was conceived.
(b) Any life lived by a human being is commensurable with non-existence.
(c) We can say of a person that she did not exist before her conception.
(d) We can lay out a general standard of well-being so that we violate a duty to a person when we cause this person to fall below the standard specified, or when we fail to cause this person to reach the standard.
In shorthand form, the situation is this: Depending on which notion of harm is used, the claim that parents have harmed their child by bringing it into existence presupposes a different set of assumptions ((a)-(d)): as explained below, notion (II) commits us to (a), (b), (c); notion (III) commits us to (b) and (c); and notion (I) commits us to (c) and (d). Propositions (a) and (b) will be shown to be, at very least, improbable. Given that it is only the first notion of harm that, when applied to procreative decisions, does not presuppose either (a) or (b), this notion seems more apt for explicating the claim that we can cause harm to a child by bringing about the existence of this child.
All three notions presuppose assumption (c). Claiming that a person harms another person by bringing about this person's existence presupposes that bringing about someone's existence is something that happens to this person at the time the person comes into existence. (See also sec. 5.3)
When used to explicate the claim that we (can) cause harm to a person by bringing that person into existence, (II) presupposes assumption (a). But attributing a state of well-being to an egg cell before its fertilization by a sperm does not seem to make sense. In this case, however, (II) is inapplicable in the context in question.
(III) presupposes (b). In claiming that, by bringing about a person's existence, we thereby cause that person to be worse off than he or she would otherwise have been at that time -- if , that is, the person had never come into existence -- we are relying on the possibility of making an intrapersonal comparison between the values of nonexistence (in the sense of “never existing”) and a person's life. However, as David Heyd has pointed out: “the comparison between life and nonexistence is blocked by two considerations: the valuelessness of nonexistence as such and the unattributability of its alleged value to individual subjects. The two considerations are intimately connected: one of the reasons for denying value to nonexistence of people is the very fact that it cannot be attached to people.” While a person can retrospectively prefer not to have been brought into existence, it does not follow that this person would have been better off had it never been brought into existence. To be sure, as we noted above, we can attribute to an existing person the state “nonexistence before conception” just as we can attribute the state of “having ceased to exist” to this person. This does not mean, however, that never existing at all is of (dis)value for that person.
In this respect, death seems to be different from never existing at all. Life can be understood as an ongoing project that consists of more particular projects that are defined in part by goals and whose completion requires time. If a person's life is cut short, this can be contrary to this person's interests. Through death, the person is hindered from bringing his or her projects to fruition. As far as carrying out these projects is concerned, there may not be anyone else in a position to take this person's place. Saying this does not require us to compare the value of the state of being dead to the value of continuing to exist for the person. Rather the “question is whether had one not died, had one lived longer, one's survival would have been good for one.” On the other hand, the fact that my pursuing certain projects makes my life worth living for me does not mean that it would necessarily have been undesirable for me not to have ever been given the chance to form the idea of any meaningful projects, namely, by having never been brought into existence at all. “Never existing” is of (dis)value for no one.
Harm (I) relies on the idea that we have a general duty to people not to cause them to be worse off than they should be. We can cause -- by our actions and omissions -- a person to be worse off than that person is entitled to be. This notion of harm relies on, inter alia, our being able to specify a standard of what any person is entitled to (d). In claiming that people should refrain from having children out of regard for the children, when the children can be expected to have a life that falls below the decency threshold (see sec. 2.5), we rely on our being able to define what it means to fall below the decency threshold and to judge when lives do so fall. If we make these assumptions, we can then use this notion of harm to explicate the claim “by bringing a person into existence we can cause harm to this person” without having to confront the peculiar ethical difficulties discussed in the previous paragraphs. In applying this notion of harm, we compare the values of “having a decent life” and “having a life that falls below the decency threshold”. Comparing these values does not present special difficulties either intrapersonally or interpersonally.
Harming a person by bringing about his existence is clearly a special case. When applied to this case, same-person-comparative notions of harm (of which II and III are species) presuppose one or both of (a) and (b), which were found to be mistaken. Now, at the time prospective parents consider whether they should revise their decision to bring about the existence of a child, there is no right bearer of the right to non-existence. But according to (III) this does not mean that the parents could not act in light of an interest on the part of their would-be child in never existing at all: if the child were to be born, it would have a life that falls below the decency threshold; thus, the parents ought not to conceive the child.
In the circumstances in which bringing about the existence of a person causes harm to this person in the sense specified, the right to non-existence is violated when, quite simply, the existence of the person is brought about. The only way, here, in which the prospective parents can avoid violation of the right is by ensuring that the person whose right it would be does not come into existence at all. Thus, the only way in which the prospective parents can respect the right is by excluding the possibility that the right ever becomes actual. To be sure, we will still have to specify a standard for judging both the adoption of a long-term policy as wrong owing to its likely consequences for future people and the bringing into existence of a person as wrong owing to the plight of the would-be child. The subjunctive-threshold interpretation of harm presupposes our being able to lay out a standard of well-being in such a way that we violate a person's right when we cause this person to fall below the standard specified. Such a standard can specify what is called a sufficientarian threshold defined in terms of absolute, noncomparative conditions. Then those currently alive harm future people by causing them to fall below this threshold. One could hold a unitary view of the threshold according to which one and the same threshold would be applicable to all decisions. Alternatively, the relevant threshold could reflect the knowledge present generations have with regard to future generations who are contingent upon their decisions in other respects. Even if we held that the same list of rights were attributable to all people (wherever and whenever they live), what these rights amount to will reflect contemporary social, economic and cultural conditions. We are not currently in a position to predict the specific circumstances under which future people will live. (See sec. 2) Accordingly, we cannot specify the duties under which present persons stand with much precision.
It is important to note that the standard by which we specify a subjunctive-threshold notion of harm can include egalitarian elements in at least two ways. We might hold that the standing of people relative to their contemporaries is (extrinsically or intrinsically) important and that the threshold notion of harm should reflect, say, the average level of well-being that people realize -- or that future people will realize: the higher the average level of well-being the higher the threshold level of harm should be set. According to one interpretation of such an egalitarian reading, presently existing people harm future people by causing them to realize a (much) lower level of well-being than their own contemporaries. We might also hold the threshold level should reflect, say, the average level of well-being of the present generations upon whose decisions the existence, identity, and well-being of future people depend. According to such an interpretation presently existing people harm future people by causing them to realize a (much) lower level of well-being than they enjoy themselves.
Harm (I) does not support the claim that if a possible person were to have a decent life, but a different person could instead be brought into existence who would have an even better life, there is an obligation to bring into existence the second, rather than the first, child; nor does (I) support the analogous claim on the level of collective decision-making: present generations have no obligation to bring into existence only those whose lives, among possible future persons, would be optimal.
To illustrate this, consider the following example: A woman knows that if she conceives a baby now, because of a particular disease she has the child will have a particular slight handicap, but will enjoy a life above the decency threshold, however specified. Fortunately, there is a treatment against this disease that is such that, afterwards, the woman will be able to conceive a perfectly healthy child. The treatment takes three months. There is, thus, no way this particular child can be born without having this handicap. Can the woman be said to owe it to her child to postpone conceiving a child until after she has been treated for the disease? According to the view outlined here, she cannot be said to owe this to her child so that she will not harm the child. She might have good reasons to receive the medical treatment and conceive later, however. These reasons will reflect the interests of her and her partner, as well as the interests of other present and future people. (See sec. 2.4) Such interests could be important enough to give rise to an obligation on the part of the parents. Then we can have obligations not to bring into existence persons whose lives, although still above the decency threshold, are less worth living than the lives of others we could bring into existence in different circumstances, but these obligations are not grounded on considerations of harm to the future children in question.
To support the claim that parents do owe it to their prospective child to bring into existence the possible child who, among the options available to them, enjoys the highest level of well-being, we will have to rely on a different notion of harm -- namely a notion of harm which is based upon the comparison of the state of a person to the counterfactual state of another person who could have brought into existence instead of the him:
(IV) (subjunctive-different-person) Having brought about a person's existence at a time t1, the agent thereby harms someone only if the agent causes this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than another person -- whose existence the agent could have brought about instead -- would have been at t2 had the agent acted differently.
Prospective parents might bring about more or less people (one child, twins, triplets etc.) depending upon their decisions. Decisions concerning long-term policies are likely to have an impact on the size of the future population. (See sec. 2) Thus at least when we wish to support a claim analogous to (IV) at the collective level, we will have to allow for different numbers also:
(V) (subjunctive-different-persons) Having brought about a person's existence at a time t1, the agent thereby harms someone only if the agent causes this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than other persons -- whose existence the agent could have brought about instead -- would have been at t2 had the agent acted differently.
If we follow the subjunctive-different-persons) interpretation of harm, a person whose quality of life is above the threshold of decency will be considered harmed if there is a possible state of affairs in which this person would not have existed but another person or other persons would have existed and the latter person or persons would have realized an even higher quality of life. But according to the person-affecting approach and from the perspective of the allegedly harmed person the comparison of the life of this person and the counterfactual state of affairs in which this person could never have existed but another person or other persons would exist does not make sense. We cannot attribute the alleged value of non-existence to individual subjects.
In summary: It is at the very least difficult (if not impossible) to understand why a person should be considered harmed if the person can be considered harmed according to neither the subjunctive-historical (III) nor the diachronic (II) nor the subjunctive-threshold (I) interpretations of harm. This is not to say that we cannot have person-affecting reasons to prefer a future of people who have lives far above the decency threshold to a future of people whose lives are less good but decent, points to which we shall return. (See sec. 3.4)
We owe to John Rawls the first systematic discussion of obligations to future people. Rawls proposes a principle of “just savings”. Though Rawls never discusses the non-identity problem, his principle of just savings can be understood to be compatible with a subjunctive-threshold understanding of the relevant notion of harm in different number choices -- or so it is suggested below. Rawls distinguishes two stages of societal development for the application of his principle of just savings. People have a (distributive) justice-based reason to save for future people only if such saving will “make possible the conditions needed to establish and to preserve a just basic structure over time.” (This is known as the accumulation stage.) Once just institutions are established, justice does not require people to save for future people. Rather they should do what is necessary to allow future people to continue to live under just institutions and they should leave their descendants at least the equivalent of what they received from the previous generation. (This is known as the steady-state stage.)
As is characteristic of Rawls's work, he presents the just savings principle as the outcome of a decision reached in the contractualist (hypothetical and non-historical) decision-situation of the original position. Who are the persons in the original position? Rawls considers an original position in which every generation is represented. However, as the relations between the contractors so conceived are not characterized by the “circumstances of justice”, the question of justice as Rawls understands it does not arise: We cannot cooperate with previous generations and, while previous generations can benefit or harm us, we cannot benefit or harm them. (See Sec. 1) Instead Rawls therefore adjusts the (present-time of entry) interpretation of the original position for the intergenerational context. The contractors know that they belong to one generation, but the veil of ignorance blinds them to which particular generation they belong. From this position they determine a just savings rate.
While the circumstances of justice clearly hold among contemporaries, the contractors cannot know whether previous generations have saved for them. Why then should they agree to save for future generations? In A Theory of Justice, Rawls stipulates “a motivational assumption” according to which the contractors care for their descendants so that they will want to agree to save for their successors -- irrespective of whether previous generations saved for them. In Political Liberalism, Rawls withdraws this motivational assumption. He now understands previous generations' non-compliance with a just savings principle as a problem of non-ideal theory. The original position, however, belongs to ideal theory: strict compliance with whatever principles are agreed on is assumed. Rawls introduces problems of partial and non-compliance only at the level of non-ideal theory. In accordance with this understanding of ideal theory, Rawls assumes that the generations are mutually disinterested. He takes the contractors to agree to a savings principle “subject to the further condition that they must want all previous generations to have followed it.” Rawls continues: “Thus the correct principle is that which the members of any generation (and so all generations) would adopt as the one their generation is to follow and as the principle they would want preceding generations to have followed (and later generations to follow), no matter how far back (or forward) in time.”  The principle of just savings thus agreed on is thought to be binding for all previous and future generations.
It has been suggested (sects. 3.1-2) that the fact that future persons' existence is contingent on our present decisions does not matter where what is in question is our ability to harm future people's interests and to violate their rights. By employing a non-comparative interpretation of harm one can justify the present generation's duties not to violate the rights of future generations against being harmed. Thus, rights-based considerations may not bear merely upon “same people choices”, but will bear also upon both types of “different people choices” that Parfit distinguishes, namely “same number choices” (in which the same number of future people live, irrespective of present choices) and “different number choices” (in which a different number of future people will live depending on which choices we now make). If we assume that future people have general (human) rights vis-a-vis us, our correlative duties set a normative framework for most of our decisions concerning future people.
However, such a framework does not provide a complete moral theory of intergenerational relations. There are concerns for future people shared by many of us that cannot be accounted for by rights-based considerations: many of us believe that future people should have a life that is well above the level of well-being specified by a subjunctive-threshold notion of harm or that they share a particular way of life. But, presumably, we do not violate their rights by failing to provide this. Also, many of us believe that it is important that there be future people at all. However, we cannot prefer a future with people all of whom have lives far above the level of decency to a future with no people on the basis of considerations of rights of future people. Possible people have no right to be brought into existence (and we do not have the correlative obligation to procreate). (See sec. 2.2) It has been suggested that the widely shared concerns about the continuation of human life on earth at a high level of well-being can, at least in part, be accounted for by an obligation towards future people that is based on no rights of future people. This obligation can be described along the following lines: those currently alive owe respect to highly valuable goods that their predecessors bequeathed to them as well as to more remote future people, and they also owe respect to the highly valuable future-oriented projects of their contemporaries. Owing such respect gives rise to a general obligation, namely that they do not willfully destroy the inherited goods and the conditions that are constitutive of persons' pursuit of future-oriented projects. In other words, such respect gives rise to a general obligation that one not willfully destroy the social practices on which the possibility of people pursuing future-oriented projects depends. While future people belong to the beneficiaries, the obligation is owed to both present and past people. (See also sec. 5)
The following set of objections is meant to show that the subjunctive-threshold interpretation of harm is both over- and under-inclusive. On the one hand, the interpretation is said to assess acts as objectionably harmful that seem clearly not to be so. On the other hand, it does not seem to allow us to count acts as harmful that most of us would firmly describe as such. In response, we will initially consider the subjunctive-threshold interpretation of harm as the only sound interpretation of harm. We will then propose and discuss an understanding of harm that combines the subjunctive-threshold and subjunctive-historical interpretations of harm. While the combined view of harm will be shown not to be open to the objections discussed in this section, this understanding of harm raises difficult questions of interpretation of its own. We will consider then whether the combined view of harm is compatible with what Parfit has called the “no-difference view”.
The first of these objections notes that I could be in a position such that whatever I do at t1, I will harm a person by causing or allowing this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person should then be. For example, a physician might face a situation in which he either allows a patient to die of natural causes or he intervenes, thereby improving the patient's condition, but still leaving him below the threshold since the intervention requires, say, a disfiguring medical procedure.
The idea that, in such a situation, I inevitably violate a person's right not to be harmed is counterintuitive and clearly mistaken. In the situation as described, the physician cannot prevent his patient from falling below the threshold. In such a situation to attribute to the physician the obligation of not causing such harm violates the minimal requirement of “‘ought’ implies ‘can’”: it does not make sense to require people to do what is impossible. In a situation in which we cannot prevent other people from falling below the threshold we must choose that course of action that results in people falling least far below the threshold. As the subjunctive-threshold notion of harm at (I) does not imply this, we need to amend it to state that people ought to minimize harm.
In the context of decision-making related to procreation, however, we appear to face a situation in which we may not be able to appeal to such a “minimization of harm” principle. By refraining from procreation, we do not harm anybody. Then we cannot so clearly justify our decision on the basis that the person we bring into existence is better, or at least as well off, as the other possible people whom we could have brought into existence (sec. 3.2). However, the duty to minimize (subjunctive-threshold) harm can be relevant in “different people” and “different number” choices (sec. 3.1) When we face such a situation we might well be in a position in which we can neither hinder the existence of future persons nor prevent them from falling below the threshold. We are then under the duty to minimize the subjunctive-threshold harm to “these” people.
Let us now turn to the second objection: the threshold conception of harm is under-inclusive in interpreting which acts we consider harmful. Again, we will have to appeal to an obligation to minimize harm in interpreting cases that present clear cases of harm. Consider the person who is living a life below the threshold as specified and nothing anybody can do will improve the person's life such that he has a life with well-being above the threshold. If, under these circumstances, someone acts in a way that diminishes the well-being of such a person to an even lower level, this act cannot be described according to the reading of harm at (I) as causing harm to the person. This, however, seems to be strongly counterintuitive. For example, we clearly harm a person who is severely handicapped by causing pain to him. By appealing to an obligation to minimize harm to other persons, we can argue that we are forbidden to cause another person to fall to an even lower level of well-being as measured by the specified threshold.
In a second type of case, consider the person who lives above the threshold as specified. We can act in a way that diminishes the well-being of the person, but to a level still above the threshold. For example, someone breaks into the garage of a mansion and steals the new convertible while the wealthy owner is at his penthouse in the city. This theft is not likely to cause the wealthy person's well-being to fall below any plausibly construed threshold of harm, and thus according to (I) does not harm him. This seems implausible. Again, we must appeal to an obligation of minimizing harm to other persons. The obligation requires that we not cause another person to fall to a lower level of well-being quite independently of the level of well-being the person already realizes. What counts as a lower level of well-being can be measured by the specified threshold.
In defending the subjunctive-threshold reading of harm at (I) against the above objections, we have assumed that we should interpret this reading of harm as specifying a necessary condition for harming someone (and the subjunctive-historical reading at (III) as specifying neither necessary nor sufficient conditions). In defending this exclusive view of what it means to harm someone, we introduced, first, the idea that we have an obligation to minimize harm where we have an obligation to avoid doing harm, and, second, in response to objection one, the notion that if in certain situations you cannot prevent a person from suffering (subjunctive-threshold) harm you do not thereby fail in your duties towards them so long as harm is minimized.
These points might be satisfactory replies to the objections as stated. However, what has been called the combined view makes it possible for us to avoid the problem of the underinclusiveness of the subjunctive-threshold reading of harm as exemplified by objection two. The proposal is this: instead of interpreting readings of harm at (I) and (III) as providing alternative necessary conditions for harming, we can understand the readings at (I) and (III) as sufficient conditions; the necessary condition for harming is then the disjunction of the conditions for harming as set out by the readings at (I) and (III). This is the combined view (CV) of what it means to harm someone:
(CV) An action (or inaction) at time t1 harms someone only if either (I) the agent thereby causes (allows) this person's life to fall below some specified standard, and, if the agent cannot avoid causing harm in this sense, does not minimize the harm; or (III) the agent causes this person to be worse off at some later time t2 than the person would have been at t2 had the agent not interacted with this person at all.
We ought clearly to prefer the combined view to the exclusive subjunctive-historical view according to which the subjunctive-historical reading of harm specifies necessary conditions of harm (and the subjunctive-threshold reading at (I) specifies neither necessary nor sufficient conditions). The combined view is compatible with the thesis of this entry that relies upon our employing a subjunctive-threshold interpretation of harm where the subjunctive-historical and the diachronic notions do not apply. Ought we to prefer the combined view to the exclusive subjunctive-threshold view according to which the subjunctive-threshold interpretation of harm specifies the necessary and sufficient conditions of harm? Assuming that our response to the first objection is satisfactory with respect to those cases to which the subjunctive-historical notion of harm is inapplicable (that is to “different people” and “different number” choices), the advantage of the combined view is that this understanding of harm allows us to rely on the subjunctive-historical interpretation of harm whenever it is applicable, that is, when we will harm an existent person. In these cases the notion of harm at (III) provides us with a straightforward interpretation of the harm caused. We will not have to appeal to the duty to minimize harm. Objections one and two present cases in which the affected person is clearly harmed -- namely when we will harm somebody according to the subjunctive-historical reading at (III).
However, this combined view of harm raises difficult questions of interpretation of its own. In the next section we consider whether the combined view is compatible with what Parfit has called the “no-difference view”.
The exclusive subjunctive-threshold view of harm is compatible with Parfit's no-difference view, which, on one understanding, states that it makes no moral difference to how we should act, all things considered, whether the size and composition of future generations depend upon our present decision. Parfit illustrates this view by considering two medical programs. In each case a certain rare condition can be passed from mother to child. One involves pregnancy testing. If the test comes out positive, fetuses are treated for the rare condition. The other involves preconception testing. The women who test positive as carriers of the rare condition are told to postpone conception for at least two months and to undergo (harmless) treatment after which the condition will have disappeared. Available funds can be spent on one or the other program, and the other must be cancelled. Assuming that both programs have equivalent effects on parents, that the conditions lead to the same particular handicap in children, and that the two programs will achieve a similar success rate, the programs differ only in affecting actual people (pregnancy testing) or possible people (preconception testing). (See sec. 2.5) The (practical) no-difference view says: our reason to prevent harm to possible future people (those who might be conceived) is as strong as our reason to prevent harm to actual people (those already conceived who will develop from the already existing fetuses in due course). The two medical programs in Parfit's example are equally worthy and it makes no moral difference which is cancelled.
Is the combined view of harm compatible with the no-difference view, thus understood? Here we cannot discuss the implications of the combined view in any detail. We might first observe that both the subjunctive-historical and subjunctive-threshold readings of harm can be employed to interpret many core cases of harm. That is to say, both sets of conditions as specified by the two readings of harm will arguably be satisfied in many cases where most people agree that harm was caused -- at least under plausible construals of both readings of harm. Second, in the cases in which not all sets of conditions obtain, we still find that harm was caused, namely, as long as at least one set of conditions obtains. If the subjunctive-threshold reading of harm applies, we find that harm was caused. The combined view entails that canceling either test causes harm.
However, the combined view does not entail that it makes no moral difference which test we cancel. A plausible interpretation of the combined view might be the following: satisfying either set of the conditions provides a reason for objecting to the proposed action; if both sets of conditions obtain, the objection is presumably stronger than when only one set of conditions obtains. According to this understanding of the combined view and assuming that in Parfit's example of the two medical programs the children, if either they or their mothers are not treated, will suffer a severe handicap, the objection to canceling pregnancy testing is stronger than the objection to canceling the preconception testing program. Because the handicap is severe, the children will fall below the threshold and the subjunctive-threshold notion of harm provides the same reason for objecting to canceling either program. But if pregnancy testing is cancelled this will be worse for the children who are not treated -- the subjunctive-historical notion of harm applies. The subjunctive-historical notion does not, however, provide a reason for objecting to cancellation of preconception testing. The children who will be born handicapped would never have existed if there had been testing prior to conception. This understanding of the combined view may not, then, be compatible with the no-difference view. An alternative reading would deny that where both notions of harm are applicable this strengthens the objection to the harmful act.
The exclusive subjunctive-threshold view of harm is also compatible with a second and stronger reading of the no-difference view: there is no theoretical difference in harming possible future people and harming actual people since the very same reasons hold against harming either group. The combined view is clearly incompatible with the theoretical interpretation of the no-difference view. According to the combined view it would often not be true that the same reasons hold against harming either such group. When we object to the harming of actual people we will often have additional reasons that reflect the fact that the subjunctive-historical readings of harm apply. 
However, the view as presented in the previous sections is compatible with the combined view of harm and does not depend upon either version of the no-difference view. Present generations have obligations not to violate the rights of future people against being harmed even if -- as the combined view implies -- the reasons offered as to why harming possible future people is objectionable are different from (and possibly less weighty than) the reasons for objecting to acts that cause harm to actual people.
Let us now turn to the question of whether present generations can be said to have just claims to compensation owing to the fact that their predecessors were badly wronged. For example, do African Americans, whose ancestors were subjected to the terrible injustices of being kidnapped in Africa and subsequently enslaved, have a just claim to compensation? Let us set aside a host of specifically legal questions concerning, for example, the statute of limitations and liability. Let us also assume that it is sometimes possible to identify with certainty direct descendants of slaves. Consider the case of Robert, who has been identified as one such.
People can claim compensation for harms they suffered. As a descendant of slaves, has Robert been harmed owing to the injustices suffered by his ancestors? First, consider briefly the subjunctive-historical reading of harm at (III). (See sec. 3.1) According to this interpretation of harm, a person is fully compensated for an act or policy (or event) when she is as well off as she would have been had the act not been carried out. According to this interpretation of harm, it is not the case that Robert has been harmed, because if his ancestors had not been kidnapped and enslaved, Robert would not exist today. His existence depends on the fact that the genealogical chain was not broken at any point. Thus, we cannot infer from this interpretation of harm and compensation that Robert has been harmed and should be compensated; the state of affairs required for such implies the nonexistence of the claimant to compensation.
Secondly, we might consider the subjunctive-threshold reading of harm at (I). According to this interpretation of harm, a person is fully compensated for an act or policy (or event) if that person does not fall below the specified standard. According to this interpretation, Robert can be harmed because his ancestors were kidnapped and enslaved. Whether Robert has been harmed due to the way his ancestors were treated depends upon whether the way they were treated has led to Robert's falling below the standard of well-being specified. Employing this interpretation of harm and its accompanying interpretation of compensation requires a forward-looking assessment of what we ought to do today. Based on such a subjunctive-threshold interpretation of harm, the current normative relevance of past wrongs will depend upon their causal relevance for the well-being of present (and future) generations. Fulfilling our duties to the latter might well require compensation for the consequences that stem from the fact that their predecessors have been badly wronged. That their predecessors were wronged, however, does not in itself give rise to just claims of compensation on the part of their descendants today.
Thus in accordance with the combined view (CV) as discussed above (sec. 4), present generations can have obligations to compensate those who currently suffer harms resulting from the lasting impact of injustices experienced by their predecessors, even if the reasons for providing them with compensation are different from (and possibly less weighty than (4.2)) the reasons for compensating people whose identities are not dependent on (or changed by) the harmful acts.
Whether we adopt the exclusive subjunctive-threshold view or the combined view of harm, the interpretation of the relevance of past wrongs just sketched is open to the following objection: the forward-looking interpretation of the relevance of historical injustices is incomplete when understood as a statement of how we ought to respond to the fact that past people were severely wronged. The true moral significance of past wrongs does not lie in their impact on present and future people's well-being; rather, the significance of past wrongs is in the fact that past people were victims of these injustices. We need to enquire into the question of what we owe to the dead victims of past injustices. As sketched here, the interpretation is misleading in suggesting that we owe them nothing -- that, in the words of Max Horkheimer, “[p]ast injuries took place in the past and the matter ended there. The slain are truly slain.”
The interpretation sketched here denies what seems to many to be intuitively plausible, namely, that present generations can have duties to dead victims owing to the wrongs committed against them (by others) in the past. If this intuition can be defended, we have duties to past generations that are grounded in past deeds. This would imply that at least some aspects of historical injustice cannot be accounted for by an historically informed theory of justice between contemporaries (or between contemporaries and future people).
To attribute rights to dead people may seem unproblematic if we assume that people continue to exist after their physical death and that they may be affected by (and affect) events of this world. These assumptions about the ontological status of previously living people are, however, at least as controversial as their converse. In a philosophical investigation of whether we hold duties toward the deceased it is best to remain as neutral as possible between these competing views. In the following discussion we will proceed on the following assumption:
(A) either the deceased do not exist (a1) or, if they do exist, there is no connection between them and those currently alive (a2).
In other words, we assume that upon her death any causal interaction between a person and the physical world as we know it ceases.
Assuming that dead people cannot be bearers of interests or rights and thus that those presently alive can neither harm nor wrong dead people, Joel Feinberg and others have discussed two alternative interpretations of posthumous harm. While both are compatible with presupposition (A), neither of these positions provides a satisfactory understanding of posthumous harm or wrong. According to the first interpretation, present generations can be said to owe something to surviving interests as such -- that is, to interests that the deceased had, while alive, with respect to future posthumous states of affairs. However, while we have reasons to care about individual people, it is not clear that we have reasons to care about interests as such. According to the second (re-)interpretation, the significance of posthumous events is fully accounted for by the harm that these events events cause a person during her life. However, this interpretation is not an interpretation of posthumous harm as such but of harm to living people that is caused by posthumous events. This position has been shown to be incompatible with our normal understanding of the significance of posthumous events.
Contrary to the first position mentioned we will assume that deceased people cannot be bearers of interests or rights, and contrary to the second that we have no reason to care about interests that have no current bearers. In contrast to the third position mentioned we do not ask whether living people can be harmed by posthumous events. Rather, we would like to find out whether present generations can be said to owe something to dead people and, in particular, to those who were victims of past injustices. A fourth position, the position of surviving duties, is compatible with presupposition (A) and does not rely on any of the criticized views. According to this position, duties survive the death of the bearer of the right. While the bearer of the right no longer exists, those currently alive can stand under the correlative duties. The notion of surviving duties relies on the idea that reasons for a person's right imply reasons for a correlative duty under which other people may stand even after the death of the bearer of the right. In the case of moral rights, these reasons include general social reasons which are relevant not only to the bearer of the right but also to others as well. For example, we all have reasons to protect people's trust that promises be kept and that people have the reputation they deserve. The reasons for the surviving duties also include the reasons that are necessary for showing that a particular person had the moral right.
For the following discussion we will assume:
(A*) Dead people have no interests or rights with respect to the state of affairs in the world as we know it.
(B) Those currently alive can stand under duties.
Claim (B) seems unproblematic. Claim (A*) corresponds to presupposition (A) as introduced above. The position under consideration also relies upon the following claims:
(C) Some rights are future-oriented in the sense that they impose duties in the future.
(c) Such rights can impose surviving duties: The rights imply duties that are binding after the death of the bearer of the right if the appropriate bearer of the duty is identified.
In the following we will comment on these claims in light of the example of a person who wishes to establish posthumously a prize for the sciences. Let us call the person “Alfred Nobel” even though we make no claim that the example resembles Alfred Nobel to whose bequest we owe the Nobel Prize.
If “A right implies a duty” we may suppose that the reasons for the right contain (some of) the reasons for the duty. With respect to moral rights specifically moral reasons are among these reasons. In the case of rights that are future-oriented in the sense indicated, reasons for rights held by those now deceased are sufficient for holding existent persons under duties, that is, surviving duties.
Suppose Alfred Nobel kept to himself his wish to establish, posthumously, a prize for the sciences. Although he accumulated the fortune necessary for such, Nobel neglected to write it in his will. Hiking in isolated mountains together with his friend Barbara, Nobel has an accident and both he and Barbara realize that he will die before they can find help. Nobel asks his friend to promise him that she will make sure that his fortune will be spent for the establishment of a prize for the sciences and that his wish to this effect will be acknowledged as if it had been written in his will.
Why should Barbara keep her promise? The particular strength of the position under consideration lies in its connecting the surviving duty both to the previous right of the deceased person and to those general moral reasons for promise keeping relevant to all. First, the reasons which ground Nobel's right-as-living-person imply reasons for the validity of the surviving duty. It is because of this that we stand under surviving duties toward the deceased person. For example, the surviving duty to keep a death-bed promise is valid for, inter alia, the reason that the promise was given to the deceased person -- and that is why the latter, while alive, had a moral right that the promise given to him be kept. If the duty is not understood to be binding due to the fact, inter alia, that the deceased person had the future-oriented right, surviving duties could not be distinguished from interpretations of, for example, death-bed promises according to which the duty to keep the promise is owed to our contemporaries alone (and possibly to people living in the future). The position under consideration differs from some consequentialist interpretations of such cases by insisting that a surviving duty necessarily be based upon, inter alia, the reasons for the future-oriented right originally held.
So far we have investigated one type of reason for a person to stand under a duty towards the deceased person. These reasons are implied by the reasons for attributing the corresponding right to the deceased person while alive. However, there are other reasons too. These reasons are general in that they concern the protection or promotion of values important for the quality of social life. With respect to death-bed promises trust, and the protection from betrayal, are at stake. We all have reasons to protect the value of people having confidence that promises be kept. In so far as people can and do have an interest in future posthumous states of affairs of the world, and in so far as pursuing such interests can be of high importance to the well-being of people while alive, it is important for people that others can bind themselves by promises or contracts to the effect that they will carry out certain actions after the promisee's death, and that on such occasions they can be confident that the promise will be kept. For the practice of such promises, trust is of special importance, for the promisee will not be able to determine whether the promise was kept. At the same time, if such promises have often not been kept, this is likely to undermine the confidence in promises being kept generally. The right of the deceased person that the promise given will be kept is in part based on these reasons. Although the person who is the bearer of the right (and thus the right) has ceased to exist, the moral reasons for honoring the right are still valid and the duty of the person who gave the promise continues to be binding on the basis of these reasons. As these reasons are general moral reasons they are not only relevant for the individual bearer of the right but also for the surviving bearer of the correlative duty and his contemporaries. The death of the bearer of the right leaves these moral reasons unaffected, and the surviving duty is based in part on these reasons. Thus, contemporaries of a person who stands under a surviving duty have reason to impose sanctions on the person should he not keep his promise.
One might wonder whether this interpretation of surviving duties is compatible with the presupposition that dead people are bearers of neither interests nor rights and that they cannot be affected by the actions of present persons. At the very least, the position of surviving duties we are defending presupposes the possibility of the attribution of posthumous properties and, more particularly, of their change.
If Barbara were not to keep her promise, Nobel would have the posthumous property of being the person with respect to whom Barbara violated the duty to keep the promise she gave. Such posthumous predication is incompatible with the claim
(D) If X has the property P at a particular time t, then X exists at t. 
Our understanding of posthumous duties is to be compatible with the mortality assumption (a1), that is, with the assumption that dead people do not exist. The idea of surviving duties presupposes the possibility of posthumous predication of properties to no longer existing persons and, thus, the rejection of (D). More particularly, the notion of surviving duties presupposes the possibility that previously living people undergo a change of properties after their death. For example, suppose that John forges the will of Nobel with the result that Nobel's fortune is spent contrary to his wishes. A short time later Barbara uncovers the fraud, Nobel's will is restored and his wishes are fulfilled. At first, the deceased Nobel is posthumously the person who is betrayed by John's forgery of his will; later on, Nobel has the property of being the person whose will is restored and whose wishes are fulfilled. How can Nobel undergo such changes if he is non-existent?
Here we can rely on an explanation of posthumous predication as introduced by David-Hillel Ruben. His explanation relies on two distinctions, namely, the distinction between real and non-real changes and the distinction between relational and non-relational properties. The first distinction is the distinction between changes as ordinarily understood and changes that are only apparent: The change in a schoolboy if he comes to admire Socrates whom he did not admire before is an example of real change, whereas the change in Socrates when the schoolboy comes to admire him is an example of non-real change. The second distinction concerns the distinction between non-relational properties and relational properties. In the case of non-relational properties one can ascribe a property of an object without knowing anything else about other objects. This is not so for relational properties. The property that an object has as the result of a change of its color might be an example of a non-relational property, while the property that Adam and Eve have each time they acquire a new descendant is an example of a relational property.
In our example, John forges Nobel's will. This event is a change in John's non-relational properties. John violates a duty by acting contrary to the reasons that are valid for him. Moreover, not fulfilling his duty might cause feelings of guilt on his part -- a non-relational change of John. What is more, failing to fulfill his duty has certain consequences: When the forgery is uncovered John's contemporaries criticize his breach of duty. Doing so requires them to act or to refrain from acting in certain ways. These are further non-relational changes in them.
However, John's violation of his surviving duty also entails relational changes. First, John's relations with Nobel undergo a change. Nobel now is a person with respect to whom John violated a duty. Second, John's relations with his contemporaries undergo change. Because of his breach of duty John is now considered a person deserving of sanction. According to the interpretation of surviving duties as sketched above, John has general moral reasons to fulfill his duty, and when he acts contrary to these reasons this is a matter of general moral concern.
Thus, we would like to maintain that Nobel can be a relatum of a relational change. But, because Nobel is non-existent he cannot undergo non-relational changes. According to Ruben's analysis, for each relational change there is a simultaneous or earlier non-relational change to which the relational change is owed, or on which the relational change depends.  We can distinguish several types of relationship between relational and non-relational changes. When a person acts contrary to the surviving duty under which he stands, then only one of the relata which undergoes a relational change also undergoes a real change, namely, the person who is alive -- in our example, John. The other relatum, the deceased person, undergoes only a non-real change, namely, a relational change -- in our example, Nobel. John, the person who violates the duty, undergoes a real change and because of this he also undergoes a change in his relation to Nobel, the deceased person. Since the latter person is dead, he cannot undergo a real change but only non-real changes.
We are now in a position to qualify the claim (D), which we found to be incompatible with the idea of surviving duties. The claim reads: If X has the property P at a particular time t, then X exists at t. This holds true if the property in question is a matter of undergoing real change. The modified claim thus reads:
(D*) If X has the property P at a particular time t and the property is a result of undergoing real change, then X exists at t. 
Only existing bearers of properties can have properties that indicate that the bearer undergoes real change; non-existing bearers of properties can have properties that indicate a change in their relations to other entities owing to real changes in the latter. The idea of surviving duties presupposes the possibility of the latter, namely of attributing the following property to a deceased person: being the person whose previous future-oriented right is now violated by a living person; the latter person breaches a surviving duty and thus undergoes a real change. The notion of dead people being wronged or harmed, however, presupposes a real change in the dead person. If dead people cannot undergo real changes they cannot be harmed or wronged.
Does the theory of surviving duties help us in responding to the objection against the forward-looking understanding of the significance of historical injustices? We shall propose the idea that since people can be said to have an obligation to compensate surviving and indirect victims of past injustices,  they may also have an obligation symbolically to compensate dead victims of past injustices, people who cannot now be affected by our actions.
As argued above, we can stand under surviving duties towards past people even though we can neither affect the subjective value of any moment of their lives, nor consider them as bearers of interests or rights. Until now we have discussed duties towards dead people with reference to (variations on) the example of Alfred Nobel. People can act in ways that constitute a violation of the surviving duties under which they stand in consequence of the rights the deceased once held. We stand under particular surviving duties towards the deceased owing to their future-oriented projects, the promises we made to them, or the contractual obligations we entered into with them. However, not all people pursue projects or have wishes that are future-oriented in the relevant way. Here we want to suggest that we can stand under surviving duties towards dead people owing to the fact that they were victims of historical injustices. For us to show that such duties are possible, we will have to assume that people generally have interests with respect to posthumous states of affairs. Indeed, people can be thought generally to be interested in enjoying a good reputation both during their lifetime and posthumously. When people have their rights violated, and badly so, their posthumous reputation depends upon their being publicly acknowledged as victims of these wrongs, and others being identified as the wrongdoers.
In acknowledging past individuals as victims of egregious wrongs we cannot affect their well-being. Also, such acknowledgement cannot be expressed face to face with the dead victims. However, if it is true that we stand under surviving duties towards past victims of historical injustice owing to the wrongs they suffered, then our fulfilling the duty by publicly acknowledging the past injustices they suffered will change the relation between us and the dead victims of historical injustice. It will be true of the past victims of these injustices that they have the posthumous property that we fulfilled our surviving duty towards them. To be sure, a change of the relation between an existent person and a dead person does not bring about a real change to the latter. Rather, the relational change is based upon the real change of the person who carries out the act.
To bring about public acknowledgment of past people as victims of historical injustice can require different measures under different circumstances. We can acknowledge past people as victims of past wrongs in an indirect way. One such way might be by compensating those who are worse off than they should be owing to the effects of the past injustices suffered by their predecessors. The message of such compensation can contain the acknowledgment that past people were victims of past wrongs. We can understand efforts at appropriate commemoration of past victims as measures of symbolic compensation and restitution.
Establishing a memorial is the typical course of action to realize symbolically the value of compensating those victims who are no longer living. A memorial may be a public speech, a day in the official calendar, a conference, a public space or a monument -- for example, a sculpture or an installation. Often these memorials are meant to commemorate crimes committed in the name of a political society whose currently citizens now want to show to the victims of these crimes and their descendants public symbolic compensation. While there is still no established practice for such efforts at public symbolic compensation, such acts have been carried out since the 1970s in Germany, and there is evidence of an international practice of symbolic compensation.
How can we understand this practice of symbolic compensation? Here we can only adumbrate the basic idea: the value of real compensation -- the rectification or compensation at which we would aim if only it were possible -- is imputed, at least in part, to the act of symbolic compensation. This may be achieved partly through the expressive value of acts of symbolic compensation: such acts express attitudes towards the past victims -- attitudes that are constitutive of acts of compensation. Acts of symbolic compensation make it possible for us to express an understanding of ourselves as people who wish to, and would, carry out acts of real compensation if this were only possible, and who are committed to prevent the repetition of such injustices.
Acts of symbolic compensation can thus be valuable for those who perform them, since they express attitudes that are important to self-understanding and identity. Those involved understand themselves to be persons committed to the just claims of those who have been injured and to be persons prepared to contribute to the establishment and maintenance of a just political society. This is a real consequence of such acts and can be of great importance to those carrying out the acts.
However, we will not succeed in bringing about these consequences if we aim to bring about these consequences as such. Carrying out an act of symbolic value as a means of bringing about certain consequences will change the character of the act and, thus, the reasons that speak on behalf of carrying out the act in the first place. It is not the case that we will become a person of a certain identity simply by carrying out an act that a person of this identity would have performed. While the consequences for self-understanding just outlined can be an important factor in explaining why a person acts as she does, in choosing what to do the person cannot herself explicitly take into account this type of consequence without thereby diminishing or undermining this very effect of her act.
Acts of symbolic compensation will have consequences for others as well, particularly surviving and indirect victims of past injustices. Acts of symbolic compensation can have consequences for such persons and groups: the public acknowledgment of the suffering of past people who were wronged by, say, a genocidal policy cannot be separated from the acknowledgment of those who survived the same policy and consequently suffer, or from those who suffer as indirect victims of the policy. Those who carry out acts of symbolic compensation will want to provide some real compensation to those who currently suffer as a result of the same past wrong, to help those who currently are victims of similar injustices, and to prevent such injustices from happening again. The reasons for acts of symbolic compensation provide reasons for real compensation where this is possible. Symbolic compensation belongs to the measures likely to have the effect of providing surviving victims or groups with assistance in recovering or regaining membership and recognition in their respective societies, such that they are once again able to lead lives under conditions of justice.
Acts of symbolic compensation may nonetheless hinder us from realizing other values and may have negative consequences or consequences less positive than other courses of action -- and this can be the case even if carrying out such acts can bring about positive consequences for others. First, acts of symbolic compensation can compete with acts that make possible the realization of important non-symbolic values. The conflict may be due to the fact that the act of symbolic compensation is costly, materially speaking. Indeed, establishing a monument or a museum to commemorate publicly victims of past injustices can be costly. However, if we find ourselves in a situation in which we have to choose between carrying out such symbolic compensation and realizing another project intended to improve the conditions of the worst off by, say, establishing a medical facility for homeless people, we may need to seek alternative, less costly, ways of expressing the value of symbolic compensation. For example, the establishment of a day of commemoration in the official calendar (not necessarily a day on which work stops) may well make it possible for us to realize the value of symbolic compensation and be less costly than the establishment of a museum or a monument. Such an alternative may serve to express the value of symbolic compensation as well as the more costly route: there does not seem to be a clear correlation between material expenditure and success in symbolically realizing the desired value.
Other conflicts might be more difficult to resolve. Acts of symbolic compensation may compete with realizing other symbolic values. Or, such actions may undermine the integrity and self-understanding of certain groups. For example, public acts of this sort might undermine the stability of the military, whose compliance with the rules of the new regime, yet to be established, may well be a condition of the success of a “transition to democracy”. It seems doubtful that one can say much of a general nature about these sorts of conflicts. How we assess the conflicts depends upon, inter alia, how we assess the self-understandings of the groups and institutions that are said to be threatened. These self-understandings might well not deserve our respect. At the same time, it can be true that our success in realizing the symbolic value in question does not require those particular acts that have threatening consequences for others. Indeed, such consequences, in alienating certain groups, compromise an important value -- public acknowledgement of wrongdoing -- that we seek through symbolic compensation. We might be able to find an alternative course of action that is more promising with respect both to our chance of realizing the symbolic value in question and to diminishing the threatening consequences to others.
Symbolic compensation as understood here demonstrates that we can recognize past people as victims of injustices without presupposing that they can be current bearers of interests or rights. Insofar as people while alive generally have an interest and a just claim to enjoy the reputation they deserve, and insofar as the reasons for their just claim can oblige us even after the bearer of the interest and the just claim has ceased to exist, our carrying out acts of symbolic compensation can be understood as fulfilling a surviving duty towards dead people who were wronged in the past, namely the duty of restoring to them the posthumous reputation they deserve. Our measures of symbolic compensation, if successful, will alter the relation in which we stand to past victims without changing the subjective value of their own lives. Such a change does not presuppose a real change in the past people. Rather, the relational change is based upon real change of the person who carries out the act. Bringing about this relational change can be important for the self-understanding of the people who carry out the acts. Carrying out acts of symbolic compensation can also have positive consequences for, among others, surviving and indirect victims of the injustice in question.
Present generations stand under two types of obligations of intergenerational justice: They are obliged (i) not to violate the rights of future generations (sec. 2) and (ii) (at least some presently living people might well be obliged) to provide compensation to contemporaries for the harms inflicted upon them as a result of the lasting impact of injustices committed against their predecessors (sec. 5). By employing a subjunctive-threshold notion of harm -- that can be understood as an constitutive element of an understanding of harm (combined view) (sects. 3 and 4) -- we can justify conclusions about both types of present generations' duties.
The special features of our relations to (remote) future people -- especially the lack of particular knowledge, the impossibility of cooperation, and the permanent asymmetry of influence (sec. 1) -- do not stand in the way of attributing rights to them that ground corresponding duties owed by us (sec. 3). The fact that past wrongs are among the necessary conditions for the existence and identity of people currently alive is compatible with the view that these persons have rights to compensation owing to the impact of these past wrongs on their well-being, and that these rights can ground corresponding duties owed by their contemporaries (forward-looking understanding of the significance of past injustices) (sec. 5).
Rights-based considerations of intergenerational justice bear not only upon “same people choices” but also upon both types of “different people choices” that Parfit distinguishes, including what he calls “different number choices” (sects. 2 and 3). However, widely shared concerns for the continuation of human life and at a high level of well-being cannot be accounted for solely by rights-based considerations (sects. 2.2). Also, the moral significance of past wrongs should not be interpreted solely in terms of the impact of these injustices on present and future people's well-being. If we allow that intergenerational relations are not exclusively governed by duties with correlative rights, the notion that we can stand under surviving duties towards dead people who cannot be bearers of rights vis-a-vis us (sects. 5.2-3) is compatible with the forward-looking understanding of the significance of historical injustice. Also, the notion that we stand under an obligation towards future people to which no rights of future people correspond -- namely, under the obligation not to destroy willfully the goods inherited from our predecessors and the conditions that are constitutive of persons' pursuit of future-oriented projects (sec. 3.4) -- is compatible with the view that we do stand under some obligations of intergenerational justice to which the rights of future people do correspond.