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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Roman Ingarden (1893 -- 1970) was a Polish phenomenologist, ontologist and aesthetician. A student of Edmund Husserl's from the Göttingen period, Ingarden was a realist phenomenologist who spent much of his career working against what he took to be Husserl's turn to transcendental idealism. As preparatory work for narrowing down possible solutions to the realism/idealism problem, Ingarden developed ontological studies unmatched in scope and detail, distinguishing different kinds of dependence and different modes of being. He is best known, however, for his work in aesthetics, particularly on the ontology of the work of art and the status of aesthetic values, and is credited with being the founder of phenomenological aesthetics. His work The Literary Work of Art has been widely influential in literary theory as well as philosophical aesthetics, and has been crucial to the development of New Criticism and Reader Response Theory.
Roman Witold Ingarden was born on February 5, 1893 in Kraków. He initially studied mathematics and philosophy in Lvóv, and in 1912 went to Göttingen where he studied philosophy under Edmund Husserl, taking four semesters of seminars with Husserl, from 1912 to 1914, and again during the summer of 1915. Husserl considered Ingarden one of his best students, and the two remained in close touch until Husserl's death in 1938 (their philosophical correspondence was eventually published as Husserl's Briefe an Roman Ingarden). Ingarden also studied philosophy in Lvóv with Kazimierz Twardowski (who, like Husserl, was a student of Franz Brentano). When Husserl accepted the chair at Freiburg, Ingarden followed him, submitting his dissertation “Intuition und Intellekt bei Henri Bergson” in 1917, for which he received his Ph.D. in 1918, with Husserl as director.
After submitting his dissertation, Ingarden returned to Poland for the remainder of his academic career, first teaching mathematics, psychology and philosophy in secondary schools while he worked on his Habilitationschrift. That work, published as Essentiale Fragen in 1925, attracted some attention in the English speaking philosophical world, being reviewed twice in Mind (by A.C. Ewing in 1926 and by Gilbert Ryle in 1927).With the publication of his Habilitationschrift, Ingarden was appointed as Privatdozent at the Jan Kazimierz University in Lvóv, where he was promoted to Professor in 1933. During this time his most well known work, The Literary Work of Art, was first published (1931, in German), followed by The Cognition of the Literary Work (1936, in Polish). His academic career was interrupted from 1941-1944, when (due to the war) the university was closed, and he secretly taught philosophy at the university, and mathematics to secondary school children in an orphanage. At the same time (and despite the bombing of his house in Lvóv), Ingarden was working intensively on his magnum opus The Controversy over the Existence of the World (the first two volumes of which were published in Polish in 1947 and 1948 respectively). In 1945 he moved to Jagellonian University in Kraków, where he was given a chair in 1946, however in 1949, (under Stalinization) he was banned from teaching because of his alleged "idealism" (ironically, a philosophical position against which Ingarden fought for most of his life) and for being an “enemy of materialism”. The ban continued until 1957, at which point Ingarden was reappointed to his post at Jagellonian University, where he taught until his retirement in 1963 and continued to write, publishing such works as The Ontology of the Work of Art (1962) and Experience, Artwork and Value (1969). Ingarden died suddenly of a cerebral hemorrhage on June 14, 1970, while still fully engaged in his philosophical projects. A careful, detailed, and fully documented account of Ingarden's biography may be found in [Mitscherling, 1997], which also does much to settle the inconsistencies in earlier partial accounts of Ingarden's life.
Like many of Husserl's students from the Göttingen period, Ingarden is a realist phenomenologist who ardently resisted Husserl's apparent turn to transcendental idealism in the Ideas and thereafter. Although his training is phenomenological, his work on the whole is directed not towards understanding the basic structures of consciousness, but rather towards ontology. Indeed, Ingarden is one of the foremost practitioners of phenomenological ontology, which attempts to determine what the ontological structure and status of objects of various types must be, based on examining essential features of any experience that could present or provide knowledge of such objects—a method based in the assumption that there are essential correlations between kinds of objects and the modes of cognition by means of which they can be known.
Ingarden's best-known works, indeed the only ones known to most of his readers in the English-speaking world, are his works on aesthetics, especially literature—works that offer unrivalledly sophisticated and subtle accounts both of the ontological status of works of art of various kinds, and of our means of cognizing them. His phenomenological approach to aesthetics strongly influenced the work of Michel Dufrennes, and there are also strong resonances between his work on the ontology of art and contemporary analytic work in aesthetics, e.g., by Joseph Margolis, Nelson Goodman and Jerrold Levinson. The Literary Work of Art has been particularly influential in literary studies, where its effects are visible in Wolfgang Kayser's work Das sprachliche Kunstwerk and in the development of the schools of New Criticism and Reader Response Theory in the work of such theorists as René Wellek and Wolfgang Iser, respectively.
Nonetheless, the frequently exclusive focus on Ingarden's work in aesthetics is somewhat unfortunate and can be misleading about his overall philosophical focus and goals, for Ingarden produced an enormous body of work on a wide variety of topics. He was among the first to (in 1934) raise the classic criticism of logical positivism that the verifiability criterion of meaning is itself unverifiable, and produced a large body of work in epistemology, ontology, metaphysics, phenomenology, and value theory. The relative obscurity of Ingarden's work in these other areas is attributable in part to the relative isolation and interruption of academic philosophy in Poland in the period of World War Two and Soviet occupation, and in part to language barriers. Before the second world war, Ingarden (being German trained) published his works mainly in German, thus his early works such as The Literary Work of Art appeared in German early in his career, and were to have a broad impact. But during the war, Ingarden (in a gesture of solidarity) switched to writing in Polish, a language speakers of English and other Western European languages were unlikely to read, and so his major works on ontology went largely unnoticed by the wider European and Anglo-American philosophical circles. His major work in ontology, The Controversy, for example, was not translated into German until 1964, and (except for a small part, printed under the title Time and Modes of Being) remains unavailable in English.
Seen more as a whole, Ingarden's body of work revolves not around aesthetics, but rather around the realism/idealism problem -- an issue that was to dominate his thinking ever since, as a young man, he recoiled against Husserl's transcendental idealism. As I will discuss in §3.1 below, Ingarden's work in aesthetics was actually motivated by his interest in the realism/idealism problem. His studies in fiction and the ontology of art were intended to form part of a large-scale argument against transcendental idealism, based in emphasizing the difference between ‘real’ entities entirely independent of our minds, and social and cultural entities that (as ‘purely intentional objects’) owe their existence, at least in part, to human consciousness -- thus showing that, in virtue of the very meanings of the ideas involved, the ‘real world’ as a whole cannot be properly treated as a purely intentional object owing its existence to consciousness.
In developing a positive position, Ingarden sought a middle path between the reductive physicalist realisms popular among analytic philosophers, and the transcendental idealism adopted by Husserl, rejecting the simplistic bifurcation between entities that are ‘mind-independent’ and those that are ‘merely subjective’. His most important and lasting contribution may lie in providing a richer ontological framework that could track the different ways in which many objects of the ‘life-world’ of daily experience depend on human intentionality and on mind-independent reality, and in developing a moderate realist position that offered room not only for independent physical reality and for consciousness, but also for the whole variety of life-world objects that owe their existence, in part, to both.
Most of Ingarden's major work focuses on ontology, which he considers a purely a priori enterprise, concerned not with what actually exists, but with what could possibly exist (which concepts are non-contradictory), and with what (according to the contents of the relevant ideas) it would take for objects of various kinds to exist, or entail if they existed. He thus contrasts ontology with metaphysics, which is concerned with answering factual questions about what sorts of things actually exist and what they are like. Ontology, in Ingarden's hands, thus bears close resemblance to the sorts of conceptual analysis that became common in analytic philosophy in roughly the same period. Ingarden's work on the ontology of art is ontological in this sense, e.g. he attempts to determine, by analysis of the essential meanings of experiences that could present something as a work of literature, music, or architecture, what sort of an entity such an object would have to be to satisfy those experiences and meanings, and how it would have to relate to consciousness and physical objects.
Despite Ingarden's deep admiration for Husserl, one crucial issue -- transcendental idealism -- divided them. Indeed, Ingarden was already “tormented” by the problem for years before he completed his dissertation [“Letter,” 422], and by 1918 had definitively determined that he could not share Husserl's transcendental idealism [Streit, vii]. Ingarden's concern with and rejection of transcendental idealism directly or indirectly determined the course of much of his later philosophical work, so much so that in 1961 he describes his process of working on idealism as one “which has been in fact occupying my entire scholarly life.” [“Letter,” 437].
The transcendental idealism Ingarden rejects is the position that the so-called ‘real world’ depends on consciousness for its existence and essence; that it exists only for consciousness and beyond that is a ‘nothing’. While there is some debate among Husserl scholars over whether or not Husserl genuinely took the ‘turn’ to transcendental idealism in a metaphysical sense (as opposed to merely treating it as if it were true while undertaking the methodology of transcendental reduction), Ingarden clearly saw Husserl as turning from the realism of the Logical Investigations to a metaphysical form of transcendental idealism by the time the first volume of Ideas was published, and the two frequently debated this topic in letter and in person during the period from 1918-1938.
Ingarden takes Husserl to have been driven to transcendental idealism largely by his epistemological goals and transcendental approach to phenomenology. If the very idea of three-dimensional external objects makes sense, it would be essential that our perceptions of them are inevitably inadequate: They may be presented from one point of view or another, but never exhaustively and entirely -- so room is always left open for new perceptions that would lead us to entirely revise our past judgments. Such objects thus would inherently transcend any finite set of experiences of them; no external object could be part of any experience of it, and any judgments we attempt to make about them would be open to doubt. Thus if phenomenology is to be a ‘rigorous science’ grounded only in what does not go beyond our experience, it must limit its study to objects of ‘immanent perception’, the meaningful series of (actual and possible) contents of consciousness rather than any supposedly transcendent objects presented by them. Moreover, as Husserl argues in §41 of the Cartesian Meditations, since the transcendental ego is the source of all sense, any meaning of ‘transcendent object’ ‘outside of consciousness’, etc. must be a meaning constructed through layerings of the senses of our conscious acts, and transcendental phenomenology can analyze how these meanings are built up out of other meanings of individual acts of perception and intention (e.g. ‘is perceived from this angle’, ‘could be perceived from another angle, in these other ways’, etc.) This is the meaning that the question e.g. ‘is this object real?’ may have from within the standpoint of transcendental phenomenology. Any attempt to go beyond this understanding of ‘transcendent object’ or ‘real object outside of consciousness’, however, to talk of something beyond what can be constituted by any actual or possible experience is literally going beyond what can be meaningfully asked; it is literally non-sense. The very idea of a world outside of and independent from all actual and possible experience is thus, from this point of view, an illegitimate concept, a kind of disguised nonsense. The only ‘real world’ of which we can legitimately speak, have knowledge, or enter into other intentional relations with is the ‘real world’ as constituted by, and essentially correlated with, meaningful series’ of intentional acts.
Ingarden accepted that, as long as we approach the realism problem from the standpoint of epistemology, or from within the standpoint of transcendental phenomenology, there is no way out to establish the existence and knowledge of a mind-independent world. Nor, however, can one establish that the real world depends on consciousness, since any attempted talk about the world in-itself and its nature would be meaningless -- thus from that standpoint, the controversy over the existence of the world would have to remain undecided. But he also thought that other approaches to philosophy were legitimate, and indeed that one should begin from ontology rather than epistemology.
According to Ingarden, the realism/idealism problem is fundamentally a metaphysical problem (about the actual existence of the so-called ‘real’ world and its relation to consciousness), but may be non-circularly approached via ontology by examining what the possible sorts of relation between consciousness and the world could be. In particular, Ingarden hoped that an ontological approach to the realism/idealism problem could lead to a solution by attempting to identify what the possible modes of being would be of the ‘real’ world and of consciousness, and how the two could possibly be related. This was the motive for his monumental work in ontology, The Controversy over the Existence of the World, designed to describe the different possible modes of being and their possible interrelations, with a view to narrowing down possible solutions to the realism/idealism problem. Unfortunately, the work was never fully completed (although the first two volumes were published and the third in progress at the time of Ingarden's death), but the portions that exist nonetheless contain many important and detailed ontological analyses valuable in their own right as well as having the potential to contribute to the discussion of the realism/idealism controversy. Prominent among these is his distinction between formal, material, and existential ontologies, and distinguishing ‘modes of being’ as highest existential categories.
Most traditional category systems, such as Aristotle's, lay out a single dimension of categories supposed to be mutually exclusive and exhaustive. Ingarden, by contrast, develops a multi-dimensional category scheme by dividing ontology into three parts: formal, material and existential ontologies, corresponding to three distinct aspects that may be discerned in any entity (its formal structure, material nature, and mode of being respectively). These different formal, material and existential aspects of the object, studied by the different types of ontology, may thus be used to classify an object in any of three interpenetrating dimensions (although not all combinations among formal, material and existential modes are possible).
The formal categories are marked by such familiar ontological divisions as those between objects, processes and relations. Following Husserl, in addition to these, Ingarden distinguishes material categories, with high-level material kinds including, e.g., works of art and real (spatio-temporal) objects. Finally, claiming there is an essential ambiguity in the term ‘exists’, Ingarden also goes on to distinguish different existential categories or “modes of being” -- different ways in which entities may exist, e.g., dependently or independently, in time or not, contingently or necessarily, etc.
The modes of being are defined in terms of different characteristic combinations of ‘existential moments’. The existential moments mostly concern either an object's temporal determinations (or lack thereof), or the different dependencies it bears (or does not bear) to other sorts of object. Indeed in drawing out his existential moments, Ingarden goes beyond Husserl's influential work on dependence to distinguish four different existential moments of dependence (and their contrasting moments of independence): Contingency (the dependence of a separate entity on another in order to remain in existence); Derivation (the dependence of an entity on another in order to come into existence); Inseparateness (the dependence of an entity that can only exist if it coexists with something else in a single whole); and Heteronomy (the dependence of an entity for its existence and entire qualitative endowment on another). In so doing, Ingarden develops one of the richest and most detailed analyses of dependence ever offered, providing distinctions in the notion of dependence that can clarify many philosophical problems including but certainly not limited to the realism/idealism problem.
Ingarden's four highest existential-ontological categories or ‘modes of being’ are: Absolute, Real, Ideal, and Purely Intentional. The absolute mode of being could be exhibited only by a being such as God, which could exist even if nothing else whatsoever ever existed. The ideal mode of being is a timeless mode of existence suitable for platonistically conceived numbers; the real mode of being is that of contingent spatio-temporal entities such as the realist assumes ordinary rocks and trees to be; while the purely intentional mode of being is that occupied by fictional characters and other entities which owe their existence and nature to acts of consciousness. Thus the realism/idealism controversy can be reconfigured as the controversy over whether the so-called ‘real world’ has the real or purely intentional mode of being.
By far Ingarden's best-known and most influential work, especially in the English-speaking world, is The Literary Work of Art, which was written around 1926, and first published in German in 1931. It is fundamentally a work in ontology, in Ingarden's sense (see §2 above), laying out the essential features anything must have to be counted as a literary work, what parts it must have and how they are interrelated, and how such entities as literary works relate to other sorts of entities such as authors, copies of texts, readers, and ideal meanings.
As with so much of Ingarden's philosophical work, he undertakes this study of the ontology of the literary work in part with the motive of utilizing its results to argue against transcendental idealism -- indeed he conceived of The Literary Work of Art as a preliminary study for The Controversy. Literary works and the characters and objects represented in them were to provide examples of purely intentional objects -- objects owing their existence and essence to consciousness. Thus a detailed study of works of literature and their represented objects could serve to explicate the purely intentional mode of being, with a view to contrasting this with the real mode of being and ultimately demonstrating that it is impossible to reduce the ‘real world’ to the status of a purely intentional creation. [Streit, vii-viii]. Nonetheless, this motive remains largely behind the scenes of the detailed studies of language and literature in The Literary Work of Art, which can be (and largely has been) described and evaluated without reference to these broader motives, as an independent contribution to aesthetics and literary theory.
The work begins by attempting to determine the ‘mode of existence’ of the literary work -- essentially the same problem that today goes under the heading of understanding the ontological status of works of literature, music, etc. In twelve concise pages, he provides compelling reasons to reject both attempts to identify literary works with “real” objects or events such as copies of texts or the psychological experiences of authors or readers, and attempts to identify them with platonistic “ideal” objects such as ordered manifolds of sentences or meanings. Each such attempted identification leads to various absurdities, e.g. the view literary works are physical objects would lead us to say that such works differ by chemical composition; the view that they are experiences of the author would make them completely unknowable, while the view that they are experiences of readers would prevent us from postulating a single work Hamlet known by many readers; and the view that they are ideal objects would entail that literary works may never be created and cannot be changed, even by their authors.
As a result, works of literature cannot be classified in either of the major categories of objects accepted by traditional metaphysics -- neither the categories of the real nor the ideal are suited for them. Any acceptable ontology of literature thus must accept entities of another category. As Ingarden ultimately argues towards the close of the text, the literary work is a “purely intentional formation,” derived from the sentence-forming activities of its author(s), and founded on some public copy of these sentences, and also depending for its existence and essence on a relation to certain ideal meanings attached to the words of the text.
While the question of the ontological status of the literary work forms the work's beginning, most of the details of the text are dedicated to drawing out an “essential anatomy” of the literary work, determining its essential parts and their relations to one another. He conceives of this task as preliminary to any questions of the values that works of literature may or may not have, as we will be better able to see where values of different types can inhere once we know what the different parts of the literary work are.
According to Ingarden, every literary work is composed of four heterogeneous strata:
Each of these strata has room for its own typical sorts of aesthetic value (or disvalue); thus we may distinguish the values of rhythm, alliteration, or mellifluousness at the level of word sounds, from the values in interesting (or jarring) juxtapositions of ideas and concepts at the level of meaning units, from the quasi-visual splendor of the scene presented, from the values of sympathetic or complex characters and intricate plots.
The values of a literary work, however, are not exhausted by the separate values of its several strata, for the strata do not exist separately, but rather form an ‘organic unity’. Among the strata are various forms of mutual dependence and influence, and the harmonies or disharmonies among the strata (e.g. between the halting rhythms of a character's speech and his timid personality) may contribute other aesthetic merits or demerits to the work. Most importantly, in cooperation with the other strata, the stratum of represented objects may present “metaphysical qualities” such as the tragic, the dreadful, the peaceful and so on, which characterize true works of art. The work of literature as a whole, thus, is a “polyphonic harmony,” much like a piece of polyphonic music in which each singer's voice may lend aesthetic qualities of its own to the value of the whole, while the greatest values of the work as a whole may lie in the intricate interrelations among the values of all of the individual elements.
A stratified theory like Ingarden's has considerable strengths. It provides a framework within which we can offer detailed analyses of literary works identifying their many sorts of value or disvalue, rather than simply passing judgment on the whole. As a result, many apparent conflicts in judgments of taste may be resolved without embracing subjectivism, by noting that the individuals concerned may be passing judgment on different strata of the literary work. It also enables us to understand stylistic differences among authors and over time as differences in which strata are emphasized and which de-emphasized, e.g. as many modernist works de-emphasize the traditionally foregrounded stratum of represented objects in favor of juxtaposed images at the level of schematized aspects (e.g. Virginia Woolf's The Waves), or even background both of these to the rhythms and sound patterns at the level of phonetic formations (e.g. Edith Sitwell's nonsense poetry). Yet we can do so without seeing such changes as forming a radical break or undermining the idea that these are all part of a continuous literary tradition.
In 1928, immediately after writing The Literary Work of Art, Ingarden expanded his analyses of the ontology of art from literature, to also discuss music, painting, and architecture in a series of essays originally intended as an appendix to The Literary Work of Art. As it happened, however, the appendix was not published along with The Literary Work of Art, and remained dormant until after the war, when (in 1946) essays on the picture and the architectural work were published in Polish. The three studies were expanded and finally published in German in 1961, along with an article on film, and were not translated into English until 1989. The late date of their release and the fact that they remain little known is a great shame, as they address many of the same ontological issues as those debated in ‘analytic’ aesthetics, and provide not only compelling arguments against many popular positions but also analyses of the ontological structure of works of various kinds unsurpassed in subtlety and detail.
The first three essays of The Ontology of the Work of Art, “The Musical Work,” “The Picture,” and “The Architectural Work” each attempt to determine the ontological status of the work of art in question, its relation to concrete entities such as copies of the score, sound events, painted canvasses or buildings, as well as to creative acts of artists and the conscious states of viewers. Each also examines whether and to what extent the form of art in question, like the literary work, may turn out to have a stratified structure.
The musical work, Ingarden argues, is distinct from experiences of its composer and listeners, and cannot be identified with any individual sound event, performance or copy of the score. But nor can it be classified among ideal entities, since it is created by a composer at a certain time, not merely discovered [Ontology, 4-5]. It thus apparently falls between categories such as the ‘real’ and the ‘ideal’, and so accepting the existence of musical works (like literary works) seems to require us to accept the existence of things in a category distinct from either of those -- that of purely intentional objects. The musical work is a purely intentional object with its ‘source of being in the creative acts of the composer and its ontic foundation in the score’ [Ontology, 91]. In itself, a traditionally scored work of Western music is a schematic formation full of places of indeterminacy (e.g. it may be indeterminate exactly how loudly a note is to be played, or how long it should be held), which are filled out differently in various performances. Unlike the literary work, however, the work of music is not a stratified entity, there being no essential representing function of the sounds of the musical work (unlike the sounds of a novel).
The picture, too, is a purely intentional object, created by an artist and founded both in a real painting (a paint-covered canvas), and in the viewer's operations of apprehending it. The picture as a work of art cannot be identified with the real paint-covered canvas hanging in a gallery, for the two have different properties and different modes of cognitive accessibility. The picture can only be seen, and indeed only seen from certain points of view; the painting, by contrast, can be seen, smelled, heard, or even tasted, and can be observed from any point of view. Ingarden also holds that the picture as such (unlike the painting) is not an individual object of any sort -- one and the same picture may be presented in many paintings (if they are all perfect copies of an original). (It might be worth noting that while this is plausible enough for the picture, considered as such, we do typically treat works of visual art as one-off individual objects (distinct from perfect copies or forgeries).) Moreover, the picture, to be seen, requires that viewers take up a certain cognitive attitude regarding it, not required to observe the painting.
“The Architectural Work” is perhaps the most interesting of the three major essays in the Ontology of the Work of Art, for it suggests how Ingarden's examination of works of art may be broadened out to form the framework for a general theory of social and cultural objects and their relations to the more basic physical objects posited by the natural sciences. The architectural work might seem to pose the crucial objection to Ingarden's view that works of art are ‘purely intentional objects’ having at least a foundation of their existence in the intentional states of their makers and viewers: “After all, the Notre Dame of Paris appears to be no less real than the many residential buildings that stand in its vicinity, than the island upon which it was built, the river that flows nearby, and so on” . Nonetheless, even in this case, Ingarden argues, the architectural work is not a mere independent ‘real’ object, although it is founded on one (the ‘heap of stones’ forming its physical basis). For its existence as an architectural work requires not only its creation by an architect (rather than its coming into existence as a mere natural formation), but also requires the ‘reconstructive acts of the viewer’ taking up a certain attitude towards the real object and helping co-constitute its aesthetic and even its sensible properties. The work of architecture is thus a doubly founded object, which “refers back not only to the creative acts of the architect and the reconstructive acts of the viewer, but also to its ontic foundation in a fully determined real thing shaped in a particular way” [Ontology, 263].
(The fact that even such purely intentional objects as works of art of various kinds are founded not exclusively in consciousness, but also (in various ways) on real spatio-temporal objects, is also an important part of Ingarden's arguments against idealism, suggesting that even if the proper mode of being for the world of experience was purely intentional being, that still would not be sufficient to show that all that exists is a pure product of consciousness.)
This situation for architecture parallels that for a great many of the social and cultural objects of our everyday experience in what Husserl called the ‘life-world’. As Ingarden emphasizes, a flag, for example, should not be identified with the mere piece of cloth of which it is fashioned, for it has different essential properties, and has an additional foundation in the mental acts of the community that accept it as a flag and endow it with meanings and embed it in norms of action (e.g. we are not to clean pots with it but to use it in rendering military honors). Similarly, a church is not identical with the real building on which it is founded, but rather is created only through acts of consecration and the preservation of appropriate attitudes in the relevant community. In virtue of its secondary dependence on acts of consciousness, the church is endowed with various (social and cultural) properties and functions that a mere ordered heap of building materials cannot have. In this way Ingarden provides the basis for an account of the nature of cultural and social objects that takes neither the reductionist route of identifying them with their physical bases, nor the subjectivist route of treating all objects as mere social constructions. The life-world takes its unique place as the common product of acts of consciousness and an independent real world, and its existence (in quite specific ways) presupposes that of both of those foundations.
In addition to his work on the ontology of art objects of various kinds, Ingarden also undertook general work on the ontological status of the aesthetic object and the nature of aesthetic values. On the object side, as we have seen he distinguishes in each case between the mere physical object and the work of art; but he also distinguishes both of these from what he calls the “concretization” (sometimes translated as “concretion”) of the work of art, which he considers to be the true ‘aesthetic object’. The work of art itself, in the case of most forms of art such as literature, painting, or music, is what Ingarden calls a “schematic formation.” That is, it has certain ‘places of indeterminacy’, many of which are filled in by an individual interpretation or ‘reading’ of the work. Thus in the case of literature, there are many places of indeterminacy at the level of character and plot -- unlike in the case of real people, it is often simply indeterminate what a literary character had for breakfast, how far she sat back from the table, what the table was made of, etc. Such indeterminacies are generally partially filled in by the reader in reconstructing the work, as the reader's background assumptions help (at least partially) flesh out the skeletal imaginary scene directly presented by the words of the text. Similarly, a representational painting generally leaves indeterminate, e.g., what the back of the person's head looks like in the case of a portrait, what they are thinking, or what happens immediately before or after the moment visually represented in paintings of historical events. Yet again, viewers' reconstructive acts typically supplement these indeterminacies in various ways, e.g. automatically grasping the lower right corner of Breugel's ‘Fall of Icarus’ as presenting the moment between a fall from the sky and the complete disappearance of the body under water (not, e.g., as presenting an attempt at an underwater handstand). Finally, in the case of music, a score leaves indeterminate various elements such as the precise timbre and fullness of tone, and these are filled out in different ways in different performances of the work. In each case, (at least partially) filling in the indeterminacies of the work through a reading, performance, or viewing renders the work more ‘concrete’. Each work of art permits of a variety of legitimate concretizations which, unlike the work of art itself, may vary from viewer to viewer. If the concretion occurs within the aesthetic attitude, an aesthetic object is formed [Selected Papers, 93], and so many aesthetic objects may be based on one and the same work of art.
Corresponding to this three-fold distinction between physical object, work of art, and aesthetic object, Ingarden posits a three-fold distinction among properties. While the mere physical object possesses only value-neutral physical properties, the work of art may possess both ‘axiologically neutral’ properties such as having a certain sentence structure or bearing patches of color arranged in certain ways, and artistic value qualities founded on these, such as clarity or obscurity of expression, technical mastery in the way the materials are worked, balance of composition, etc. Aesthetic values such as serenity, sublimity, profundity, etc., though they exist ‘potentially’ in the work of art, only manifest themselves in the aesthetic objects created through concretizing the work of art, and characterize the aesthetic object as a whole, although their appearance may depend on that of many particular properties of the work of art and physical object. Since various aesthetic objects may be based on one and the same work of art, these may also differ in their aesthetic values. This can, at least in part, help account for the variety of aesthetic judgments that may be formed apparently concerning the same work of art.
Yet as usual, Ingarden is concerned to account for the role of consciousness in constituting aesthetic values and the variations in aesthetic judgments without embracing a subjectivism that would deny that there is any better or worse in aesthetic judgment, each being a mere report of the pleasure experienced by the one judging. Such subjectivism is to be avoided by noting first, that some concretizations are better suited to the work's demands than others, more faithful, or better able to bring out the potential values in the work. A careful interpreter and evaluator can, through repeated contact with the work, come increasingly close to separating out idiosyncratic elements of her interpretations from what is proper to the work. Secondly, the aesthetic properties of the resulting concretization are not arbitrary inventions of the viewer, nor are they based on the pleasure she derives from the experience. Instead, their appearance simply requires a competent viewer to observe the work's neutral and artistic values in an aesthetic attitude. Thus here, as elsewhere, Ingarden's goal is ultimately to account for the legitimate role of consciousness in constituting many of the objects and properties experienced by us, while also avoiding a pure subjectivism or universal social constructivism by acknowledging the role of an independent ‘real’ world in founding the cultural objects and value properties we so often concern ourselves with in daily life.
A complete (as of 1985) bibliography of Ingarden's works in English, French, German and Polish and of secondary sources is available in the edition of Ingarden's Selected Papers in Aesthetics cited below.