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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Indexicals are linguistic expressions whose reference shifts from utterance to utterance. ‘I’, ‘here’, ‘now’, ‘he’, ‘she’, and ‘that’ are classic examples of indexicals. Two people who utter a sentence containing an indexical may say different things, even if the sentence itself has a single linguistic meaning. For instance, the sentence ‘I am female’ has a single linguistic meaning, but Fred and Wilma say different things when they utter it, as shown by the fact that Fred says something false, while Wilma says something true.
Philosophers have several reasons for being interested in indexicals. First, they wish to describe their meanings and fit them into a more general theory of meaning. Second, they wish to understand the logic of arguments containing indexicals, including, for instance, Descartes's Cogito and various skeptical arguments that contain ‘I’ and other indexicals. Third, they think that reflection on indexicals may give them some insight into such matters as the nature of belief, self-knowledge, and consciousness.
The indexicals that philosophers have studied most are the pronouns ‘I’, ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘this’, and ‘that’; the adverbs ‘here’, ‘now’, ‘actually’, ‘presently’, ‘today’, ‘yesterday’, and ‘tomorrow’; and the adjectives ‘actual’ and ‘present’. This list comes (more or less) from David Kaplan (1989a), whose work on indexicals is perhaps the most influential in the field.
An indexical's referent is determined, in part, by extra-linguistic context (for instance, the time and location of the speaker and the speaker's intentions). An indexical's referent can also vary from context to context. Thus indexicals are commonly called context-sensitive expressions. (The content of an indexical can also vary from context to context. This claim will be explained in section 3.1.)
Some of the expressions in Kaplan's list have non-indexical uses. ‘He’, ‘his’, ‘she’, ‘her’, and ‘that’ are sometimes used like bound variables in formal languages. For example, the occurrence of ‘he’ in (1) (on the relevant understanding) functions like a variable that is bound by the quantifier phrase ‘every man’. Similarly, ‘her’ in (2) (under the appropriate reading) is bound by ‘every girl’.
These same pronouns are also sometimes used anaphorically. That is, some of their utterances seem to depend for their reference on prior linguistic context. (See the entry on anaphora.) For example, ‘he’ appears to be used anaphorically in discourse (3).
Finally, there are the uses of these pronouns in which we shall be interested, the indexical (or demonstrative or deictic) uses, as in (4) and (5).
Most philosophers and linguists think that these different uses are closely related, and are not merely uses of distinct homonymous words. See section 5.4 for more on this topic. But in most of what follows, we shall ignore the non-indexical uses of these pronouns, and concentrate solely on their indexical uses.
Kaplan (1989a) distinguishes between two different sorts of indexical, pure indexicals and true demonstratives. The true demonstratives include ‘he’, ‘she’, ‘his’, ‘her’, and ‘that’, while the pure indexicals include ‘I’, ‘today’, ‘tomorrow’, ‘actual’, ‘present’, and (perhaps) ‘here’ and ‘now’. (More on ‘here’ and ‘now’ below.) The two types of indexical differ in how their references are determined. The reference of an utterance of a true demonstrative is determined (in part) by the speaker's accompanying actions or intentions. For example, the reference of an utterance of ‘that’ is determined (in part) by the speaker's accompanying pointing gestures, or by the speaker's intention to refer to a particular object. (See section 2 for more on the nature of reference-fixing for true demonstratives.) The reference of a pure indexical is not determined by the speaker's actions or intentions in this way. For instance, an utterance of ‘I’ refers to the speaker, whether or not she points at herself, and an utterance of ‘tomorrow’ refers to the day after the day of utterance, regardless of the speaker's intention to refer to some particular day. We can say (loosely speaking) that the reference of pure indexicals is automatic, whereas the reference of true demonstratives requires something extra from the speaker.
From here on, we shall use the term ‘demonstrative’ to mean true demonstrative, in the above sense. ‘Indexical’ shall be used here as a generic term, so that it encompasses both (true) demonstratives and pure indexicals.
Kaplan includes ‘here’ and ‘now’ in his list of pure indexicals, but this seems inaccurate. Every utterance of ‘now’ automatically refers to a time interval that includes the moment of utterance, but the extent of the time interval surrounding the moment of utterance differs radically from utterance to utterance. Consider, for example, a typical utterance of ‘I am ready to leave now’ and a typical utterance of ‘People now ride in cars rather than horse-drawn carriages’. The extent of the time interval seems to depend on the speaker's intentions. Similar remarks go for ‘here’ and the spatial extent of the location surrounding the location of utterance. Thus it seems that ‘here’ and ‘now’ are demonstratives rather than pure indexicals.
Our initial list of indexicals in English (basically, Kaplan's list) is incomplete. A complete list would include at least the plural expressions ‘we’, ‘those’, ‘they’, and ‘theirs’ (for discussion of plural indexicals, see Nunberg 1993). There are still more indexicals in English, but how many more is controversial.
Some philosophers and linguists (Reichenbach 1947, Partee 1973, Salmon 1989) claim that words and morphemes that indicate tense are indexicals, because (very roughly) they refer to different time intervals from context to context. Some have argued (Kratzer 1977, Lewis 1979b) that modal expressions, such as ‘necessarily’ and ‘possibly’, are indexical, because they vary in the type of modality they express from context to context (for example, nomological possibility in one context, metaphysical possibility in another). The subjunctive conditional connective "if it were the case that ... then it would be the case that ..." seems to be context-sensitive, because the range of possibilities relevant for determining the truth of such sentences seems to shift from context to context (see Lewis 1973, pp. 66-68). Utterances of ‘come’, ‘go’, ‘left’, and ‘right’ seem to invoke different points of reference, or different perspectives, in different contexts (see Fillmore 1972, 1975 and Lewis 1979b).
Some philosophers have claimed that propositional attitude verbs, like ‘believe’ and ‘know’, are indexicals. Richard (1990) claims that the sentences ‘Lois believes that Superman can fly’ and ‘Lois believes that Clark Kent can fly’ have the same truth value in some contexts, but different truth values in other contexts, though Lois undergoes no relevant changes. He argues that this occurs because, in different contexts, the verb ‘believes’ invokes different translation relations between the sentence inside the ‘that’-clause of the belief sentence and the sentences that the believer accepts; therefore, ‘believes’ expresses different relations in different contexts. (See the entry on propositional attitude reports.) Cohen (1988), DeRose (1995), and Lewis (1996) claim that the sentence ‘George knows that he has a hand’ can be false in a context in which the speaker is considering skeptical arguments, but can be true in another, more ordinary, context in which no skeptical arguments are under consideration, even though no relevant change occurs in George. They explain this by claiming that ‘know’ is an indexical that expresses different relations in different contexts, depending upon the relevant alternatives being considered in the speaker's context, or the standards of justification in force in the speaker's context.
The adjective ‘rich’ seems to be context-sensitive, for the truth value of ‘Myles is rich’ seems to vary from context to context, depending on which property or comparison class is salient in the context (for example, the class of all Americans, the class of philosophers, the class of university presidents, or the class of CEO's of large organizations). There are at least two competing accounts of this apparent context-sensitivity. On one, ‘rich’ is a unary predicate whose extension (and content) varies from context to context. On a second account, ‘rich’ is a binary predicate (x is rich for a y). Sometimes the second argument is linguistically supplied and pronounced, as in ‘Myles is rich for a philosopher’. But sometimes the second argument is unpronounced, as in ‘Myles is rich’, and in those cases, context supplies a property or comparison class to serve as the second argument of the binary predicate. The apparent context-sensitivity of other comparatives, such as ‘tall’, ‘large’, ‘heavy’, ‘hot’, and ‘fast’, might also be explained in either of these two competing ways. Some theorists (Partee 1989, Condoravdi and Gawron 1996) have argued in favor of the second sort of account for certain expressions that have indexical uses, such as ‘local’. In an utterance of ‘A local bar is selling cheap beer’, the utterance of ‘local’ refers to a location near the speaker. But in an utterance of ‘Every football fan watched the Superbowl at a local bar’, the utterance of ‘local’ does not refer to a location near the speaker. Rather, the utterance says that each football fan x watched the Superbowl at some bar that is local to x. This can be easily explained if ‘local’ has a second argument position (y is local to x) whose value is supplied by context in the first case, but which gets bound by the quantifier ‘every football fan’ in the second.
According to Stanley and Szabo (2000), all nouns have a hidden argument position that can be bound or contextually filled. They use this claim to explain how different utterances of a single sentence containing a quantifier phrase can (apparently) quantify over different domains. For example, the claim made by ‘Every student is present’ can vary from context to context: in some contexts, an utterance of it claims that every student who is in school S is present, while in other contexts, such an utterance claims that every student who is in class C is present. Stanley and Szabo's theory entails that every noun is an indexical (and, perhaps, that every adjective, verb, and adverb is also).
On some views, the extensions (and contents) of vague expressions shift from context to context. ‘Bald’ is a paradigm case of a vague expression. Lewis (1979b) and Soames (1999) hold that, if David has an appropriate number and distribution of hairs on his head, then ‘David is bald’ may be true in one context and false in another. Lewis and Soames explain this by holding that the extension of ‘bald’ varies from context to context; Soames holds that it expresses different properties in different contexts. Both of them extend this same view to all vague expressions. Since nearly every expression is vague, their views imply that nearly every expression is an indexical.
Summarizing: indexicality in English extends beyond Kaplan's list, though how far beyond is controversial. In what follows, however, we shall concentrate on uncontroversial cases, and mainly on the expressions in Kaplan's list.
One major topic of work on indexicals is reference-fixing for (true) demonstratives. As mentioned before, (true) demonstratives differ from pure indexicals, in that the reference of an utterance of a true demonstrative is not fixed "automatically" by the act of utterance alone. Something more is required to fix the reference of a demonstrative utterance. The nature of this "extra something" is controversial, but two obvious candidates are pointing gestures and speaker's intentions.
In his 1989a, Kaplan emphasizes the role of pointing gestures in fixing the reference of a demonstrative utterance. More precisely, he says that the reference of a demonstrative utterance is fixed by a demonstration. He describes a demonstration as "typically, though not invariably, a (visual) presentation of a local object discriminated by a pointing" (1989a, p. 490). Kaplan, however, changes his mind in his 1989b. He there points out that a demonstration is "typically directed by the speaker's intention to point at a perceived individual on whom he has focused". He calls such intentions directing intentions and then says that he has come to "regard the directing intention, at least in the case of perceptual demonstratives, as criterial, and to regard the demonstration as a mere externalization of this inner intention." (1989b, p. 582)
Other theorists hold other views. Devitt (1981) says that the referent of an utterance of ‘that’ is the item that stands in a certain causal relation to the utterance. McGinn (1981) proposes that the referent of an utterance of ‘that F’ is the first F to intersect the line projected from the speaker's pointing finger. Wettstein (1984) says that the reference of ‘that’ is determined by the cues that a competent and attentive addressee would reasonably take the speaker to be exploiting. Reimer (1991a, 1991b) argues, contra Kaplan's later view, that demonstrative utterances can refer to objects that are not the targets of the speaker's directing intentions. Bach (1992a, 1992b) defends a version of Kaplan's later view from Reimer's criticisms; Bach says that the reference of a demonstrative utterance is fixed by certain of the speaker's communicative intentions.
One prima facie problem for demonstration-theories is that some utterances of demonstratives seem to refer even though the speaker does not produce a demonstration (for instance, a pointing gesture). If ‘here’ and ‘now’ are demonstratives (as suggested earlier), then they may present a particular difficulty for demonstration-theories, for demonstrations seem irrelevant to determining the referents of their utterances.
One prima facie problem for intention-theories is that speakers typically have a large number of intentions when they use demonstratives, and these intentions may conflict (as Bach recognizes in his 1992a and 1992b; see also Perry 1997). For example, a speaker who utters ‘he’ may intend to speak about Joe, and about the man that she (the speaker) sees over there, and about the man about whom others are speaking, and about the man at whom she (the speaker) is pointing. The speaker may think that these are the same person when they are not. Different intention-theories can select different of these intentions as reference-fixing, and so make different predictions about who the referent is in certain cases. Not all intention theories have been completely clear about what they take the relevant reference-fixing intention to be.
Thus far, we have not tried to describe the meanings of indexicals in any systematic way. In this section, we present one theory that attempts to do so, namely Kaplan's theory. We begin with Kaplan's theory because (as mentioned before) it is perhaps the most influential in the field. We first present an example that motivates some of Kaplan's distinctions. We then present Kaplan's theory. In section 4, we consider a criticism of Kaplan's theory, and some alternatives to Kaplan's theory.
Many philosophers hold that indexicals have (at least) two different sorts of meaning. To see why, consider examples (6) and (7).
There is a clear sense in which Fred's utterance and Wilma's utterance share a meaning, for they utter the very same unambiguous sentence. Let's say that their utterances have the same linguistic meaning. Nevertheless, their utterances also seem to differ in meaning, in some sense, for Fred and Wilma say different things: Fred says that he is female, whereas Wilma says that she is female. Moreover, Fred says something that is false, while Wilma says something that is true. Traditionally, this difference in truth value would be taken to show that Fred and Wilma assert different propositions. In view of these considerations, let's say that Fred's and Wilma's utterances differ in content, where the content of an utterance of a full indicative sentence is a proposition.
So far, we have an intuitive distinction between two sorts of meaning for utterances of indexical sentences: linguistic meaning and content. The theories of meaning that we shall consider below, beginning with Kaplan's, attempt to describe these (apparent) meanings more systematically.
Some theorists, however, do not find the above intuitions and distinctions compelling. Lewis (1980), for instance, thinks that these intuitions are shaky, at best; he, in any case, questions their significance for semantic theory. Philosophers who eschew meanings altogether (such as those who favor Davidsonian theories of meaning) seek semantic theories that ascribe only extensions to indexical expressions (e.g., truth values to sentences, and referents to singular terms), with respect to contexts and (perhaps) other indices. These theorists would not take the extra step of hypothesizing the existence of propositions or other sorts of meanings. See, for example, Burge (1974), Weinstein (1974), Larson and Segal (1995), and Lepore and Ludwig (2000). Nevertheless, in most of what follows, we concentrate on theories of meaning for indexicals that try to respect the above distinctions and intuitions in the most straightforward way possible, by hypothesizing (at least) two sorts of meaning.
In Kaplan's theory, linguistic expressions have contents in, or with respect to, contexts. Each context has at least an agent, time, location, and possible world associated with it. The content of ‘I’ with respect to a context C is the agent of C; the content of ‘here’ is the location of C; and the content of ‘now’ is the time of C. The content of a predicate, with respect to a context, is a property or relation. The content of a sentence, with respect to a context, is a structured proposition, that is, a proposition that can have individuals, properties, and relations as constituents. The content of a sentence S with respect to C is made up of the contents of the words in S with respect to C.
To illustrate, consider the sentence ‘I am female’. Suppose that the agent of context C is Fred. Then the content of ‘I’ in C is Fred himself, while the content of ‘is female’ in C is the property being-female. The content of the whole sentence, in C, is a proposition whose constituents are just these two items. We can represent this proposition with the following ordered pair.
The content of ‘I’ with respect to a context C* in which Wilma is the agent is Wilma herself, and the content of ‘I am female’ in C* is the proposition <Wilma, being-female>. Thus the word ‘I’ and the sentence ‘I am female’ have different contents in different contexts.
The content of a sentence, with respect to a context, has a truth value at the world of the context. Kaplan therefore says that the content is either true or false in the context. For instance, the content of ‘I am female’, with respect to the above context C (in which Fred is the agent) is the proposition <Fred, being-female>. This proposition is false at the world of C (call this world ‘W’). So, Kaplan says that this proposition is false in context C. But the content of ‘I am female’ with respect to context C* (in which Wilma is the agent) is true with respect to the world of context C*, which is (also) W; so this second proposition is true in context C*.
On Kaplan's theory, we can also speak about the truth values of sentences, as opposed to contents (or propositions). The truth value of a sentence (as opposed to a proposition) depends on two parameters, context and world, on this theory. For example, the sentence ‘I am female’ is false with respect to C and W, but is true with respect to C* and W. (Notice that the world is the same both times, but the context is different.) Thus the sentence's truth value is doubly-relativized. This sort of double-relativization is often called double-indexing. (See Vlach 1973 and Kamp 1973 for early examples of semantic theories for indexicals that use double-indexing.)
The content of a sentence, with respect to a context, can be also evaluated for truth at a world other than the world of the context. For example, the content of ‘I am a philosopher’, with respect to C, is the proposition that Fred is a philosopher. This proposition is false at W (let's suppose). But this proposition is true at some other world, say W*, in which Fred is a philosopher. Thus, the sentence ‘I am a philosopher’ is false in C and W, but true at C and W*. (Notice that the context is the same both times, while the world is different.) Therefore, the sentence ‘It is possible that I am a philosopher’ is true with respect to C and W; and the content of the sentence, with respect to C, is true in C.
Kaplan identifies the linguistic meaning of an expression with its character, which is a function from contexts to contents that delivers the expression's content at each context. So, for example, the character of ‘I’ is a function on contexts whose value at any context is the agent of the context; its value at a context in which Fred is the agent is just Fred himself, whereas its value at a context in which Wilma is the agent is Wilma. The character of ‘here’ is a function whose value at each context C is the location of C. The character of a simple predicate, like ‘is female’, is a function on contexts that delivers the appropriate property or relation at every context (in this case, the character delivers the same property at every context, namely being-female). The character of a sentence is a function from contexts to the structured propositional content of that sentence at each context.
Kaplan's theory can be extended to other indexicals, including demonstratives, by adding further suitable features to contexts. For instance, if each context has an associated day, then we can say that the content of ‘today’ in a context is the day of the context, and that its character is a function on contexts whose value at each context is the day of the context. The content of ‘you’ with respect to a context is the addressee of the context. The content of ‘that’ in a context is the demonstatum of the context. If we wish to deal with sentences that contain more than one occurrence of ‘you’ or ‘that’, then we can add sequences of addressees and demonstrata to contexts, and add subscripts to occurrences of ‘you’ and ‘that’; for instance, the content of ‘you1’ is the first addressee of the context, the content of ‘you2’ is the second, and so on. (See section 5.2 for more on multiple occurrences of demonstratives.)
We began in section 3.1 with some intuitions about Fred's and Wilma's utterances in (6) and (7). It's important to note that utterances are not the same as linguistic expressions; this is shown by the fact that in (6) and (7), Fred and Wilma produce two utterances of one linguistic expression (the sentence ‘I am female’). Rather, utterances are actions in which an agent utters an expression. Kaplan's theory does not, strictly speaking, ascribe contents or characters to utterances. It instead ascribes characters to expressions and contents to expressions-in-contexts, which we can think of as pairs of expressions and contexts. So, strictly speaking, Kaplan's theory does not directly confirm or disconfirm our initial intuitions about the meanings of Fred's and Wilma's utterances.
We can, however, extend Kaplan's theory to utterances in a rather natural way. (In fact, Kaplan often seems to have the following kind of extension of his theory in mind when he uses judgments about utterances to motivate his view.) Kaplan's theory ascribes a character to the sentence that Fred and Wilma utter. So a natural extension of Kaplan's theory would ascribe that character to their two utterances of the sentence. Fred's utterance has a certain agent (Fred himself), and occurs at a certain time, place, and world. Kaplan's theory ascribes a content to the sentence ‘I am female’ with respect to a context with Fred as its agent, and with that associated time, place, and world. So a natural extension of Kaplan's theory could assign this content to Fred's utterance. Similarly, with appropriate changes, for Wilma's utterance. This extension of Kaplan's theory does confirm our intuitions about (6) and (7). (But this extension of Kaplan's theory also has some limitations; see sections 5.2 and 5.3 below.)
Kaplan's (1989a) formal theory contains an elaborate logic. We shall concentrate here on aspects of the logic that can be understood without going into formal details.
Recall that a sentence S is true in a context C iff the content of S in C is true in the world of C. So, for instance, if the agent of context C is Fred and the world of C is W, then ‘I am hungry’ is true in C if and only if the proposition that Fred is hungry is true in world W. Consider now the sentence ‘If I am hungry, then I am hungry’. This sentence is true in every context. Kaplan says that a logical truth is a sentence that is true in every context. Thus Kaplan's theory validates our intuition that this sentence is a logical truth. Kaplan says that an argument is valid iff: for every context C, if the premises of the argument are true in C, then the conclusion is true in C. Under this definition of validity, arguments (8) and (9) are valid.
Thus Kaplan's logic for indexicals might help us understand the logic of some philosophically interesting arguments. (For further discussion of the logic of indexicals and its relevance to Descartes's Cogito, see Forbes forthcoming.)
There are logical truths that are peculiar to indexical expressions in Kaplan's system. For instance, Kaplan supposes that, for any context, the agent of the context exists in the world of the context. Thus the sentence ‘I exist’ is true in every context, and counts as a logical truth. (Therefore, argument (8) is valid simply because its conclusion is valid. This may be relevant to the interpretation of Descartes's Cogito. See Forbes forthcoming.) Kaplan further supposes that for every context C, the agent of C is located at the time and place of C. Thus the sentence ‘I am here now’ is true in every context, and is a logical truth. (For critical discussion, see Vision 1985 and Salmon 1991.)
However, in most contexts, the contents of these sentences will be contingent, that is, true but not necessary. Consider the sentence ‘I exist’. It is a logical truth, according to Kaplan's theory. But its content with respect to a context in which Fred is the agent is the proposition that Fred exists. Since Fred could have failed to exist, this proposition is contingent. Thus, on Kaplan's theory, ‘I exist’ is a logical truth whose content, in many contexts, is contingent. (Similarly for ‘I am here now’.) Now if ‘I exist’ is a logical truth, then it's reasonable to think that Fred knows a priori the proposition that he expresses when he utters ‘I exist’ (at least when Fred considers the proposition in that way). If he does know this proposition a priori, then Fred has a priori knowledge of a contingent proposition. Kaplan thus claims that his logic of indexicals provides examples of Kripke's (1980) contingent a priori. (For discussion, see Salmon 1991 and Forbes 1989, forthcoming.)
Kaplan (1989a) claims that indexicals are devices of direct reference. By this he means that the content of an indexical, with respect to a context C, is simply the object to which it refers in C; its content is not a property (or descriptive condition) that determines the referent. For instance, the content of ‘I’ in C is just the agent of C; its content in C does not include the property of being-the-agent-of-C, or any other sort of property.
Kaplan (1989a) also says that indexicals are rigid designators. The notion of a rigid designator comes from Kripke (1980), who defines a rigid designator to be an expression that has the same extension (or referent) with respect to all possible worlds. When Kaplan claims that indexicals are rigid designators, he means (roughly) that, once a referent for an indexical is determined by a context, that same object is the one that is relevant for determining the truth value of a sentence containing that indexical at all worlds. For example, if Fred is the agent of context C, then Fred's state of hunger (and no one else's) is what is relevant for determining the truth of ‘I am hungry’ with respect to C and any world W whatsoever (whether or not W is the world of C, and whether or not Fred utters ‘I’ in W).
To state Kaplan's view more precisely, let's recall that we earlier spoke of both the content of a sentence with respect to a context, and the truth value of a sentence with respect to a context and a world (the truth value of the sentence was doubly-relativized). We can similarly speak of the content of a singular term with respect to a context, and its referent with respect to a context and a world. The definite description ‘the person who invented bifocals’ has the same content with respect to all contexts; this content includes the property of being-a-person, the relation of inventing, and so on. But the referent of ‘the person who invented bifocals’, with respect to a context and a world, varies from world to world, because the person who invented the bifocals varies from world to world. The situation is reversed for ‘I’, Kaplan claims. The content of ‘I’ varies from context to context: its content is Fred in one context, Wilma in another, and so on. But given a single context C, the referent of ‘I’ with respect to C and world W is the same for any world W whatsoever. For instance, if Fred is the content of ‘I’ with respect to context C, then the referent of ‘I’, with respect to C and any world W whatsoever, is Fred. Thus, for all worlds W, ‘I am hungry’ is true at C and W if and only if Fred is hungry in W. Therefore, Kaplan says that ‘I’ is a rigid designator.
Kaplan says that all directly referential expressions are rigid designators: if the content of an expression (at a context) is an individual, then that individual is the referent of that expression at that context and any world whatsoever. However, some rigid designators are not directly referential. For instance, the referent of the expression ‘the sum of 2 and 3’ with respect to any context and any world is the number 5, and so this expression is a rigid designator. But the expression ‘the sum of 2 and 3’ is not directly referential, for its content (in a context) is not simply an individual (like the number 5), but is instead a complex object whose constituents include the numbers 2 and 3, and the relation x-is-a-sum-of-y-and-z.
Kaplan's theory is by no means universally accepted. The most common objections to Kaplan's theory concern belief and cognitive significance. To understand the apparent problems, consider Fred's utterance in (10).
Let's suppose that Fred assertively utters the sentence. Then it seems that he asserts the proposition that his utterance expresses. If this proposition is the same as its (alleged) Kaplanian content, then he asserts the Kaplanian content. Furthermore, if Fred utters the sentence sincerely, then he believes the proposition that his utterance expresses. Now according to Kaplan's theory, the content of Fred's utterance is a singular proposition, that is, a proposition that contains an individual as a constituent, in this case Barney. Many philosophers think that singular propositions could not be the things that people believe, and so Kaplan's theory cannot account for the cognitive significance of indexicals. What follows is an example intended to show this.
Imagine that Fred is looking at Barney, but that Barney is turned so that Fred directly sees only his left side. Suppose that, at the same time, Fred is viewing Barney's right side indirectly, via a mirror. Suppose the right side of Barney's face is masked; suppose finally that Barney is wearing a very unusual costume, in which the left side appears to be a business suit while the right side appears to be a pair of swimming trunks. Then Fred might reasonably and sincerely utter (11), while addressing Barney and pointing at the mirror image.
On Kaplan's view, the content of Fred's utterance of (11) is a proposition that contains Barney as a constituent twice over. It is the proposition that Barney is wearing a business suit, but Barney is not wearing a business suit. Thus, on Kaplan's theory, Fred believes a contradictory proposition, one whose immediate constituents are a proposition and its negation. But Fred (let us suppose) is a perfectly rational person. So he would never believe an outright contradiction. Therefore, many philosophers conclude, Kaplan's theory of indexicals is incorrect.
The objection is a variant on Gottlob Frege's puzzle of cognitive significance (see also the entries on the sense/reference distinction, and propositional attitude reports). Frege (1892) uses puzzles like this to motivate his semantic theory, and so we might first look to him to find a solution to the problem. Frege (1984) contains a brief discussion of indexicals. One view that can be extracted from this article, together with Frege (1892), is the following. Utterances of expressions have both a referent and a sense. The sense of an utterance of a full sentence is a thought. A person who sincerely and assertively utters a sentence asserts and believes the thought (sense) expressed by that utterance. (Thus, sense plays roughly the same role in this Fregean theory that content does in Kaplan's.) The sense of an utterance of an indexical, like ‘you’, can also be expressed by an utterance of a definite description that contains no indexicals. The relevant definite description is one whose utterance would be cognitively equivalent, for the speaker, to the utterance of the indexical. The referent of the utterance of the indexical is the referent of the relevant definite description.
It is controversial whether Frege really held this theory about indexicals, especially the thesis that utterances of indexicals have senses that can be expressed by non-indexical definite descriptions. Nonetheless, let us call it Frege's theory
On Frege's theory, the sense of Fred's utterance of ‘you’ might also be expressed (roughly) by the definite description ‘the person wearing a business suit’. The sense of Fred's utterance of ‘he’ might be expressed (roughly) by ‘the person wearing swimming trunks’. Thus the thought expressed by Fred's utterance of the full sentence in (11) might also be expressed by ‘the person wearing a business suit is wearing a business suit, but the person wearing swimming trunks is not’. The thought expressed by the latter sentence is not contradictory. Therefore, Fred does not believe a contradiction, according to Frege's theory. Thus Frege's theory seems to solve the apparent problem with Kaplan's theory.
But Perry (1977) and Kaplan (1989a) have argued that there are problems with Frege's own theory. (For related discussion, see also Burks 1949 and Castaneda 1966, 1967.) Suppose that Fred sincerely utters ‘Today is July 4, 2001’ on July 3, 2001. According to Frege's theory, there is some non-indexical description that captures the sense of Fred's utterance of ‘today’. But, as Perry (1977) points out, Fred may find it very difficult to produce a non-indexical description that he would be willing to substitute for his utterance of ‘today’ and that uniquely picks out one day. (In fact, in the previous paragraph the definite descriptions that we substituted for Fred's utterances of ‘you’ and ‘he’ almost certainly do not have unique referents.) Moreover, Perry says, it's possible that any such description that Fred would provide would not refer to the same day as his utterance of ‘today’. For instance, Fred might be inclined to express the sense of his utterance of ‘today’ with the description ‘the day in 2001 during which Americans celebrate the signing of the Declaration of Independence’. If so, then Frege's theory entails that Fred's utterance of ‘today’ on July 3, 2001 refers to July 4, 2001. So Frege's theory entails that Fred's utterance of ‘Today is July 4, 2001’ is true, and that he asserts and believes a truth. But Fred's utterance is false (no matter how he is inclined to describe the day on which he produces his utterance), and he asserts and believes a falsehood. So Frege's theory is incorrect. Kaplan raises a related modal problem for Frege's view. Suppose that Fred utters ‘If I exist, then I am speaking’, and suppose that the sense of his utterance of ‘I’ can be expressed by ‘the person speaking’. Then on Frege's theory, Fred's utterance expresses the same sense as ‘If the person speaking exists, then the person speaking is speaking’. This expresses a necessary truth, but Fred's utterance clearly does not.
One further apparent difficulty with Frege's view is that two utterances containing indexicals would rarely, if ever, express the same sense (or have the same content, to use our previous terminology). Consider, for example, (12) and (13).
We are inclined to say that Fred's and Wilma's utterances say the same thing (in some sense). Furthermore, we think that Fred and Wilma (in some sense) assert and believe the same thing. Kaplan's theory validates these judgments, for their utterances have the same Kaplanian content, namely the singular proposition that Fred is hungry, and Fred and Wilma assert and believe that proposition. But it's highly unlikely that Fred's utterance and Wilma's utterance would express the same descriptive Fregean sense.
Schiffer (1978, 1981) avoids some of the problems with Frege's theory by allowing the relevant definite descriptions to contain the indexicals ‘I’ and ‘now’. For instance, on Schiffer's theory, Fred's utterance of ‘you’ in (11) might be cognitively equivalent, for him, to the description ‘the person whom I am now addressing’, while his utterance of ‘he’ might be cognitively equivalent to ‘the person whom I am now viewing in a mirror’. If so, then, on Schiffer's theory, Fred believes a singular proposition, but one that is not contradictory. Such a theory may avoid Perry's "wrong referent" objection, for the "I-now" description that Fred would use to replace ‘today’ would probably be something like ‘the day during which I am now speaking’, which would pick out the correct day. Kaplan's objection concerning ‘I’ and modality would be avoided, because an utterance of ‘I’ would have the speaker as its content. Schiffer avoids the problem of two utterances' never having the same content by distinguishing between the semantic content of an utterance and the proposition that the speaker believes. On Schiffer's view, Fred's utterance and Wilma's utterance have the same semantic content, namely the singular proposition that Fred is hungry. But Schiffer denies that Fred and Wilma believe the same singular proposition.
Schiffer, however, does not avoid all of the apparent problems raised above. On his view, two people will only very rarely believe the same proposition containing a contingent individual as a constituent. Moreover, Schiffer denies that we typically believe what we say; that is, we often do not believe the propositions that are the semantic contents of our utterances. Finally, Schiffer's view entails that certain utterances that seemingly express the speaker's contingently true beliefs actually express necessarily true beliefs. For instance, if the belief content that Fred expresses by uttering ‘you’ in (11) can be expressed by ‘the person whom I am now addressing’, then an utterance by Fred of ‘If you exist, then you are the person whom I am now addressing’ would express his belief in a necessarily true proposition; but it seems that he is expressing his belief in a contingent proposition. Austin (1990) presents further criticisms of this view.
Lewis (1979a) and Chisholm (1981) use examples like (11) to argue that people believe properties rather than propositions. These properties are roughly expressible by phrases or sentences containing ‘I’ and ‘now’. For example, according to Lewis and Chisholm, Fred in example (11) believes a property which might be expressed as follows: being a thing that addresses exactly one person, who is wearing business suit, and that views through a mirror exactly one person, who is not wearing a business suit. We might use ‘I’ and ‘now’ to express this property as follows: I am now addressing exactly one person, who is wearing a business suit, and viewing exactly one person through a mirror, who is not wearing a business suit. In many respects, Lewis's and Chisholm's theories of indexical belief are very similar to Schiffer's theory. (Their theories of meaning might not be alike: Chisholm, unlike Schiffer, holds that such properties are not only the objects of belief, but also the contents of utterances.) Thus Chisholm's and Lewis's theories are subject to some of the same difficulties as Schiffer's, as Austin (1990) points out.
Evans (1981) proposes that the content of an utterance of an indexical consists (roughly) of the speaker, or the time of utterance, together with a relation that resembles its Kaplanian character. On this view, Fred's utterance of ‘you’ in (11) is (roughly representable by) an ordered pair whose first member is Fred and whose second member is (roughly) the relation addressing. Together, the members of this pair gives us a property, being-a-thing-that-Fred-addresses, that picks out Barney. The content of Fred's utterance of ‘he’ in (11) consists of Fred plus (roughly) the relation demonstrating. This pair also determines a property that picks out Barney. Nevertheless, on Evans's view, Fred's utterance does not express a contradictory proposition. In some important respects, Evans's proposal resembles that of Schiffer, Lewis, and Chisholm, and may be subject to some of the same difficulties. For instance, on Evans's view there is no sense in which Fred and Wilma say or believe the same thing in examples (12) and (13). Evans's theory might also be vulnerable to modal objections similar to those that seemingly afflict these other theories, if the theory is filled out in certain natural ways.
Peacocke (1992) proposes a neo-Fregean theory according to which senses, or concepts (as he calls them), are primitive, irreducible entities. However, each concept can be uniquely identified by describing the conditions under which a thinker grasps that concept (that is, by describing conditions under which a person can entertain a proposition that contains that concept as a constituent). The indexical concepts fall into types, e.g., first-person concepts and perceptual demonstrative concepts. For instance, in example (11), Fred grasps both a ‘you’ concept and a ‘he’ concept. (If Fred were in a perceptually identical situation, but looking at Barney's twin rather than Barney, then Fred would be grasping different ‘you’ and ‘he’ concepts, though they would be similar in type.) We can uniquely describe the concept Fred grasps by saying what it takes for a person to grasp that concept (we will not attempt to describe those conditions here). Peacocke's theory avoids many of the objections to Frege's theory. However, Peacocke's theory entails that Fred and Wilma believe different propositions in example (12)-(13). It's not entirely clear whether Peacocke's theory is vulnerable to modal objections.
The above survey of alternatives to Kaplan's theory was initially motivated by an apparent problem that Kaplan's theory has with cognitive significance and belief. Let's now consider how adherents to Kaplan's theory have responded to this problem. Consider once again the example of Fred in (11).
The difficulty was that, on Kaplan's theory, Fred seems to assert and believe a contradictory singular proposition, one that contains the singular proposition that Barney is wearing a business suit, and the negation of that very same proposition.
In reply, Kaplan (1989a) and Perry (1979) hold that a singular proposition can be entertained and believed in different ways. These ways of entertaining and believing a proposition correspond to characters. Thus Kaplan says that an agent can believe a proposition under one character, but fail to believe it under another character. For instance, Fred in (11) believes the proposition that Barney is wearing a business suit under the character of ‘You are wearing a business suit’, but fails to believe that proposition under the character of ‘He is wearing a business suit’; in fact, Fred believes the negation of that proposition under the character of ‘He is not wearing a business suit’. On Kaplan's view, Fred really does believe a contradictory proposition, but he believes the conjuncts of this proposition under suitably different characters, which is why he still counts as rational.
Perry (1979) elaborates on this view by distinguishing between (i) the proposition that an agent believes and (ii) the belief state in virtue of which the agent believes that proposition. For any one proposition, there are many belief states that would enable an agent to believe that proposition. An agent can be in one of these belief states, while failing to be in another. Belief states can be classified into types according to the characters of the sentences that they dispose the agent to assert. For instance, a belief state that would cause an agent to sincerely assert ‘You are wearing a business suit’ is distinct from a belief state that would cause him to sincerely assert ‘He is wearing a business suit’, because the two sentences differ in character. A rational agent could be in a belief state of the first type without being in a belief state of the second type. In fact, a rational agent could be in the first sort of belief state, while also being in a second sort that causes him to utter ‘He is not wearing a business suit’. Thus a rational agent could believe a proposition and its negation, as long as he does so by being in suitably different belief states.
Kaplan's response leaves us with the question "What does it mean to believe a content under a character?" Perry's postulation of belief states is a first step towards answering the question, but his work leaves the nature of belief states relatively unclear. Both Kaplan and Perry think that ways of believing either are, or correspond one-to-one with, characters. This assumption is problematic. We can easily imagine that Fred, while viewing Barney, says ‘He [pointing directly at Barney] is wearing a business suit, but he [pointing at the mirror] is not’. If the two occurrences of ‘he’ have the same character, then, on Kaplan's and Perry's view, Fred rationally believes a proposition under one character and the negation of that same proposition under the "negation" of that same character. This is exactly the sort of situation that Kaplan's and Perry's view should disallow. For further discussion and criticisms, see Wettstein (1986), Taschek (1987), and Crimmins (1992, chapter 1). For elaborations on, and modifications of, the Kaplan-Perry theory, see Perry (1997). See also section 5.2 for related issues.
In this section, we discuss a variety of additional issues about indexicals.
Complex demonstratives are expressions of the form that N or this N, where N is a common noun phrase. Examples include ‘this dog’, ‘that red car’, and ‘that woman who is standing by the door’. Complex demonstratives raise at least two interesting questions. First, do the common noun phrases that appear in them play some role in determining their referents? For example, must a person be a crook in order to be the referent of an utterance of ‘that crook’? Second, what do these common noun phrases contribute to the contents of complex demonstratives? For instance, does an utterance of ‘That crook is untrustworthy’ express a proposition that has the property of being-a-crook as a constituent? Or does the phrase ‘that crook’ contribute only its referent to the proposition expressed?
Many (though not all) theories of complex demonstratives can be classed into three types, according to how strong a semantic role they attribute to the common noun phrases. The first type says that the common noun phrase in a complex demonstrative plays no semantic role in determining the referent of the complex demonstrative; so a person could be the referent of an utterance of ‘that crook’ even if she is not a crook. Furthermore, this type of view says that the content of the common noun phrase is not a constituent of the content of the complex demonstrative; the content of an utterance of a complex demonstrative is just its referent. The common noun phrase serves merely as a pragmatic cue that helps the speaker's audience figure out what the speaker's intended referent is. Call theories of this sort minimal theories, because they assign a minimal, or non-existent, semantic role to the common noun phrase. Larson and Segal (1995) endorse (roughly) a minimal theory (they do not, however, accept the existence of Kaplan-style contents).
Theories of the second type say that the common noun phrase does help determine the referent, but say that its content does not appear as a constituent of the content of the complex demonstrative. On such views, a person must be a crook in order to be the referent of an utterance of ‘that crook’, but the property of being-a-crook is not a constituent of the complex demonstrative's content. The content of the complex demonstrative is just its referent. Kaplan (1989a) does not explicitly endorse this type of theory, but his incidental remarks about complex demonstratives suggest that he would favor it. Braun (1994) and Borg (2000) argue explicitly for this sort of view. Call theories of this sort intermediate theories.
Theories of the third type say that the common noun phrase helps determine the referent; moreover, the content of the common noun phrase appears as a constituent of the content of the complex demonstrative. Richard (1993) and King (2000) endorse views of this sort. (King holds, in addition, that complex demonstratives are quantifier phrases that are comparable, in many respects, to definite descriptions.) Let's call theories of this sort maximal theories.
Advocates of minimal theories describe cases in which a speaker apparently refers to a person with an utterance of ‘that crook’, even though the person is not a crook. But advocates of intermediate and maximal theories reply by distinguishing between speaker referent and semantic referent (see Kripke 1977): they say that, in such cases, the speaker refers to the non-crookish person, but the speaker's utterance does not semantically refer to that person. Some advocates of maximal theories claim that sentences like (14) are logically or analytically true, whereas (they claim) this would not be so on minimal and intermediate theories, because those theories say that the content of the common noun phrase is not part of the content of the proposition expressed.
Advocates of intermediate views respond by admitting that (14) is true in all contexts (ignoring reference failure). But (they claim) this is not because the content of ‘crook’ is part of the content of the complex demonstrative. Rather, (14) is true in all contexts because ‘that crook’ refers in a context to a person only if the relevant person is a crook in the world of that context. Therefore, if the antecedent of (14) is true in a context, then so is its consequent. Intermediate theorists point out that (15) seems to be false in many contexts, which seems contrary to maximal theories.
Maximal theorists, however, sometimes add rigidifying devices to the contents of complex demonstratives to avoid this difficulty. They furthermore point to cases of apparent quantification into complex demonstratives, which seem to present a difficulty for intermediate theories.
Obviously, the issues and arguments here are quite complicated. Moreover, intuitions about the relevant cases are often unstable. For further discussion, see the works mentioned above. See also Dever (2001) and Lepore and Ludwig (2000), whose views do not fit easily into the above classification scheme.
Kaplan's theory has an apparent problem with sentences that contain multiple occurrences of the same demonstrative. The problem can be presented as an argument from Kaplanian premises to apparently false conclusions, as follows. The demonstrative ‘that’ has a single linguistic meaning. So every occurrence of ‘that’ has the same linguistic meaning. If Kaplan's theory is correct, then the linguistic meaning of an expression is its character. Thus, if Kaplan's theory is correct, then every occurrence of ‘that’ has the same character. Thus both occurrences of ‘that’ in sentence (16) have the same character.
But if the two occurrences of ‘that’ in (16) have the same character, then they have the same referent and content in every context. Thus, (16) is false in every context. But this is surely incorrect. If we extend Kaplan's theory to utterances in the natural way suggested in section 3.2, we get the clearly absurd result that no utterance of (16) is true.
Kaplan seems to try to escape this consequence by, in effect, making the word ‘that’ ambiguous. On one version of his theory, the single word ‘that’ is replaced with the subscripted expressions ‘that1’, ‘that2’, etc. The content of ‘that1’ in a context is the first demonstratum of the context, the content of ‘that2’ is the second demonstratum, and so on. Thus (17) is true in contexts in which the first demonstratum is distinct from the second.
However, each subscripted ‘that’ has a different character (which is perhaps why Kaplan [1989b] sometimes speaks of the "exotic ambiguity" of demonstratives). None of these characters is a reasonable candidate for being the linguistic meaning of the (unsubscripted) English word ‘that’. So the subscript-maneuver undercuts Kaplan's identification of linguistic meaning with character.
There are several ways in which one might try to deal with this problem. One is to allow shifts in context in mid-sentence. We could allow the content of ‘that’ in a context to be the demonstratum of the context. We could then suppose that the two occurrences of ‘that’ in (16) are (always or sometimes) evaluated for content in different contexts that may have different demonstrata. Unfortunately, this option may wreak havoc with the logic of demonstratives; it may, for instance, undermine attempts to allow argument (9) (in section 3.3) to be valid. A second option is to give up the identification of linguistic meaning with character, and suppose instead that linguistic meaning is a third sort of meaning, distinct from both character and content. A third option is to move away from a Kaplan-style theory, which assigns contents to expressions-in-contexts, and move to a theory that assigns contents to utterances. This might help because every utterance of (16) contains two utterances of ‘that’. There are almost certainly other options. For further discussion, see Kaplan (1989b, 1999), Wettstein (1986), Braun (1996), Garcia-Carpintero (1998), Richard (1992, forthcoming), Forbes (forthcoming), and section 5.3 below.
As mentioned earlier, an utterance is an action (a sort of event) in which an agent utters an expression. Kaplan's theory does not, strictly speaking, assign contents to utterances. Rather, it assigns contents to expressions-in-contexts, which we can think of as pairs of expressions and contexts. There are many expressions-in-contexts for which there is no corresponding utterance. For instance, consider a context in which Fred utters ‘I am wearing a business suit’, and nothing else, at a particular time, place, and world. Even though Fred does not utter ‘I am hungry’ at that time, place, and world, there is still an expression-in-a-context consisting of that sentence together with a context which has Fred as its agent, and which has that time, location, and world associated with it. Kaplan's theory assigns a content to this expression-in-a-context (namely, the proposition that Fred is hungry) even though Fred does not utter the expression at that time, place, and world. That content even has a truth value in that context. Thus Kaplan's theory of indexicals "abstracts away" from utterances to a remarkable degree.
Kaplan (1989a, 1989b) claims that his abstract, expression-based, theory of indexicals has various advantages, especially when it comes to logic. First, Kaplan claims that his expression-theory classifies as logical truths all sentences that should be logical truths, whereas utterance-theories do not. Consider, for example, sentences of the form If P then P. All such sentences are logical truths, Kaplan claims, and are so-classified on Kaplan's theory. But now consider a sentence of this form in which P is an extremely long sentence containing ‘today’. Then there may be utterances of this sentence in which the utterance of the antecedent is true, while the utterance of the consequent is false, simply because the first utterance of P has taken more than one day to complete. If a sentence is logically true iff all of its utterances are true, then this sentence is not a logical truth, even though it has the form If P then P. But this seems incorrect. Second, Kaplan claims that his approach correctly labels some sentences as not logically true which would be incorrectly labeled as logically true on utterance-based theories. For instance, on Kaplan's abstract approach, the sentence ‘I am uttering something’ is not a logical truth, because it is false with respect to contexts in which the agent of the context is silent. But all utterances of this sentence are true, so if logical truth were taken to be truth-of-all-utterances, then this sentence would be (incorrectly) classified as a logical truth.
However, there also seem to be disadvantages to Kaplan's expression-based theory. As Kaplan (1989b) notes, there are serious difficulties in assigning contents to true demonstratives with respect to contexts in which the agent does not have any relevant directing intentions and produces no demonstrations. Suppose, for example, that when Fred utters ‘I am wearing a business suit’ at time T, location L, and world W, he does not point at any object and does not intend to refer demonstratively to any object. Then it will be very difficult to assign a content to ‘That is a dog’ with respect to a context that has Fred as its agent, and which has T, L, and W as its associated time, place, and world. Moreover, Kaplan's apparent problem with multiple occurrences of demonstratives is at least partly due to his assigning contents to expressions-in-contexts.
Other theorists prefer more utterance-oriented approaches to indexicals: see, for instance, Reichenbach (1947), Burks (1949), Weinstein (1974), and Barwise and Perry (1983). Perry (1997) argues for the advantages of theories that focus primarily on utterances. Kaplan himself (Kaplan 1999) has recently taken a more positive view of utterance-based theories. For further discussion, see Braun (1996), Garcia-Carpintero (1998) and Forbes (forthcoming).
As mentioned in section 1.2, many of the expressions that can be used as demonstratives, such as ‘he’ and ‘she’, can also be used anaphorically and in ways similar to bound variables in formal languages. This presents a difficult challenge to semanticists. On the one hand, there are significant semantic differences between variables, anaphora, and demonstratives: for instance, the content of a demonstrative is determined by a speaker's intentions or demonstrations, while the content of a (free) variable is determined arbitrarily by an assignment of values to variables. But, on the other hand, it seems that ‘she’ is an unambiguous expression, which has a single linguistic meaning. The challenge for semanticists is to describe the linguistic meaning of ‘she’ without slighting the significant semantic differences between its various use. (Similarly for ‘he’, ‘his’, ‘her’, and so on.)
Many theorists have discussed aspects of this problem, but it is unclear whether any have fully met the challenge. Kaplan (1989a, 1989b) emphasizes the semantic similarities between (on the one hand) free variables under assignments and (on the other hand) demonstratives in contexts. But he backs away from identifying the linguistic meanings of ‘he’ and ‘she’ with the linguistic meanings of variables (with appropriately restricted ranges); he even entertains the possibility that there are two homonymous expressions ‘he’, one of which is a demonstrative and the other of which is a variable. Other theorists (for instance, Heim and Kratzer 1998, chapter 9) assimilate demonstratives to free variables. Those who work on discourse representation theory and dynamic semantics emphasize the similarities between variables and some anaphoric uses of pronouns. (See, for example, Kamp and Reyle 1993 on discourse representation theory, and Chierchia 1992 on dynamic semantics; see also the entry on anaphora.) For related discussion, see Partee (1989) and Condoravdi and Gawron (1996).
For useful overviews, see Forbes (1989, forthcoming), Perry (1997), and Richard (1992, forthcoming).