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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Incompatibilist accounts that have been offered are of three main types, differing with respect to which form of indeterminism (uncaused events, nondeterministically caused events, agent- (or substance-) caused events) they require. Further variations among accounts concern where in the processes leading to actions they require indeterminism and what other conditions besides indeterminism they require. The first three sections below examine recent versions of each of the three main types of incompatibilist view. The fourth section considers the evidence regarding whether in fact there does exist what any of these accounts characterizes.
Proponents of noncausal views generally hold that every action is or begins with a mental action. A decision or a choice is typically held to be an example of an action that is just such a mental action. An overt bodily action, such as raising one's arm, is held to be a complex action consisting of a mental action's bringing about a certain motion of one's body. The mental action here is often called a volition, which is said to be the agent's willing, trying, or endeavoring to move a certain part of her body in a certain way.
Ginet (1990) and McCann (1998) have set out the most fully developed recent noncausal views of free will. Other recent views of this type are advanced by Goetz (1988 and 1997) and McCall (1994: ch. 9).
Both Ginet and McCann hold that some event involving an agent is a basic action in virtue of its possessing some intrinsic feature. On Ginet's view, the feature in question is an "actish phenomenal quality," which he describes as its seeming to the agent as if she is directly producing the event that has this quality. McCann holds that the feature that characterizes these basic actions is intrinsic intentionality. For example, when one makes a decision, he holds, intrinsic to the decision is one's intending to make that very decision. (E.g., when one decides to A, one intends to decide to A.) One's so intending is not a matter of the content of the intention that is formed in deciding, nor is it a matter of one's having any further intention in addition to that formed in making the decision. Rather, McCann holds, it is a matter of a decision's being, by its very nature, an exercise of agency.
As is characteristic of proponents of noncausal accounts, neither Ginet nor McCann place any additional positive requirements on free action; the further requirements are instead that certain conditions be absent. Both require that the action not be causally determined. Ginet requires, further, that in performing the action, the agent not be subject to irresistible compulsion.
Two main problems arise for noncausal accounts of free will; both are problems, in the first instance, for noncausal accounts of action. The first concerns control. Performing an action, even acting unfreely, is exercising some variety of active control over one's behavior. Acting freely is exercising an especially valuable variety of active control. An account of free decision or other free action ought to say what this latter variety of control is or in what it consists. A common objection is that noncausal accounts fail to meet this requirement.
The second main problem concerns rationality. Acting freely is acting with a capacity for rational self-governance and determining, oneself, whether and how one exercises that capacity on a given occasion. Hence it must be possible for a free action to be an action performed for a certain reason, an action for which there is a rational explanation. Again, it is often objected that noncausal views cannot provide adequate accounts of these phenomena.
On Ginet's view, the single positive characteristic present in all actions is the actish phenomenal quality, its seeming to the agent as if she is directly making happen the event that is her action. But it cannot be true, he holds, that we are agent-causes of our actions, nor need it be the case that any events involving us cause them. Ginet stresses that his description of this quality is metaphorical; the experience does not literally represent to the agent that she is bringing about the event in question.
Whatever the correct characterization of this phenomenal quality, it may be objected that the mere feel of a mental event, although it may be a (more or less reliable) sign of an individual's active control over that event, cannot itself constitute such control. The objection is reinforced by the fact that, on Ginet's view, an event with this quality could be brought about by external brain stimulation, in the absence of any relevant desire or intention in the "agent."
McCann holds that an agent's exercise of control has two aspects: it is a spontaneous, creative undertaking on the part of the agent, and it is intrinsically intentional. Causal theorists of action deny that the intentionality of, say, one's acquisition of an intention when one makes a decision can be intrinsic to that event. McCann observes that it is impossible for a decision to be unintentional, and he concludes from that observation that the intentionality must then be intrinsic to the decision. However, as Mele (1997) points out, an alternative explanation of this impossibility is available. For something to count as a decision, a causalist may hold, one's acquisition of an intention (to pursue some more or less specific course of action) must be caused, in an appropriate way, by one's having an intention to make up one's mind about what to do. Given the requirement of such a causal history, the causalist alternative continues, necessarily any event that is a decision is intentional. But this says nothing about the intrinsic features of decisions (any more than the fact that nothing counts as sunburn unless it is caused by the sun says anything about the intrinsic features of the burns that are so-caused).
The spontaneity of actions, McCann holds, "has a certain sui generis character that renders it incapable of being reduced to anything else" (p. 185). Such a claim suggests that no explication of active control is possible. This might be so if active control is a metaphysically simple phenomenon, a fundamental feature of the world. Causalists may object here that active control is comprehensible only as a causal phenomenon. Further, if active control is a simple phenomenon, then it would be emergent, a higher-level phenomenon appearing only in mentally sophisticated beings and yet not constituted by any lower-level phenomena. The question then arises whether there is evidence that there exist any such emergent, higher-level, metaphysically basic phenomena.
Suppose that S wants her glasses, which she has left in her friend R's room, where he is now sleeping. S also wants to wake R, because she desires his company, but she know that R needs some sleep, and hence she desires, too, not to wake him. S enters R's room and retrieves her glasses, knowing as she does so that her action will satisfy her desire to wake R. What further facts about the situation could make it the case that S acts on her desire to get her glasses, and that citing that desire provides a true rational explanation of her action, while she does not act on her desire to wake R, and citing this latter desire does not give us a true rational explanation of what she did? Ginet maintains that the following conditions suffice for the truth of the explanation that cites S's desire to get her glasses:
(a) prior to entering the room, S had a desire to get her glasses, andCiting S's desire to wake R will fail to give us a true rational explanation, Ginet holds, just in case S did not intend of her action that it satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire.
(b) concurrently with her entering the room, S remembered that prior desire and intended of her entering the room that it satisfy (or contribute to satisfying) that desire.
Several objections may be raised against this account. Suppose that S's desire to get her glasses played no role at all in bringing about her action, while her desire to wake R, of which she was fully aware when she acted, did play such a role. Causalists (see, e.g., Mele (1992: ch. 13)) will then deny that S really acted on her desire to get her glasses and that citing it truly explains her action. Moreover, Ginet's memory condition may not be necessary. If S's desire to get her glasses is retained and remains fully conscious while she acts, there may be no need for her to remember it in order for her to be acting on it. Further problems attend the concurrent intention that is required. (McCann (1998: 162-63) raises some of these difficulties.) First, the required intention is a second-order attitude, an attitude about (among other things) another of the agent's own attitudes (a certain desire of hers). But it seems that S might act on her desire to get her glasses even if her only intention when she enters the room is to retrieve her glasses. Second, the concurrent intention to which Ginet appeals is said to make direct (or demonstrative) reference to the action, and Ginet holds that such direct reference requires that the intention be caused by the action (or at least by some initial segment of it). If that is so, then at least some part of the action has occurred before the concurrent intention is acquired. It does not then seem that the acquisition of that intention can figure in an account of what, if anything, rationally explains that part of the action. Finally, intention-acquisitions themselves can be explained by citing reasons. Since Ginet's account of the rational explanation of an action appeals to an intention, the question arises what can be said about the rational explanation of the acquisition of that intention. Repeating the same sort of account here would generate a regress, and Ginet offers no other sort.
On McCann's view, an agent decides for a certain reason, and citing that reason rationally explains the decision, just in case, in cognizance of that reason, and in an intrinsically intentional act of intention formation, the agent forms an intention the content of which reflects the very goals presented in that reason. When S decides to enter R's room, for example, she decides for the reason of getting her glasses only if the intention that she forms in making that decision is an intention to enter for the sake of getting her glasses. But such correspondence between the reasons for which one decides and the content of the decision may be too much to require. S may want her glasses so that she can finish reading a certain novel, which she may want to do so that she can contribute to the discussion in her book club tomorrow. Finishing the novel and getting ready for tomorrow's discussion may be among the reasons for which she decides to enter the room even if they are not included in the content of her decision. Finally, there will again be a clash of intuitions here between causalists and noncausalists, with the former maintaining that if S's desire to get her glasses plays no role at all in bringing about her decision, then even if the content of her decision is to enter for the sake of getting her glasses, she does not really decide for that reason and citing it does not truly explain her decision. (One does not, the objection goes, make it so just by intending it to be so, no even by intrinsically intentionally intending it to be so.)
We have considered problems for noncausal accounts of action. However, since the noncausal views examined here place no positive requirements on free action beyond those that are placed on action, if they fail as adequate accounts of action, then a fortiori they fail as adequate accounts of free action.
One common objection against such a view is that the indeterminism that it requires is destructive, that it would diminish the control with which an agent acts. A second common objection is that the required indeterminism is gratuitous, that it adds nothing of value. We shall examine these objections below. First, let us consider a type of event-causal nondeterministic account that is advocated by writers who accept a qualified version of the first of these objections.
Overt action is sometimes preceded by a decision, and decision is sometimes preceded by a deliberative process in which the agent considers reasons for and against alternatives and makes an evaluative judgment concerning which alternative is best (or better or good enough). Focusing on decisions that follow such deliberation, Mele advances a view that allows (but does not require) the deterministic causation of the decision by the making of the judgment, and of the overt action by the decision. Indeterminism is required only at an earlier stage of the deliberative process. For example, the account is satisfied when it is undetermined which of a certain subset of the agent's nonoccurrent beliefs come to mind in the process of deliberation, where their coming to mind combines with other events to bring about the agent's evaluative judgment. (The subset in question consists of "beliefs whose coming or not coming to mind is not something that one would control even if determinism were true" (1995: 216).)
Mele argues that indeterminism of the sort required here does not diminish, at least not to any significant extent, "proximal control," a variety of control that is compatible with determinism. The required indeterminism nevertheless suffices, he holds, to provide the agent with "ultimate control" over her decision, which an agent has only if at no time prior to the decision is there any minimally causally sufficient condition for the agent's making that decision that includes no event or state internal to the agent.
In Ekstrom's account, the notion of preference, rather than that of an evaluative judgment, plays a prominent role. A preference, as she understands it, is a desire "formed by a process of critical evaluation with respect to one's conception of the good" (p. 106). The formation of a preference, she maintains, is an action. She requires indeterminism only in the production of these preferences. A decision or subsequent action is free, on her view, just in case it is brought about, in an appropriate way, by an active formation of a preference (favoring that decision or action), which preference-formation is in turn the result of an uncoerced exercise of the agent's evaluative faculty, the inputs to which (the considerations taken up in deliberation) nondeterministically cause the preference-formation.
Ekstrom holds that an agent is her preferences and acceptances (reflectively held beliefs), together with her faculty of forming these by reflective evaluation. When the formation of a preference is nondeterministically caused and it deterministically causes a decision and subsequent action, then, a preference that partly constitutes the agent, that is generated by an evaluative faculty that partly constitutes the agent, and that the agent could have prevented (by not forming that preference) causally determines the decision and subsequent action. What the agent does is then, Ekstrom holds, up to her.
Mele's and Ekstrom's views both allow that a free decision or other free action may be causally determined by events none of which are free actions. Indeed, on pain of regress, both must allow that a free decision or other free action may be causally determined by events none of which are free actions and to none of which has the agent contributed by her performance of any free action. (A familiar regress would be generated if, in order for a decision or other action to be free, it were required that it result from the making of an evaluative judgment or the formation of a preference that was either itself a free action or to which the agent had contributed by her performance of some other free action.) Incompatibilists will typically not allow such a thing. Hence, an incompatibilist who finds either of these views acceptable will have something other than the typical incompatibilist's reasons for rejecting compatibilism.
A free decision or other free action, Kane holds, is one for which the agent is "ultimately responsible." Ultimate responsibility for an action requires either that the action not be causally determined or, if the action is causally determined, that some (nonredundant) part of any determining cause of it either be or result from some action by that agent that was not causally determined (and for which the agent was ultimately responsible). Thus, on Kane's view, an agent may be ultimately responsible for a decision that is causally determined by factors that include her having certain character traits. But somewhere among the events that contributed (however indirectly) to those traits, and thus to her decision, there must have been some actions by her that were not causally determined. Kane calls such "regress-stopping" actions "self-forming actions." All self-forming actions, he argues, are acts of will; they are mental actions. He thus calls them "self-forming willings," or SFWs. Kane identifies six different types of SFWs, giving the most detailed treatment to what he calls moral choices or decisions and prudential choices or decisions. We shall focus here on the former; the two are sufficiently similar that the points made here can be easily transferred to the latter.
In a case of moral choice, there is a motivational conflict within the agent. She believes that a certain type of thing morally ought to be done (and she is motivated to do that), but she also has a self-interested desire to perform an action of a type that is, in the circumstances, incompatible with her doing what she believes she ought to do. Given her commitment to her moral belief, she makes an effort of will to resist temptation, an effort "to get [her] ends or purposes sorted out" (1996: 126). If the choice is to be a SFW, then it is required that the strength of this effort be indeterminate; Kane likens its indeterminacy to that of the position or momentum of a microphysical particle. And the effort's indeterminacy is held to be the source of the required indeterminism in the causal production of the choice. Again an analogy is drawn with microphysics. Just as whether a particle will penetrate a barrier may be undetermined because the particle's position and momentum are not both determinate, so "[t]he choice one way or the other is undetermined because the process preceding and potentially terminating in it (i.e., the effort of will to overcome temptation) is indeterminate" (1996: 128).
Kane further requires that any choice that is a SFW satisfy three plurality conditions. These require that the choice be made for reasons (which Kane takes to consist partly in the choice's being caused by the agent's having those reasons) and that it not be a result of coercion or compulsion. Each plurality condition also requires that, when the agent makes the choice, she wants more to act on the reasons for which she makes that choice than she wants to act on any competing reasons. An agent wants more to act on certain reasons, he holds, when her desire to act on those reasons has greater motivational strength than have any desires she has to act on competing reasons, and when it is settled in the agent's mind that those reasons, rather than her reasons for doing otherwise, are the ones that she will now and in the future act on. This wanting more to act on certain reasons is, on Kane's view, brought about by the choice in question. Finally, the plurality conditions require that, whichever choice is made, there have been at least one alternative choice that the agent was able to make such that, had she made it, it too would have satisfied the previously stated conditions.
In a situation of moral conflict, Kane maintains, the requirements for being a SFW may be satisfied by either choice that is made--the choice to do what one believes one ought to do or the choice to do what one is tempted to do. Where this is so, whichever choice the agent makes, she has chosen for the reasons that she wants more to act on, free from coercion and compulsion. If she has chosen to do what she believes she ought to do, then her choice is the result of her effort. If she has chosen to do what she was tempted to do, then she has not allowed her effort to succeed. Whichever choice she has made, she could have made the other. She is then ultimately responsible for the choice she has made.
Kane's requirement that the causation of a choice that is a SFW be nondeterministic has drawn the objection that indeterminism located here would diminish the agent's control over the making of the choice. The objection is often couched in terms of a problem of luck. (It is so developed by Haji (1999), Mele (1998, 1999a, and 1999b), and Strawson (1994).) If the agent's effort of will nondeterministically causes her choice, then, whichever choice the agent makes, there was, until the occurrence of that choice, a chance that it would not occur. If the agent's effort to chose in accord with her moral judgment happens to succeed, the objection goes, then her choice is at least partly due to good luck. In another possible world, with exactly the same laws of nature and exactly the same in its course of events up until the occurrence of the choice, the agent's (or her counterpart's) effort fails; there, but for good luck, goes she. And analogously, if, in the actual world, the agent's effort fails, then her choice is at least partly due to bad luck. Either way, the choice is to some degree due to luck. And to that degree, the objection concludes, the control that the agent exercises in making the choice is diminished.
Kane offers a complex reply to this objection. First, he counters that with indeterminate events, exact sameness is not defined. If an agent's effort of will was indeterminate, then it cannot be that she and her counterpart made exactly the same effort, and one got lucky while the other did not. An objection that assumes that such exact sameness is possible, he holds, does not apply to his view. Kane infers from this point that free will requires a form of indeterminism in which there is chance as well as indeterminacy, with the former stemming from the latter. (He calls worlds with such indeterminism "non-Epicurean.") The chance in an Epicurean world (an indeterministic world without indeterminacy), he implies, would constitute control-diminishing luck.
Kane's claim that indeterminacy precludes exact sameness has been contested (see Clarke (1999) and O'Connor (1996)). And Haji (1999) and Mele (1999a and 1999b) contend that the argument from luck is just as effective if we consider an agent and her counterpart who is as similar as can be, given the indeterminacy of their efforts. Indeed, the argument might be advanced without any appeal to other worlds or counterparts: given that there is a chance that the effort will fail, the agent is lucky, it may be said, if it succeeds.
A further reply from Kane to the argument from luck appeals to the active nature of efforts of will. When an agent makes an effort to choose to do what she believes she ought to do, she actively tries to bring about a certain choice. When the agent makes that choice, she succeeds, despite the indeterminism, at doing what she was (actively) trying to do. And Kane points out that typically, when this is so, the indeterminism does not undermine responsibility (and hence it does not so diminish active control that there is not enough for responsibility). He describes a case (1999b: 227) in which a man hits a glass table top attempting to shatter it. Even if it is undetermined whether his effort will succeed, Kane notes, if the man does succeed, he may well be responsible for breaking the table top.
If left here, the reply would fail to address the problem of luck in a case where the agent chooses to do what she is tempted to do rather than what she believes she ought to do. In response to this shortcoming, Kane has recently proposed a "doubling" of effort in cases of moral conflict. In such a case, he now holds, the agent makes two, simultaneous efforts of will, both indeterminate in strength. The agent tries to make the moral choice, and at the same time she tries to make the self-interested choice. Whichever choice she makes, then, she succeeds, despite the indeterminism, at doing something that she was actively trying to do.
This doubling of efforts of will introduces a troubling incoherence into case of moral conflict. If an agent is actively trying, at one time, to do two obviously incompatible things, that fact raises a serious question about the agent's rationality.
A further question concerns the efficacy of the appeal to the active nature of these efforts. In the case of the man who breaks the table top, his breaking the table top is free (if it is) not just because it results from an active effort to break the table top, but because it results (we are to presume) from a free effort to break the table top. A successful effort to make a certain choice can contribute in an analogous way to the choice's being free, then, only if the effort itself is free. What is needed, then, is an account of the freedom-level active control with which the agent acts in making these efforts of will.
Kane maintains that, although the effort of will that precedes a choice that is a SFW must be an action for which the agent is ultimately responsible, the effort need not itself be a SFW; it is allowed that the effort be causally determined. However, if the agent is ultimately responsible for the effort and it is causally determined, then the agent must, on his view, have contributed (however indirectly), by her performance of at least one earlier SFW, to the effort in question. Since, on Kane's account, all SFWs either are efforts of one sort or another or must be preceded by efforts, the task of providing an account of the freedom of an effort cannot be avoided.
Kane faces the following dilemma in providing such an account. If the account of the freedom of an effort of will requires that the effort itself result from a prior free effort, then a vicious regress looms. On the other hand, if the account of the freedom of an effort of will need not appeal to any prior free efforts of will, then it would seem that the account of a regress-stopping free choice could likewise dispense with such an appeal.
Suppose that Elena is considering whether to A or to B. She recognizes what she regards as a fairly strong reason to A, and she recognizes what she regards as a somewhat weaker reason to B. At a certain time, t, she decides to A. Consider a view on which the prior deliberative events nondeterministically cause that decision. The view need not require, though it may allow, that there was a chance that at t Elena would decide to B. Incompatibilism requires here that something other than deciding at t to A have been causally open, and that requirement will be met if there was a chance that at t Elena would continue deliberating, seeking further reasons for or against the two alternatives she is considering.
It certainly is not clear that the chance required here constitutes control-diminishing luck. However, the open alternatives required may not be sufficiently robust to satisfy many incompatibilists, who may want to require that, at least sometimes, when an agent makes a decision, there was a chance that at that time she instead make an alternative decision, even if any such alternative would have been contrary to her assessment of the reasons that she had recognized. Suppose the view requires that, in Elena's case, there have been a chance that she would at t decide to B. Does this sort of chanciness constitute control-diminishing luck?
Note that Elena's case will still differ from the following sort. Suppose that Lucas throws a dart, attempting to hit a target, which he succeeds in doing. Due to certain properties of the dart and the air, the process leading from his releasing the dart and ending in the dart's hitting the target was nondeterministic, and there was a chance of the dart's missing the target. Lucas exercises (indirect) active control over the dart's hitting the target only by way of his prior action of throwing the dart. The indeterminism in this case (in comparison with a case in which his throwing the dart causally determines its hitting the target) diminishes the chance of his succeeding at bringing about a nonactive result that he is actively trying to bring about. It is for this reason that indeterminism here constitutes control-diminishing luck.
But the indeterminism in Elena's case is located differently; it is located in the causal connection between certain nonactive events--Elena's recognizing and assessing certain reasons--and her performance of a basic action--her making a decision. She exercises active control over the making of the decision not by performing any prior action, but by making the decision. If indeterminism, in the form of nondeterministic causation, located here diminishes control, the explanation of why it does so will have to be different from the explanation of why the indeterminism in Lucas' case diminishes control. It is not obvious what this alternative explanation would be.
Even if the indeterminism required by an event-causal incompatibilist account does not diminish control, it does not appear to increase it, and a second objection may be raised, charging that the requirement is then gratuitous. In order to assess this second objection, it may prove helpful to reflect on why free will is important to us.
We value a freedom in acting that grounds dignity and responsibility, in the exercise of which we make a difference to the way the world goes, and one that accords with the appearance of openness that we find in deliberating. We can distinguish two aspects of this freedom: a kind of leeway or openness of alternatives, and a type of control that is exercised in action. The freedom in which we are interested for some of the above things may involve one but not the other of these aspects. (For example, Frankfurt (1969) has argued that an agent may be responsible for what she has done even if she could not have done otherwise.) In a similar fashion, it may be that what is gained with the indeterminism required by an event-causal incompatibilist account has to do with one but not the other of these aspects.
An agent's exercise of control in acting is her exercise of a positive power to determine what she does. If event-causal views are correct, this is a matter of the action's being caused, in an appropriate way, by certain events involving the agent, such has her having certain reasons and a certain intention. An event-causal incompatibilist account adds no new causes to those that can be required by a compatibilist account, and hence the former appears to add nothing to the agent's positive power to determine what she does. As far as this aspect of freedom is concerned, the requirement of indeterminism may well be (at best) superfluous.
But not so when it comes to the other aspect, the openness of more than one course of action. If incompatibilists are correct, there is never any such openness if the world is deterministic. The indeterminism required by an event-causal incompatibilist account suffices to secure this leeway or openness, and this may be important to us for several reasons. Some individuals, at least, may find that when they deliberate, they cannot help but presume that more than one course of action is genuinely open to them. If the world is in fact deterministic (and if incompatibilism is true), these individuals are subject to an unavoidable illusion (since we cannot avoid deliberating). And they may reasonably judge that it would be, for this reason, better if things are as presented in an event-causal incompatibilist view. Similarly, some individuals may reasonably judge that if things are as presented in this view, that is better with regard to our decisions' and other actions' making a difference to how the world goes. Of course, even if the world is deterministic, there is a way in which our decisions and other actions generally make a difference: had we not made those decisions and performed those actions, things would have gone differently. If things are as presented in an event-causal incompatibilist account, our decisions and other actions still generally make a difference in this way. But they may make a difference in a second way as well: they may be branch points in a probabilistic unfolding of history, branch points over which we exercise active control. There may have been a real chance of things' not going a certain way, and these decisions and other actions may be the events that set things going that way. One may reasonably judge that it is better to be making a difference in this second as well as in the first way with one's decisions and other actions. Since we cannot be making a difference in this second way if the world is deterministic, some individuals may have reason to find that the indeterminism required by an event-causal incompatibilist view is not superfluous but adds something of value.
It is less clear that anything is to be gained with respect to responsibility. As was suggested above, it does not appear that on an event-causal incompatibilist account, agents exercise any greater positive powers of control than they could in a deterministic world. If Frankfurt is right, and the openness provided by such an account is not required for responsibility, then whether the account secures responsibility would appear to depend just on what positive powers of control it offers. Hence, if responsibility is not compatible with the truth of determinism, it may not be compatible with the truth of an event-causal incompatibilist account, either.
An early advocate of this type of view was Reid (1969 ). In recent years, agent-causal accounts have been advanced by Chisholm (1966), (1971), (1976a), (1976b), and (1978), Clarke (1993) and (1996), Donagan (1987), O'Connor (1995), (1996), and (2000), Rowe (1991), Taylor (1966) and (1992), Thorp (1980), and Zimmerman (1984).
Two main problems confront defenders of agent-causal accounts, one concerning the notion of agent causation and the other concerning the rational explicability of free decisions or other actions on such views.
All theorists who accept a causal construal of agents' control over what they do--and this includes most compatibilists as well as many incompatibilists--hold that, in a sense, agents cause their free actions. However, most hold that causation by an agent is just causation by certain events involving the agent, such as the agent's having certain reasons and a certain intention. But, as we have seen, the agent causation posited by agent-causal accounts is held not to be this at all. It is said by most agent-causal theorists to be fundamentally different from event causation. And this raises the question whether any intelligible account of it can be given. Even some proponents of agent-causal views (e.g., Taylor and Thorp) seem doubtful about this, declaring agent causation to be strange or even mysterious.
Moreover, even if the notion of agent causation can be made intelligible, the question remains whether the thing itself--causation by a substance or continuant--is possible. An argument deriving from Broad (1952: 215) suggests that it is not. Each event, including each action, it is said, occurs at a certain time. And if an action is caused, the argument continues, then some part of that action's total cause must be an event, something that itself occurs at a certain time. Otherwise there would be no way to account for the action's occurring when it did. Hence, if an agent causes an action, there must be something the agent does, or some change the agent undergoes, that causes that action. Since either something the agent does or some change the agent undergoes would be an event, it is concluded, it cannot be the case, as most agent-causal accounts maintain, that free actions are caused by agents and not by any events.
The second main problem for agent-causal views stems from the fact that free actions can be performed for reasons and can be rationally explicable. We saw earlier that serious difficulties confront noncausal accounts of acting for certain reasons and of rational explanation. In denying, then, as most agent-causalists do, that free actions have any event causes, these theorists may rule out rational free action.
In response to this second problem, Clarke (1993 and 1996) proposes an agent-causal account on which a free action is caused by the agent and nondeterministically caused by certain agent-involving events, such as the agent's having certain reasons and a certain intention. Given this appeal to reasons-causation, the view can provide the same accounts of acting for reasons and of rational explanation as can event-causal views. And since the event causation that is posited is required to be nondeterministic, the view secures the openness of alternatives, even on the assumption that this openness is incompatible with determinism. Finally, the agent causation itself is still held to be distinct from causation by any events, and so this view secures the origination of free actions that seemed an appealing feature of more traditional agent-causal accounts.
Even though, on this type of agent-causal view, a free action is nondeterministically caused by events involving the agent, since the agent makes a further causal contribution to what she does in addition to the contribution made by those events, it would seem that she exercises greater positive powers of control than what could be exercised if all causes were events. Hence this type of account may have a stronger defense against the problem of control than have event-causal incompatibilist accounts.
This modification of traditional agent-causal views also addresses Broad's objection concerning the possibility of agent causation. That objection concludes that it cannot be the case that free actions are caused by agents and not by any events; if an agent causes an action, it is said, then some event involving that agent must cause the action and account for the action's occurring when it does. On the proposed view, some events involving the agent do cause each free action and account for the action's occurring when it does.
O'Connor rejects this combination of agent and event causation. A free action, on his view, consists in an agent's causing a certain event, and he maintains that an agent's causing an event cannot be caused. O'Connor defends an account of rational explanation similar to that of Ginet, with an added requirement (for explanation that cites a certain desire) that the action begin with the agent's causing her acquisition of an intention to act so as to satisfy that desire.
Turning to the intelligibility of agent causation, O'Connor (1995, 1996, and 2000) and Clarke (1993 and 1996), though differing on details, have both suggested that agent causation might be characterized along the same lines as event causation, if the latter is given a nonreductive account. Familiar reductive accounts characterize event causation in terms of constant conjunction or counterfactual dependence or probability increase, and if event causation is so characterizable, then certainly agent causation would have to be fundamentally different. But if causation is a basic, irreducible feature of the world, then we might with equal intelligibility be able to think of substances as well as events as causes.
Even if we can understand the idea of agent causation, and even if the argument for its impossibility considered earlier is not effective, there remain reasons to doubt that it is possible for a substance to cause something. To give just one example, even if causation cannot be reduced to probability increase, it seems plausible that any cause must be the kind of thing that can affect the probability of its effect prior to the occurrence of that effect, even when the cause directly brings about that effect. Events are the sort of thing that can so affect probabilities, and this is due, it seems, to the fact that they occur at times. Substances do not occur (events involving them do), and they do not appear to be the sort of thing that can affect probabilities in the indicated way. This consideration, although not decisive, seems to count against the possibility of causation by a substance.
Incompatibilist accounts require, first, that determinism be false. But more than this, they require that there be indeterminism of a certain sort (e.g., with some events entirely uncaused, or nondeterministically caused, or caused by agents and not deterministically caused by events) and that this indeterminism be located in specific places (generally, in the occurrence of decisions and other actions). What is our evidence with regard to these requirements' being satisfied?
It is sometimes claimed (e.g., by Campbell (1957: 168-70) and O'Connor (1995: 196-97)) that our experience when we make decisions and act constitutes evidence that there is indeterminism of the required sort in the required place. We can distinguish two parts of this claim: one, that in deciding and acting, things appear to us to be the way that one or another incompatibilist account says they are, and two, that this appearance is evidence that things are in fact that way. Some compatibilists (e.g., Mele (1995: 135-37)) deny the first part. But even if this first part is correct, the second part seems dubious. If things are to be the way they are said to be by some incompatibilist account, then the laws of nature--laws of physics, chemistry, and biology--must be a certain way. (This is so for overt, bodily actions regardless of the relation between mind and body, and it is so for decisions and other mental actions barring a complete independence of mental events from physical, chemical, and biological events.) And it is incredible that how things seem to us in making decisions and acting gives us insight into the laws of nature. Our evidence for the required indeterminism, then, will have to come from the study of nature, from natural science.
The scientific evidence for quantum mechanics is sometimes said to show that determinism is false. Quantum theory is indeed very well confirmed. However, there is nothing approaching a consensus on how to interpret it, on what it shows us with respect to how things are in the world. Indeterministic as well as deterministic interpretations have been developed, but it is far from clear whether any of the existing interpretations is correct. Perhaps the best that can be said here is that, given the demise of classical mechanics and electromagnetic theory, there is no good evidence that determinism is true.
The evidence is even less decisive with respect to whether there is the kind of indeterminism located in exactly the places required by one or another incompatibilist account. Unless there is a complete independence of mental events from physical events, then even for free decisions there has to be indeterminism of a specific sort at specific junctures in certain brain processes. There are some interesting speculations in the works of some incompatibilists about how this might be so (see, e.g., Kane (1996: 128-30 and 137-42) and the sources cited there); but our current understanding of the brain gives us no evidence one way or the other about whether it is in fact so. At best, it seems we must remain, for the time being, agnostic about this matter.
If incompatibilist free will requires agent causation, and if such a thing is possible, that is another requirement about which we lack evidence. Indeed, it is not clear that there could be any empirical evidence for or against this aspect of agent-causal views.
In sum, we do not have good evidence that any incompatibilist account is true. Some incompatibilists (e.g., van Inwagen (1983: 204-13)) hold that we nevertheless have good reason to believe that some such view is correct, since we have good reason to believe that we are morally responsible, that moral responsibility requires free will, and that free will requires indeterminism. However, lacking empirical evidence for the required indeterminism, if we justifiably believe the last two of the just mentioned propositions, then we have a strong moral reason not to treat each other as morally responsible. For if we are not responsible, then whenever we treat someone as responsible, we do that individual an injustice. And if indeterminism of a certain sort and in a certain location is required for responsibility and we lack evidence for the required indeterminism, then we risk this injustice whenever we treat someone as responsible. That is a strong moral reason (for incompatibilists) not to do so.