|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Polemicist, socialite, and literary figure, Jacobi was an outspoken critic, first of the rationalism of German late Enlightenment philosophy, then of Kant's Transcendental Idealism, especially in the form that the early Fichte gave to it, and finally of the Romantic Idealism of the late Schelling. In all cases, his opposition to the philosophers was based on his belief that their passion for explanation unwittingly led them to confuse conditions of conceptualization with conditions of existence, thereby denying all room for individual freedom or for a personal God. Jacobi made this point, in defence of individualism and personalistic values, in a number of public controversies, in the course of which he put in circulation expressions and themes that resonate to this day. He was the one who invited Lessing, who he thought was walking on his head in the manner of all philosophers, to perform a salto mortale (a jump heels over head) that would redress his position and thus allow him to move again on the ground of common sense. He was also responsible for forging the concept of ‘nihilism’ -- a condition of which he accused the philosophers -- and thereby initiating the discourse associated with it. His battle cry, which he first directed at the defenders of Enlightenment rationalism and then at Kant and his successors, was that ‘consistent philosophy is Spinozist, hence pantheist, fatalist and atheist’. The formula had the effect of bringing Spinoza to the centre of the philosophical discussion of the day. In the face Kant and his idealistic successors, Jacobi complained that they had subverted the language of the ‘I’ by reintroducing it on the basis of abstractions that in fact negated its original value. They had thus replaced real selfhood with the mere illusion of one.
But perhaps the most influential of Jacobi's formulas was the claim that there is no ‘I’ without a ‘Thou’, and that the two can recognize and respect one another only in the presence of a transcendent and personal God. Because of his defence of the individual and the ‘exception’, Jacobi is sometime taken as a proto-existentialist. This view must be balanced by the consideration that Jacobi was a defender of conservative values that he felt threatened by the culture of the day; that he never considered himself an irrationalist; on the contrary, that he thought his ‘faith’ to be essentially and truly rational; and that he tried more than once to develop a positive theory of reason. As a literary figure, he criticized the Sturm und Drang movement and dramatized in two novels the problem of reconciling individualism with social obligation. An exponent of British economic and political liberalism, Jacobi was an early critic of the French revolution, the destructiveness of which he considered the practical counterpart of the speculative nihilism of the philosophers.
Like his junior contemporary Goethe (1749-1832), Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi was blessed with a long life, at least as measured by the standards of the time, and had the good fortune of witnessing in its course events that radically altered the cultural and political face of Western Europe. Jacobi saw the Enlightenment (die Aufklärung) take hold in the German lands, and reach maturity in a peculiarly German cultural form. He saw it as it nurtured ideas of subjectivity and nature, and an interest in history, that were the precursors of later Romanticism. He saw it also as it was violently, even brutally, disrupted in the last decade of the eighteenth century by the events surrounding the French Revolution; and, finally, as it gave way to the new order of the nineteenth century. Despite long bouts of illness, Jacobi was deeply involved in these world shaking events, and actively contributed to them. He may not have had the political and military engagement of a Goethe, who could combine vast literary activities with weighty state responsibilities, but he was certainly an influential cultural and political commentator. Jacobi contributed enormously, throughout his active life, to the shaping of educated German public opinion. He carried on a most extensive correspondence with just about all the literary and political personalities of the day, and for many years also provided a meeting place for them at his country estate in Pempelfort, by hosting there a very popular literary salon. He was ably aided in this enterprise by his much admired wife Elisabeth von Clermont (universally known as ‘Betty’). The list of names who frequented the salon, or with whom Jacobi entered in correspondence on different occasions of his life, reads as a Who's Who of the age. Heinse, Wieland, Goethe, Lavater, Herder, the Humboldt brothers, Diderot, Hemsterhuis, Hamann, Dohm, Georg Forster, the duchess Anna Amalia (Sachsen-Weimar), F. L. Stolberg, Fürstenberg, Princess Gallitzin and Sophie La Roche, counted among them, to mention only a representative segment.
In an age, moreover, in which friendship had been raised to the status of cult, Jacobi nurtured a number of intimate personal relations, all of which influenced his literary production in many ways. There was, for instance, his life long tempestuous relationship with Goethe -- punctuated as it was by periods of extreme intimacy and extreme alienation, and culminating in an irreparable break in the final period of Jacobi's career. (Nicolai, 1965) There was also his warm friendship with Hamann -- for the most part at a distance, since the two men managed to meet physically only once, in what were to be Hamann's last days, and this much anticipated meeting unfortunately devolved into a huge quarrel. As long as it lasted in the medium of letters, the friendship produced a body of correspondence widely recognized as one of the finest contributions to the German literature of the time. (Jacobi/Hamann, 1955-1979) There was then Jacobi's relationship with Princess Galitzin, much cultivated by Jacobi but overshadowed by the Princess's conversion to Catholicism and by her adoption of a quasi monastic style of religiosity distasteful to Jacobi (Brachin, 1952; Trunk, 1955); his relationship with the Stolbergs, also embittered at some point by the Stolbergs' entrance in the Catholic Church (Brachin, 1952); with Lavater, whose pietism seem to have had a special attraction for Jacobi; with Basedow and Claudius,to both of whom Jacobi entrusted the education of his two surviving legitimate sons; and many other as well. These friendships, while engaging Jacobi emotionally, were perceived by him also as integral part of his intellectual life, since his fundamental belief, from beginning to end, was that thought must resist the lures of abstraction and remain throughout personal. Jacobi can perhaps best be characterized as a philosophical polemicist, but only in the sense that polemics is the natural medium of expression for a philosopher whose thought is essentially personalist, and for whom, therefore, (just as for Kierkegaard roughly half a century later) there is no serious thinking unless it is directed to someone in particular.
Jacobi also had the good fortune of belonging to a privileged segment of society. The Enlightenment as well as the French revolution presented him with more than just an intellectual challenge. In their different ways (which, as will be seen in Section 3, Jacobi however thought to have much in common), they both threatened the system of values that justified his social status. In the case of the French revolution, the threat was physical as well, since the events in France spilled over across the Rhine and were the cause for a time of much dislocation in his life. There were, in other words, interests other than purely intellectual that must have motivated his reaction to philosophy and philosophers and which would have to come under close scrutiny in a full study of Jacobi's life. They can however be abstracted from when the main interest, as here, is with the internal logic, or lack of it, of his view of things. A quick review of the main events and the more influential circumstances of his life is none the less in order, at least as signposts of his intellectual career.
Jacobi was born in Düsseldorf, on January 25, 1743, the second son of a well-to-do merchant. His older brother, Johann Georg, was the one selected by the family for an intellectual career, and he did achieve indeed a certain notoriety as a poet in the sentimental style of Gleim. The task of pursuing the commercial activities of the family was reserved for the younger Jacobi. There also were two daughters in the family, half-sisters to Jacobi. Neither of them married, and they eventually took over the management of Jacobi's household. According to his own account, (Jacobi, 1785: 8; 1787, 67ff; 1789, 328ff ) Jacobi was temperamentally given to extremes of piety from his early youth, and was constantly troubled by questions concerning the existence of God and the endlessness of time. After confirmation, he joined a society of pietists in whose company these tendencies were reinforced. At sixteen, after a brief and disappointing apprenticeship in a Frankfurt commercial house, he was sent in 1759 to Geneva to develop there the social skills required for his appointed vocation. It is in that city that Jacobi, exposed to French ideas, as he matured socially, at the same time also formulated the basic beliefs that were to guide his intellectual career to the end. Under the tutelage of the famous mathematician G.L. Lesage, he became acquainted with traditional scholastic metaphysics. But he also worked on the writings of Charles de Bonnet, in which he found elements of psychological sensualism combined (allegedly even harmonized) with such Christian beliefs as the after-life, and read Rousseau's Emile (1761). Appended to the latter was the so titled ‘Profession of Faith of a Savoyard Vicar’, a manifesto upholding the rights of the ‘heart’ against the religion of reason popular among the rationalist philosophers of the day. Jacobi's resolution, at the time, was never to accept a system of thought unless it could be tested against actual existence and did not contradict his yearnings for God.
Back in Germany in 1762, Jacobi continued his philosophical studies. He eagerly read the essays submitted by Moses Mendelssohn and Kant in response to the competition sponsored that year by the Berlin Academy on the theme, ‘Concerning Evidence in the Metaphysical Sciences’. According to his own account, Jacobi found Kant's essay much more convincing than Mendelssohn's, though first prize was awarded to the latter. (Jacobi, 1787: 74-75) He apparently also engaged in the study of Spinoza, and was impressed by Kant's essay on ‘The Only Possible Ground for a Proof of God's Existence’. (Jacobi, 1787: 78-88) In 1764 he took charge of his father's business and -- after an affair with a housemaid with whom he conceived a son, both of whom (housemaid and son) he treated very shabbily by modern standards (Booy/Mortier, 1966) -- married the richly endowed Betty von Clermont. Together with her, he established the already mentioned literary salon at Pempelfort.
In 1772 Jacobi entrusted all his business affairs in the hands of his capable brother-in-law and accepted an invitation to join the governing body of the Duchy of Julich and Berg. His commission was to supervise the rationalization of local manufacturing and taxation practices. In 1779, he was also invited to Munich to conduct a similar reform in the Bavarian lands. In the same year, however, these official activities also came abruptly to an end. Jacobi's liberal views quickly came under attack in the Court at Munich, and, embroiled in bitter controversies, Jacobi returned to his native Düsseldorf. The literary fall out of this episode was the publication (Jacobi, 1779 (1) & (2)) of two essays in which Jacobi defended Adam Smith's economic views. The first essay was published while Jacobi was still in office in Munich, and was itself a major cause of his troubles there.
While engaged in these wordily affair, Jacobi had not abandoned his more humanistic interests. He had already ventured in some minor literary publications in association with his brother Georg while still busy with his commercial practice in Düsseldorf. In 1772, together with Wieland, whom Jacobi had come to know through his brother, he laid out the plans for a German journal patterned after the Mercure de France. The Deutcher Merkur made its appearance soon after, under Wieland's editorship. Jacobi used the journal as the vehicle of some of his occasional writings until 1777, when his collaboration with Wieland came to an end because of a bitter disagreement between the two men on political issues. (Jacobi, 1781, 1782) More significant for Jacobi's future were two other events that took place in the following years. The first was Goethe's visit to Pempelfort in the company of Basedow and Lavater. The encounter between the already famous poet and Jacobi that followed was, according to the reports left by both, of a highly emotionally charged nature. (Prantl, 1881: 579) Each man made a deep impression on the other. Jacobi's two novels, Allwill's Briefsammlung and Woldemar, owe their origin to that event. They were Jacobi's response to Goethe's ardent request, made during the visit, that he put in writing all that was closest to his heart. As things turned out, Goethe quickly cooled towards Jacobi, much to the latter's disappointment, and was later (1779) to prove especially cruel towards him by nailing to a tree (’crucifying’), to the great amusement of a large company, a copy of a just published new edition of the Woldemar (Stockum, 1957; Sudhof, 1959; di Giovanni, 1994: 52-53).
The other event occurred on the occasion of a long journey that took Jacobi, on July 5, 1780, to Wolfenbüttel, where Lessing was librarian at the Herzog August's library. Jacobi immediately paid a visit to the famous man, and it was there, while a guest at Lessing's house, that Jacobi engaged his host in that now famous conversation in which, according to Jacobi's report, Lessing declared himself to be a Spinozist. (Jacobi, 1785: 10-45) This alleged revelation, made only a few months before Lessing's sudden death (1781), was to be the occasion of an exchange of letters between Jacobi and Moses Mendelssohn on the nature of philosophy in general and Spinozism in particular. Mendelssohn was well known at the time as Lessing's great friend, and as himself an artificer of the German Enlightenment. The exchange began in 1783 (Jacobi, 1785: 1), and continued in a period of time when Jacobi was deeply in sorrow because of the premature death of his beloved Betty (1784) and of a younger son, and was also suffering from bad health. As the result of an intricate and unpleasant set of circumstances -- one that was to provide fodder to opposing parties, in the dispute that soon followed, for questioning the integrity of both Mendelssohn and Jacobi -- the latter published the letters in 1785, complete with commentary, under the title of Concerning the Doctrine of Spinoza in Letters to Herr Moses Mendelssohn (Spinoza Letters).
Nobody could have predicted the extent and the fury of the controversy that the publication of the book caused. The controversy goes in the literature under the name of the Spinozism or the Pantheism Dispute. (Jacobi, 1916) Mendelssohn responded to Jacobi in writing (1786) but did not survive to see his reply in print. Already in bad health, he died. (4 January 1786) Jacobi responded to the reply. (1786) Both publications were notable for their bitterly personal tone. In retrospect, the controversy itself and the personal tone it assumed made sense, since the issues that Jacobi had raised had put into question the nature and the value of the new humanism being sponsored by the Enlightenment. As Goethe was to remark many years later, the controversy touched everyone in their deepest convictions. Mendelssohn's death caused the debate to become even more personal, for his defenders (notably the Berlin's Aufklärer led by Nicolai) used it as an occasion to raise their hero to the status of martyr. One can gather a detailed account of the events, seen from Jacobi's point of view, in the latter's thick correspondence with Hamann of those years. (Jacobi/Hamann, 1955-1979) Hamann sided with Jacobi, though his irrepressibly eccentric self could not refrain from repeatedly poking fun at his friend. Two unforseen results of the episode were that Jacobi, until then a peripheral author, was propelled to the centre of public attention; and Spinoza's philosophy, already influential among the literary circles of the Sturm und Drang but otherwise traditionally rejected by the philosophers of the schools, became an object of philosophical discussion.
In 1787 Jacobi published David Hume on Faith, or Idealism and Realism, a Dialogue. In it he tried to clear himself of the charge of irrationalism brought against him because of his defence of the primacy of Glaube (‘faith’ or ‘belief’) over reason in the still on-going controversy. Though appealing to the authority of Hume in this defence, Jacobi however also forcefully distanced himself from the latter's scepticism by declaring the sense in which he was rather a realist. The dialogue appeared in the wake of the publication of the second edition of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason (1787), and included an appendix in which Kant's transcendental idealism was severely criticized. The appendix was to become a locus classicus of anti-Kantianism. It eloquently restated all the main objections that had already been raised against the Critique since its first publication, and were to be repeated again against it, in a variety of forms, in the years to come. It is there that Jacobi made the famous quip: 'Without the presupposition [of the "thing in itself,"] I was unable to enter into [Kant's] system, but with it I was unable to stay within it'. (Jacobi, 1787: 223) His point was that, in presupposing the allegedly unknown 'thing in itself', yet by assigning to it the many functions that it played in his system, Kant was in fact demonstrating knowledge of it, thereby contradicting his assumption of critical ignorance. The negative, even antagonistic, attitude that Jacobi assumed in this appendix overshadowed the fact, however, that he had always felt close in spirit to Kant. He had felt deeply hurt when Kant has sided with Mendelssohn in the still on-going dispute. More important, it also overshadowed the fact that Jacobi had already developed a much more constructive critique of transcendental idealism, and had even offered a sophisticated alternative to it, in the body of the dialogue itself, while expounding his own realism. (See Section 2.2) This is an aspect of the dialogue that was not lost on some of Kant's own disciples, and was a factor in the development of post-Kantian idealism.
There followed a number of polemical writings directed at the Berlin Aufklärer. They reflected Jacobi's engagement in the famous ‘Starck affair’ -- a defamation suit, eventually lost by the plaintiff, brought by a certain J. A. Starck against the leaders of the Berlin Enlightenment. (Blum, 1912; di Giovanni, 1995) The case brought into question the legitimacy of freedom of the press. It also unfolded in the context of wide-spread conspiracy theories regarding the alleged efforts by secret societies, working under the manipulation of Jesuits or Papists in general, to undermine the rule of enlightened states. (See Section 4) In 1789 a second, much enlarged, edition of the Spinoza-Letters went to press. It reflected the recent publication of Kant's Critique of Practical Reason (1788). Among many additions, it included two prefatory sets of theses, the first denying human freedom, the second asserting it, together suggesting a resolution of the antinomy between nature and freedom quite different than the one proposed by Kant. It also included a number of new appendices, one of them sharply criticizing Herder, whose idea of God amounted, in Jacobi's opinion, to a half-baked pantheism. (Jacobi, 1789: 349-357) Jacobi's prefatory theses on human freedom were to be highly influential in the debate on the subject soon to break out between K.L Reinhold and C. C. E. Schmid. (di Giovanni, 2001) The debate quickly implicated many other personalities, Fichte among them.
The following years were marked by the visits to Pempelfort of Hamann, Stolberg, Herder, and Goethe (November 1792). Soon, however, political events were to overtake philosophical discourse. The beheading in Paris of Louis XVI (1793) shocked German public opinion, and occasioned Jacobi's lament in ‘Accidental Outpourings of a Lonely Thinker’. (Jacobi, 1795) In 1794, as the French revolutionary armies crossed the Rhine and began bombarding Düsseldorf, Jacobi abandoned Pempelfort and undertook a long peregrination in the North, the guest of many friends in whose company he found comfort. (Prantl, 1881: 582) He settled for a time in Eutin. At this time he began the composition of ‘Of Divine Things’, a manuscript that he completed and published only later. In 1799 he became involved in the so called ‘Atheism dispute’. This was a controversy surrounding the alleged atheism of Fichte which Jacobi himself had not initiated but in which he none the less played a leading role. At the request of Lavater, he wrote an open letter to Fichte (Jacobi, 1799) in which he restated all his objections to philosophy in general and the new idealism in particular, and reaffirmed his commitment to the primacy of faith. He also singled out Fichte as one who had realized all his misgivings about philosophy, since he had succeeded in restating Spinozism even from the standpoint of subjectivity. In a supplement (Supplement II) to the letter, Jacobi included a long comment on the nature of reason that he reprinted in the second volume of his collected works (1815)as an independent essay under the title of ‘On the Inseparability of the Concept of Freedom and Providence from the Concept of Reason’. (Jacobi, 1812-1825) In 1802, he published ‘On the Undertaking of Critique to Reduce Reason to Understanding’ (Jacobi, 1802 (1)) -- this latter directed particularly at Kant.
In 1804, Jacobi suffered a drastic reversal of financial fortunes but was spared a much reduced life-style by the call from Munich, late in the same year, to work there at the reorganization of the Academy of the Sciences. Jacobi accepted the invitation and in the following year moved to Munich. He remained there until the end of his life. Elected president of the reformed Academy in 1807, he unfortunately fed the animosity already felt in Munich against the foreigners recently invited to the Academy by implying in his inaugural speech a criticism of Southern Germany culture. (Jacobi, 1807) He also antagonized Schelling, at that time Director of the Munich Academy of the Arts. In 1809, in response to a writing of Schelling on human freedom that contained pointed criticisms of his understanding of Spinoza, Jacobi resurrected his unfinished manuscript ‘Of Divine Things’, completed it as an obvious polemic against the new nature philosophy that Schelling was promoting, and published it in 1811 under the title of ‘Of Divine Things and Their Revelation’. (Jacobi, 1811) The essay provoked a reply from Schelling which, in turn, provoked a counter reply by Jacobi. Thus arose the third of the major controversies in which Jacobi was involved -- one even more personal and bitter in tone than the earlier ones.
In 1812 Jacobi retired and, aided by his disciples J. F. Köppen and C. J. F. Roth, began the preparation of his collected works. (Jacobi, 1812-25) Since the turn of the century, he had begun to attract to his side such younger figures as F. D. E. Schleiermacher, J. F. Fries, and F. Bouterwek -- newly established academics whose thought he had inspired but who, in turn, influenced his final definition of the nature of reason. They all shared a scientific positivism which they combined with a contrasting moral/religious positivism -- this latter based on the assumption that higher values and the reality of divine things can be intuitively assessed by way of feeling. This younger generation helped to popularize some of Jacobi's ideas and attitudes in the nineteenth century. Ironically, despite his life long opposition to Roman Catholicism, Jacobi exercised considerable influence in some German Catholic theological circles. (Weindel, 1950)
In 1817, Jacobi made reference in a letter to his friend Johann Neeb to a favourable review of the second volume of his collected works by Hegel. (Jacobi, 1825-27: vol. 2, 467-68; di Giovanni, 1994: 165-166) There was no apparent trace left in his comments of the anger that Hegel's essay, ‘Glauben und Wissen’ (‘Faith and Knowledge’), had aroused in him in 1801. (Jacobi, 1803: 221) Jacobi allowed that Hegel's interpretation of his thought might be the correct one, and conceded that the two men might come to a meeting of minds, were it not for old age that prevented him from studying Hegel's philosophy.
Jacobi's extensive travels took him to London in 1786 and to Paris in 1801. (Prantl, 1881: 581, 582) Though first exposed to philosophy in a French cultural milieu, Jacobi was an Anglophile throughout his life and favourably compared British philosophers with the French philosophes. He credited the British for never having denied that virtue has value on its own; for never having made it just an instrument of happiness. The French, on the contrary, the moment their philosophizing progressed beyond mere common sense, were always all too prone in moral matters of falling into materialism. (Jacobi, 1812-125: vol. 5, 73-74)
Jacobi never saw the completion of the planned edition of his works. He died on March 10, 1819.
The Spinoza Letters is a cumbersome work, its disjointed composition indicative of the haste with which it was put together. The first edition opens with the text of a poem by Goethe that was however dropped in the second edition. The poem carried the name of its author but had been mechanically edited by Jacobi to bring out, by printing certain key phrases in relief, images especially important to him. Thus edited, the poem conveyed the idea that the pagan gods are Man writ large, and are therefore to be praised, since they reveal what is most noble in the human being. Brute nature is without feelings or discernment, whereas humans can judge, draw distinctions, and dare the impossible. They transcend nature. This was a humanistic message with which Jacobi agreed wholeheartedly. After a brief explanation of how the exchange of letters with Mendelssohn had originated, the main text goes on with a somewhat abbreviated version of the correspondence itself. The first letter gave an account of the conversation Jacobi had had with Lessing on the subject of Spinoza during his visit to Wolfenbüttel, and included the text of another poem of Goethe -- the Prometheus, one that had been the occasion of the conversation in the first place. This poem, hitherto still unpublished, was printed without the author's name (some thought it was Jacobi's own) and conveyed quite a different image of the gods than was found in the other poem. It suggested that they, no less than mortal men, are subject to the blind ‘almighty time’ that rules over all. In a universe thus ruled by ‘eternal fate’, they are therefore even more wretched than human beings, for the latter have at least the power to rebel against the order of things and thereby retain their dignity. At least as typified by Prometheus, human beings can rejoice in their own sufferings, and by this defiance uphold their individuality in the face of Fate.
In the rest of the letters we see Mendelssohn trying to play down the seriousness of Lessing's alleged admission to being a Spinozist. Since Mendelssohn thought at first that Jacobi was himself a Spinozist, we see him also attacking the basic doctrines of Spinozism as he understood them, while at the same time suggesting how they could be reformulated in an internally more consistent form to have them rejoin the accepted teachings of school metaphysics. Jacobi, for his part, was intent on displaying his scholarly (and indeed more accurate) knowledge of Spinoza's philosophy. In response to Mendelssohn's criticisms of Spinoza, he argued that Spinozism represented, on the contrary, a perfectly self-consistent position. It was school metaphysics that would logically lead to Spinozism, if its implications were just fully understood, not the other way around. Jacobi also gave an explanation for his sudden decision to publish the letters. Since Mendelssohn had announced the impending publication of his Morgenstunden, a book in which, as Mendelssohn said, he would take up the issue of Spinozism, Jacobi thought that his opponent was unfairly trying to make a public head start on him in a controversy that was agreed would have to remain private before being brought to public attention by mutual consent. Jacobi then concluded the book with rambling extensive quotations from sundry theologians, and ‘sealed’ it (his expression) with an excerpt from Lavater.
Mendelssohn was bitterly to complain to Kant that Jacobi's volume was like a monster that sported Goethe for head, Spinoza as torso, and Lavater for feet. There was a point to his complaint. Yet, despite the many divagations and the pervading preachy tone of the text, there was a definite philosophical message that Jacobi was conveying. Philosophers are temperamentally inclined to reconstruct reality according to the requirements of explanation, in total disregard of the requirements of existence. They are possessed, as it were, by a logical fanaticism that leads them to mistake the abstractive principles of explanation for principles of existence. Since the individuality of things is the first victim of this confusion, yet individuality is the necessary condition of all existence, it follows that in the world as reconstructed by philosophers there is no room left for truly existing subjects -- least of all for agents who can seriously take responsibility for their actions and relate to one another as person to person, an ‘I’ to a ‘Thou’. All that is most noble in human nature (as depicted in Goethe's first poem, Jacobi implies), notably the ability to make decisions and transcend brute nature, is thus denied, and there is no alternative left for human individuals, if they care to preserve at least a modicum of dignity, except to take pleasure in their avowedly only delusory sense of freedom (according to Goethe's second poem, as Jacobi also seems to imply). The much vaunted Enlightenment humanism, based as it was on the ideal of pure rationality was only a sham. It led in fact to ‘nihilism’ (a term, incidentally, that Jacobi made popular).
According to Jacobi's report of his conversation with Lessing, after a disquisition on his part regarding the devastating effects of a thought based on the demands of reason alone, and upon Lessing's apparent declaration of sympathy for Spinoza, Jacobi had urged upon the latter to perform a salto mortale (Jacobi, 1785: 17), i.e., a kind of jump, heels over head, that would redress his position. Enlightened philosopher that he was, Lessing had been walking on his head. The jump -- which Lessing humorously declined to execute citing old age as excuse (Jacobi: 1785, 33-34) -- would have brought him to his feet, back on the solid soil of common sense. Jacobi's obvious agenda, in other words, both at the time of this meeting with Lessing and later, in the exchange of views with Mendelssohn, was to attack the rationalism of the Enlightenment. Also implied, however, was a criticism of Goethe. The latter had spearheaded the Sturm und Drang reaction against the same rationalism that Jacobi was now condemning. Jacobi's veiled message was that the adepts of this new cultural phenomenon had failed to escape the rationalism of the philosophers, since the rebellious new humanism they advocated made sense only on the presupposition that the philosophers's conception of reality was the right one. It is the desire to convey this message that alone explains the otherwise puzzling presence in Jacobi's volume of the two poems by Goethe. To Jacobi's contemporaries, who lacked the background knowledge of Jacobi's special relationship to Goethe, and were even unaware of Goethe's authorship of the second poem, their inclusion in the volume remained a mystery to the end.
At any rate, whether Jacobi's agenda was directed at the Enlightenment or the Sturm und Drang, the presence of Spinoza both in his conversation with Lessing and the later controversy with Mendelssohn was clear. Quite apart from the fact that he had been the central object of discussion in Jacobi's first encounter with Goethe -- another circumstance that Jacobi's contemporaries could not know -- Spinoza was now being portrayed by Jacobi as the one philosopher who had had the courage to press the logicism of the philosophers to its ultimate limit, and to draw from it its inevitable conclusions. Spinoza had subsumed all reality under the one highest abstraction of ‘substance’, with the net result that any real distinction between one presumed individual thing and any other, and between all things and God, was being denied. True generation, or anything connected with temporality, equally disappeared, except as mere illusionary phenomena. This was as nihilistic a conclusion as, in Jacobi's opinion, one could possible draw. In his eyes, therefore, Spinoza stood as the philosopher par excellence (an attribute, however, which he later conferred on Fichte). According to the formula that he drew, philosophy equals Spinozism, and Spinozism in turn equals atheism -- this last part of the equation being based on the assumption that, since Spinoza's God, viz. Substance, lacked the attributes of a person, it he could not satisfy the requirements of true religiosity.
One can understand, therefore, why Jacobi's attitude towards Spinoza could have been a source of confusion for Mendelssohn and later critics as well -- to the point that Jacobi himself was often taken to be a Spinozist. On the one hand, Jacobi pointed to Spinoza as an object lesson of all that is wrong with philosophical reason. On the other hand, he was praising him for being the most consistent of all philosophers (Jacobi, 1785: 27-29), and even defended him against those -- Mendelssohn included -- who, as he thought, detracted from his philosophy by their misguided attempts at ‘saving’ it from the consequences of its unmitigated rationalism. And there was another reason as well for Jacobi's otherwise puzzling predilection for Spinoza -- the Benedictus, as he once calls him, the ‘Blessed One’. (Jacobi, 1799: 41) Spinoza knew that truth is its own criterion; that ultimately, therefore, it is not amenable to discursive reason but must be apprehended immediately on its own, intuitively. This was also Jacobi's position. His objection against the rationalism of the philosophers boiled down to precisely this -- that it was the product of a reason that had lost touch with its intuitive sources, and was therefore given to mistaking its own productions for the real thing. On this score, Jacobi thought that he had found a strange ally in the most rationalist of all philosophers.
Yet there was a serious problem in the Spinoza Letters. Jacobi never quite gave to understand what he, as contrasted with Spinoza, meant by ‘intuition’. He says that philosophy must be ‘historical’ -- presumably, that it must take its starting point from the records of human actions and human events; that it must never abandon experience, or common sense. These, though vague and hardly the basis for a well defined position, were in themselves perfectly acceptable claims. But Jacobi then obscured them with his pious perorations at the end -- by citing, among others, the theologian Jerusalem, who thought that the task of philosophy is simply to elucidate the content of revealed faith, and Lavater, who believed in the ever present witness of miracles. He could easily give the impression, as he in fact did, that, by attacking philosophy and the philosophers, he was advocating a return to the blind acceptance of Biblical revelation; that, by ‘intuition’, he meant religiously inspired ‘faith’. Lessing had suspected that much at the end of his conversation with Jacobi, according to the latter's own report. After the publication of the Spinoza Letters, his friends and admirers had no doubt about it. Led by Nicolai in Berlin, they undertook their campaign against Jacobi, branding him with obscurantism and religious enthusiasm -- these, in the eyes of the Aufklärer, the greatest of all possible sins.
The dialogue that Jacobi published in 1787 carried the full title of David Hume on Faith, or Idealism and Realism, A Dialogue. It had originally been intended as three separate dialogues, as the structure of the final product still betrays. It clearly falls into three parts, with an autobiographical interlude connecting the first and second which is the source of much of our knowledge about Jacobi's early philosophical education. Jacobi uses it as a vehicle for documenting how much, from the beginning, he had been temperamentally driven always to give priority to existence, as immediately apprehended, over any conceptual representation of it, and also for putting on record that, when still a young man, he had found this irresistible tendency of his best satisfied in Kant's two early essays, one on evidence in metaphysics and the other on the proof of God's existence. (Jacobi, 1787: 67ff) These autobiographical remarks come at the heel of a defence, in the first part of the Dialogue, against the accusation of irrationalism brought against him chiefly because of his use of the term ‘faith’ (Glaube, in German) in the Spinoza Letters. Jacobi's many polemical divagations apart, the main line of the defence is very simple. Hume also had used the term ‘belief’ (also translated in German as Glaube) for the kind of assent which is based on experience and is expressed in the form of judgement. Such an assent is immediate, a matter of feeling rather than ratiocination, and all the more unimpeachable precisely because reason alone would never induce it on its own. Now, Jacobi argues, in the Spinoza Letters he had used the term ‘faith’ (also Glaube in German) in the same sense, in order to claim that judgement of existence must be immediate. No process of ratiocination could produce the certainty that accompanies it. There was no ‘irrationalism’, therefore, either intended or implied. On the contrary, Jacobi had been forced to use the term, and to oppose it to reason, only because the philosophers had pre-empted the latter term, and had unduly restricted it to mean the kind of discursive conceptualization that abstracts from real things and is ultimately irrelevant to judgments of existence. But nobody had ever accused Hume of irrationalism. Why was the charge, then, being laid against him? (Jacobi, 1787: 29ff)
Jacobi's critics, in this case Hamann included, were quick to point out that the English ‘belief’ does not have quite the same meaning as the German Glaube; that the latter carries religious connotations best expressed in English by ‘faith’, even though there is only one German word (Glaube) to translate both ‘belief’ and ‘faith’. Jacobi's point, however, was that he, as a matter of fact, had used the term to mean ‘belief’, in Hume's sense. Whether he was being disingenuous in pressing it, granted the profuse use of religious rhetoric with which he had padded his earlier book, is of course a good question. None the less, once Jacobi had thus appealed to Hume's authority for his defence, he was faced by the task of having to distance himself from the scepticism which was entailed in Hume's use of belief but did not in any way fall within his own purview. Jacobi thought of himself as a realist. (Jacobi, 1787: vi) The second part of the Dialogue is concerned precisely with this issue. Inasmuch as Jacobi had a well formulated theory of knowledge at this stage of his development, it is to be found there.
Distilled from the many twists and turns of dialogue style argumentation, the theory can be summed up as follows:
(1) The starting point is the denial, because contrary to fact, of the fundamental assumption of classical empiricism -- namely, that experience begins with purely subjective representations, and that belief in external objects is arrived at only by way of an inference based on the passivity of some of these representations. This assumption inevitably leads to Hume's scepticism. Jacobi rejects it off-hand on the ground that, as a matter of fact, a subject could not be aware of himself -- aware also, therefore, of the alleged subjectivity of some of his representations -- without defining his ‘self’ in opposition to some admittedly external object, i.e. without immediately referring his representations to something other than himself. The very possibility of subjectivity entails the possibility of objectivity. Jacobi's classical formula for this position is that there is no ‘I’ without a ‘Thou’. (Jacobi, 1787: 63-65)
(2) Hume had of course denied that we have consciousness of any definite ‘self’. Such a denial, however, is only possible according to Jacobi if one assumes a purely theoretical standpoint with respect to the ‘self’. We act, and we become aware of ourselves precisely in action. (Jacobi, 1787: 102ff) Self-awareness originates in a subject's feeling of power that accompanies action. Jacobi cites Hume himself in support this claim, even though he then uses the claim precisely in order to overcome Hume's theoretical scepticism. The alleged feeling of power immediately implicates the presence to the subject of an external something that exists in itself and interferes with the felt power, but, in so doing, also provides a reality check for it.
(3) Representation is called into play as the reflective attempt on the part of the subject to sort out the differences between his own self and the external thing resisting his power. This is a formula that brought together in an original unity the three components of consciousness, namely feeling, sense representation, and reflective conceptualization, that Hume as well as Kant had instead sought to synthesize externally. Through a series of arguments, Jacobi then shows how it is possible to arrive at all the categories that Kant had proposed a priori by descriptively identifying, rather, the basic conditions that define the distance between the self and its ‘other’. (Jacobi, 1787:111-121)
(4) It follows that ‘reason’ is not a faculty that supervenes to the ‘senses’ a priori, but a more refined form of otherwise fundamentally sensible representations. As Jacobi puts it, the greater the sensitivity of a subject, the greater his rationality also. The two, ‘senses’ and ‘reason’, are inextricably bound together. (Jacobi, 1787: 125-34)
In making this last point, Jacobi paraphrases Thomas Reid, without however mentioning him explicitly in this immediate context. He apparently thought that he was deploying against Hume the same line of argument already advanced against him by his Scottish ‘common sense’ critic. He was also thereby clarifying what he meant by ‘intuition’ -- that supposed immediate apprehension of truth that gives rise to belief. It now appears that the intuition in question is a product of the ‘senses’. It is not, however, anything blind, for -- as understood by Jacobi in the spirit of Reid, and certainly in contrast to both Hume's and Kant's notion of sensibility -- ‘sensations’ are not passive impressions of the mind but exhibit rather from the start a complex relation between subject and object that can then be developed into even more reflective (i.e. representational) forms. Jacobi actually says that he is dependent on Spinoza for the seminal idea of his present method of deriving reflective representations from the senses. (Jacobi, 1787: 120, note 25) More significant, however, than any reference to Hume, Reid, or Spinoza, is that he also refers to Kant and his transcendental method deliberately, thus betraying that he (Kant), rather than any of them, had been his main concern all along. (Jacobi, 1787: 119-20, & 120, note 25) Jacobi had been advancing a theory of knowledge that, in his opinion, could compete with Kant's. For it explained the basic facts of experience, and even explained the factual necessity of certain fundamental concepts arising in the course of it, without incurring the kind of formalism that, in his opinion and many of Kant's contemporary critics, affected Kant's own transcendental method. Jacobi's first representations were allegedly drawn from experience directly. They were not applied to it a priori, in the manner of Kant's categories which Jacobi regarded rather as nothing more than ‘prejudices of the intellect’.
But there was a difficulty inherent in Jacobi's proposed theory. It came out most poignantly in the third part of the Dialogue -- a part dedicated, for the most part, to an exposition of Leibniz's metaphysics. (Jacobi, 1787: 144ff) Here Jacobi portrays the German Leibniz as the champion of individuality, and also tries to show how it is possible to accept his Monadology if duly modified. The transition in the Dialogue between second and third part is performed rhetorically. There was, however, a conceptual basis for it. And it was in this, in the obvious logical connection between Jacobi's just suggested theory of experience and Leibniz's Monadology, that the difficulty lay. For the organic conception of rationality that that theory implied -- reason being nothing more than a more developed, more reflective, form of sensibility -- fitted well indeed with Leibniz's system. But it also clearly led to Leibnizian naturalism. And the idea that the ‘self’ cannot be defined except in terms of an ‘other’, while also well fitted to the Monadology, also led to the equally Leibnizian position that everything in the universe is itself by reflecting everything else. Jacobi had however made his philosophical debut precisely by combating the assumption that everything can be explained by reference to everything else -- a position that he thought reflected the philosophers's logical enthusiasm for explanation and which he opposed because it ended up undermining human subjectivity.
Jacobi expressed hesitations about the Dialogue from the beginning. He eventually criticized it openly, attributing what he later thought was the confusion marring it to his lack, at the time of composition, of a clear conception of reason. Whether his later conception was to be any better, or whether the original text was truly confused, is of course a question open to discussion. At any rate, the presentment of an unholy alliance against Kant that Jacobi was unwittingly forging with schlastic metaphysics -- his otherwise natural foe -- is perhaps the reason for the abrupt, even puzzling, conclusion that he gave the Dialogue. Jacobi ends it with an unexpected renewed effusion of the same pious rhetoric we find at the conclusion of the Spinoza Letters. Indications are given that one can have direct experiential evidence of things supernatural. (Jacobi, 1787: 195ff) Indeed, on the naturalistic conception of reason earlier developed in the Dialogue, any evidence of the Divine would have to be obtained directly, on the evidence of miracles, as Lavater believed. This was perhaps a position dear to Jacobi's own heart, but it embarrassingly made him vulnerable again -- this is the puzzling part about this production of Jacobi -- to the charge of obscurantism that had been the purpose of the Dialogue to fend off in the first place.
The much augmented second edition of Jacobi's first major work included a fuller documentation of the correspondence with Mendelssohn, and eight new supplements in which, among other things, Jacobi offered a more detailed exposition of Spinoza's philosophy (Supplements VI, VII) and a lengthy criticism of Herder's version of Spinozism (Supplement IV). It was also prefaced with fifty-two propositions -- twenty-three purporting to defend the thesis ‘Man does not have Freedom’; the remaining twenty-nine, the opposite thesis ‘Man has Freedom’. The argument in defence of the first thesis is based on the assumption that human affairs are organized mechanistically, i.e. according to a concatenation of purely efficient causes that would make the being of each totally dependent on the external being of everything else. In defending the thesis Jacobi follows Spinoza closely. The mechanism at issue applies to the cognitive side of man just as much as to his bodily side. Consciousness, or representational being, is only a mirror of extended being. Whatever happens in the latter is repeated on the side of thought, though according to thought's own modality of existence. Thus, according to Jacobi, syllogistic thinking is mechanistic in nature, being driven by principles ab ante no less than any corporeal sequence of events. So far as the opposing thesis is concerned, Jacobi argues for it by retrieving a theme from the David Hume. If it is the case that a finite ‘I’ acquires identity only when confronted by an equally finite ‘Thou’, then, just as for the required interplay between the two one must assume on each side a source of ‘passivity’ that allows each to be limited by the other, so one must also equally assume in them a countervailing source of ‘activity’. This source is irreducible. It follows that ‘activity’ and ‘passivity’ must be assumed to run across the world we know in every part of it. In some parts, the one element might well display a greater degree of intensity than the other; nowhere, however, can either element crowd out the other totally. It also follows that, though mechanism is both possible and necessary, a totally mechanistic organization of things that would eo ipso allow no room for individual freedom, i.e. one that would reduce all things to external relations, is an impossibility, for it would in fact reduce things to mere nothingness. (Jacobi, 1789: xxxv-xxxvi) It would make them totally passive. ‘Passivity’, however, has no meaning except in relation to ‘activity’. The conceptual basis for denying the reality of individually attributable human act is thus removed.
The two theses, appearing as they did one year after the publication of Kant's Critique of Practical Reason, may be taken as a tacit criticism of Kant's strategy of defining the problem of freedom in the form of an antinomy. Jacobi's two theses do not constitute an antinomy because, from their perspective, any apparent opposition between mechanistic explanation and moral demands is already resolved in the propositions detailing the second thesis. Presupposed by both sets of propositions is the assumption, which Jacobi accepts, that beings (at least, created beings) exist in limiting relationships, and that such relationships entail an irreducible element of passivity as well as activity on both the sides entering into them. The difference between the two sets of propositions is that the second (the one defending freedom) respects this necessary condition of any relationship, whereas the first does not. Only the philosopher, because of his passion for abstractions, is tempted to conceive, on the one hand, a purely mechanistic relation, one which in fact negates activity altogether and thus removes the basis for the desired relationships; on the other hand, one which is purely active, exclusively spontaneous, and thus attains the same result by the opposite route. For this last point, Jacobi could have easily connected Kant's notion of freedom as purely spontaneous activity with Spinoza's causa sui. Only then, when one has thus given way to the philosopher's passion for abstractions, is one faced with the Kantian kind of antinomy -- a conflict of opposing yet conceptually valid views that can be controlled, though never truly resolved, only by appeal to the unknown.
In other words, the choice with which Jacobi confronted his readers at the opening of his new edition of the Spinoza Letters was not between two conceptually valid yet contradictory claims, but between the anti-humanism of the philosophers -- based at it was on an abstraction -- and a humanism that on the contrary stays close to the facts of experience. In this respect, Jacobi was reaffirming the point he had already made to Lessing ten years earlier, namely, that the only way to deal with the irrational results of philosophizing is to know when to stop to philosophize. Ironically, however, he had used the same general paradigm of two interacting forces to define, in his two sets of propositions, both the system of mechanical causes and the system of freedom. This was a point that did not go lost. Fichte was soon to use the paradigm as his basis for resolving Kant's antinomy, by arguing that freedom requires as its counterpart the kind of mechanistic organization that scientific explanation demands. Where Jacobi had tried to circumvent the antinomy altogether by suspending philosophical reflection at the right moment, Fichte was to try to resolve it by prompting that same reflection to a higher level of abstraction instead. So far as Jacobi was concerned, the results of any such move could only be disastrous. And it was indeed against Fichte that, ten years later, he felt compelled to repeat in stronger terms than ever before his original interdiction against philosophers.
Many were the circumstances that precipitated the charge of atheism against Fichte and eventually led to his departure from Jena, not all of them of a philosophical nature. His early philosophical system did nothing, however, to help him. In brief, Fichte's position was that the resistance that nature de facto poses to the exercise of human freedom should be interpreted as a product of freedom itself, inasmuch as the human self, by raising itself through abstractive reflection to the status of a pure ‘I’, thereby introduces new possibilities of being, in the face of which given nature necessarily assumes the appearance of a purely contingent, foreign, quantity. It has no meaning in itself except as a material on which the self can exercise its freedom by shaping it according to its intentions. The freer the self, the more insubstantial nature will appear to it, and the greater the possibility of rationalizing it through external means. Even if nature were not in itself a mechanical organization of mere appearances, it would have to be assumed by the free self to be such for the sake of freedom. This is of course an oversimplification. It conveys none the less an aspect of Fichte's early thought that could easily have given the impression that his system constituted the ideological justification for the kind of social engineering that was being done across the Rhine, in revolutionary France, in the name of Freedom. Many thought, at the time, that the philosophes had been the ones to hatch the revolution in the first place. And Fichte now seemed to confirm their worse suspicions. This fear of the revolutionary potential of his thought -- a fear, it must be said, not altogether ungrounded -- is what gave the debate surrounding his suspected atheism its special emotional tone.
In part it also explains the stridency of Jacobi's public reaction to Fichte -- even though privately, as person to person, Jacobi was concerned about the man's safety, and even considered possible venues of refuge for him. He declared Fichte as the true disciple of Kant -- the one who had brought the premises of Transcendental Idealism to their logical conclusions. He also revised his prior estimate of Spinoza. He had always portrayed the latter as the most consistent of all philosophers. He now recognized that the attribute belonged in truth to Fichte. He was in fact the philosopher par excellance -- the Messias of Reason, as Jacobi now loudly proclaims him. (Jacobi, 1799: 2) For Fichte had extended the reach of philosophical abstraction, with which Spinoza had gone only so far as to exclude the possibility of subjectivity, to retrieve this subjectivity itself within its compass, as if it could be excogitated a priori out of pure thought. Fichte's idealism was a case of inverted Spinozism, of spiritual materialism. (Jacobi, 1799: 2-5) For Spinoza's substance, which explains all things by explaining none of them in particular, hence relegates the determination of individuals to the endless mechanism of external causes, was now being reintroduced as the product of pure reflection, as its first objectification. It was as if reflection dissolved all things in the ether of pure thought, out of sheer freedom, and then reassembled them again -- but now as a game, according to self-concocted rules. (Jacobi, 1799: 24-27)
All this infuriated Jacobi. No piece of his is as overflowing with religious language as this letter to Fichte. But the rhetoric exhibited here has none of the pious triumphalism, smacking of Lavater, that had vitiated his earlier productions. It seems born, rather, out of genuine fear in the face of what he thought was the ultimate nihilism of reason. Jacobi conceded that there was no argument against Fichte, no way of refuting him on his own conceptual grounds. He stood before him, therefore, as one who gave witness against the philosophers, forcing the audience to a choice between him and them. Against the universal norms of either Kant's or Fichte's morality, he stood rather as the champion of the exception -- the one who, for the sake of the individual, would dare profane the sacred altars, indeed to lie and even murder. (Jacobi, 1799: 32-33) This was a powerful individualistic manifesto that Jacobi was promoting, the kind not be heard again until Kierkegaard more than half a century later. But it had nothing to do with the asocial individualism typical of the Sturm und Drang movement that had been the cause of Jacobi's concern in his younger years. On the contrary, even before this commotion with Fichte, and probably with Goethe in mind, Jacobi had long been meditating on the place of the individual in society, and had formulated for himself a definite social theory. To gather an idea of it, however, we must turn to his more literary works, as we shall do in due place. (Section 3)
The final period of Jacobi's life saw, among other things, two major publications and the undertaking of the editions of his collected work. We shall consider this last at the end, in the section ‘Retrospect’ (Section 5). As for the other two pieces, the first was a renewed and ever sharper attack on Kant's Transcendental Idealism, as the title indicated: ‘On Critique's Attempt to Reduce Reason to the Understanding’. It was completed by Jacobi's disciple Köppen, as clearly indicated in the text itself; and published in 1802. Reduced to its bare minimum, the attack was based on three arguments, as follows:
(1) Kant had tried to establish the possibility of synthetic a priori judgements on the assumption of an object (= x) and of subject (= x) that we ex hypothesi cannot ever know but upon which the system of experience based on the said judgements none the less depends. The two (viz., the subject and object) constitute transcendental conditions of the possibility of the system of experience. Kant's attempt, however, entails an irresoluble difficulty. For although the assumed subject and object are factors that ex hypothesi fall outside the system of the a priori judgements to be validated (i.e., they are ‘transcendental’), they can only be defined in terms of the concepts and distinctions that have meaning exclusively inside that system. Kant thus finds himself in the embarrassing situation of negating, while at the same time affirming, the transcendality of the conditions of his system, thereby undermining the stability that the latter should derive from them. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 2, 85-91)
(2) The same objection can be generalized in terms of the relation that obtains in Kant's Critique between ‘reason’ and ‘understanding’. It is the task of reason, according to Kant, to define the extra-systemic conditions that make the system of experience possible. But, ex hypothesi, reason has no knowledge of these conditions. As defined by it, they are empty conceptual constructs that acquire meaning only to the extent that they are used by the understanding in its endless work of systematizing experience. To this extent, reason is totally subordinated to the understanding. Yet the latter needs reason. To the extent, therefore, that reason does satisfy this need with its ideas, it cannot help creating the illusion that, through them, it yields genuine knowledge -- that, logically, its conceptions are prior to those of the understanding. Now, Jacobi objected to what he took to be the existentially impossible requirement thus being imposed on reason, namely, that it should generate illusions for the sake of the understanding, yet be fully aware that such illusions are just that. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 2, 81, 100-01, 115)
(3) The third objection, though repeated in a variety of ways, consists essentially in a criticism of Kant's analysis of the function of the understanding in experience. Even granted all the elements of Kant's transcendental psychology, notably, that sensations are per se amorphous mental impressions, that space and time can be at once intuitions and objects of intuition, that the categories are a priori concepts of the understanding -- assumptions these, all of which Jacobi in fact rejects, and against which he strenuously argues in the body of the essay -- even granted these, there still is an internal defect in Kant's system. The problem is that the two terms to be synthesized in any presumed a priori judgement of experience, namely, thought and sensations, are on their own too indeterminate to provide any clue as to how the object that should result from the synthesis would look like. So far as sensibility is concerned, such indetermination applies whether we take it according to its material content or its a priori forms of intuition, for ‘space’ and ‘time’, as defined by Kant, lack per se definite limits. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 2, 77-79, 122ff, 134-35, 136-39) It follows that the determination, in actual experience, must be provided by the intervention of the imagination, and whether we take the latter in a psychological or transcendental sense, its contribution will necessarily entail an element of arbitrariness, and it will thus render any synthesis thereby attained vulnerable to sceptical doubt. Kant, in other words, fails to deliver on his promise of a knowledge, limited indeed to experience, but necessary within such limits. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 2, 95, 97, 115ff, 118ff, 135, 150, 154ff)
The other major work of Jacobi in this last period, Of Divine Things and Their Revelation, was published in 1811. Jacobi had actually begun writing the piece ten years earlier, as the review of a recently published volume by a pietist writer, but had later picked it up again and completed in a totally different cast as a critique of Schelling's ‘System of Identity’ and of the new Philosophy of Nature connected with it. Evidence of its earlier purpose is still visible in the final text, beginning as it does with the discussion of a moral issue, namely, whether morality is to be based on virtue alone, or on natural happiness, or a combination of both. But then the text suddenly shifts to a long discussion of Kant's critical philosophy, the burden of which is however to demonstrate that Schelling's recent idealistic productions were but the logical consequences of precisely that philosophy. The treatment of Kant in this context is a strangely qualified one. On the one hand, Jacobi praises him highly, showing him all the respect due to someone who had become an icon of German philosophical culture. He praises him because he had unequivocally recognized that a true God (presumably, such as morality demands) must be a person; also because he acknowledged that we have an immediate belief in God, freedom, and immortality, and ‘belief’ for Jacobi of course meant ‘knowledge’; finally, because, just like Jacobi himself, he had tried to respect and harmonize the interests of reason, which are directed to God, and those of the understanding, which are directed to the senses. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 3, 341-44; 351-52) Such praises, however, turn out to be hollow -- even a masked form of condemnation. For Jacobi's main thesis throughout the otherwise rambling work is that Kant, while upholding personalistic values, had in fact subverted them conceptually, the net product being Fichte's system of ideal materialism and now the openly naturalistic system of Schelling.
The kernel of Jacobi's argument was in fact still the same as the one presented in his earlier Kant essay (1802). The point there was that Kantian reason, though transcending the understanding, was none the less restricted in its knowledge to the limits of the latter and even subservient to it in the exercise of its powers. As a result, reason found itself in the strange situation of spontaneously generating belief that we have knowledge of transcendent realities, while at the same time having to recognize that any such knowledge is illusionary. Jacobi now further develops this point by arguing that Kant's critical system was explicitly intended from the start to serve the interests of science -- where by ‘science’ Kant meant first and foremost a cognition of the understanding directed at the objects of the senses. The understanding, however, despite its earth-bound nature, cannot help falling under the influence of the higher faculty of reason. It is caught up in reason's desire to behold all things under a transcendent single principle. And reason -- as a matter of fact, according to Jacobi -- does have an intuitive knowledge of things transcendent. But since the understanding cannot allow this knowledge, yet still needs reason as a higher regulative principle, it substitutes for reason's knowledge ideal constructs that are indeed also the products of reason, but are made up, however, of abstractions derived from the understanding. These abstractions then hide from the understanding and reason itself the transcendent knowledge that the latter enjoys de facto. For since reason naturally begins with the assumption of such a knowledge, yet cannot recognize it in the abstractions construed for the sake of the understanding, it ends up treating it as mere illusion. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 3, 372-94)
Fichte's next obvious step was to remove the ground of the illusion by declaring the ideal constructs of reason to be themselves the objects of the transcendent knowledge that reason desires -- in effect, of identifying God with the logical order of things. And Fichte, according to Jacobi, quite consistently also took as the test of true personality the capacity on the part of a self to reconstruct the whole of nature a priori from the principles of that logic, thus reenacting ideally God's creative deed. In fact, however, such a logic was from the start the product of understanding's abstractions. It has no content of its own. The idealizing activities of a self cannot in fact be realized, therefore, except by attending to the material details of nature. And since, even when idealized, nature still remains ‘nature’, it follows according to Jacobi that in practice Fichte's idealism is but a form of materialism. Schelling's naturalism only made this fact explicit. In sum, the great hoax that according to Jacobi idealism had perpetrated -- starting with Kant and concluding with Schelling -- was to give to believe, not indeed that the human spirit can dispense with Things Divine, but that these things can be saved and attained in the impersonal medium of nature.
Spinoza figures prominently in this last major work of Jacobi, just as much as he had in his first. Jacobi actually turns to him in order to clinch his own overall argument historically, and also, since Schelling now had no compunction about declaring the affinity of his system with Spinoza's, in order to vindicate the validity of his original claim -- the one with which he had made his philosophical public debut -- that philosophy equals Spinozism, and Spinozism equals atheism. Post-Kantian developments, in his opinion, had proved him right. His special concern in this late work was to establish the materialism of Spinoza. According to him, the great philosophical move with which which Spinoza founded his system was to distinguish extended substance from thinking substance while at the same time asserting the identity of the two in the one substance which is God. For Spinoza, therefore, extended substance was all that there is of objective being (‘formal being’, according to his terminology), i.e. of substantial and efficient being. Thinking substance is only the representation of it, with no content qua thought except that of substance, i.e. extended substance. It followed that, according to Spinoza, in order for thought to think God, or to think thought itself, it has to think extended substance. There is absolutely no other object available to it. And this, according to Jacobi, constituted an extreme form of materialism. Malbranche, Leibniz, and Berkeley -- again, according to Jacobi -- had recognized this materialistic implication of Spinoza's thought, and, in order to counteract it, they had all taken the obvious step of declaring ‘extension’ itself to be just an appearance. But then Kant came along, and he took the further step of declaring the ‘self’ itself an appearance, a series of representations with no content of their own and with no intrinsic substantial unity -- hence dependent for both on their phenomenal, spatially extended, objects. Through a circuitous route, through the language of subjectivity and appearance, Kant had thus reached the same materialistic position as Spinoza's. Jacobi had therefore been right when he had suspected from the beginning that Kantianism was but a form of inverted Spinozism. Fichte and Schelling had only worked out the implications of Kant's position, thereby rendering its Spinozist essence all too obvious. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 3, 345-56, 431-32)
Important to note is the new terminology that Jacobi was using in this last work, and had already begun to use in the previous essay on Kant. He was now operating on the assumption that there is a distinction between ‘reason’ and ‘understanding’ -- where by ‘reason’ he meant the capacity for transcendent, unifying, principles; by ‘understanding’, the faculty of abstracting general representations from more particular ones. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 3, 395ff, 400, 434-35) The distinction was, of course, Kantian in origin. The claim, moreover, that Kant had held ‘reason’ hostage to the abstractive requirements of the ‘understanding’ was one widely debated among his idealistic followers. Jacobi, however, was now using ‘reason’ to mean a faculty of intuitive knowledge of transcendent things. He was giving to it a positive noetic value. As used by him, therefore, the distinction between ‘reason’ and ‘understanding’ allowed him to draw what he thought was the crucial difference between himself and Kant. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 3, 369-72) Whereas Kant had tried to harmonize the two faculties negatively, simply by keeping each within its appointed limits, Jacobi had revealed their harmony positively, by bringing to light the knowledge that reason actually contributes to experience, thus providing the positive matrix within which the understanding can operate.
In another way as well the distinction helped Jacobi -- or so he thought it did. From the beginning Jacobi had been faced by the difficulty that, in order to oppose philosophical reflection and the nihilism that it brought in train, he had had to attack ‘reason’ and to summon ‘faith’ in its stead. He had thereby made himself vulnerable to the charge of ‘irrationalism’ and ‘blind fideism’, a charge that he always strenuously rejected. So far as Jacobi was concerned, the true irrationalists were the philosophers. With the newly adopted distinction, Jacobi could now specifically direct to the ‘understanding’, or more accurately, to a ‘reason bound to the understanding’, the kind of criticism earlier directed quite generally to ‘reason’. He could then summon ‘reason’, with the new meaning attributed to it, to do the job previously performed by ‘faith’. In this way, he could more easily dodge the charge of ‘irrationalism’ or ‘fideism’, for it was for the sake of ‘reason’ -- that is, ‘true reason’ -- that he could now claim he was waging his campaign against the philosophers. The problem, of course, was that Jacobi never quite clarified this new meaning of ‘reason’. He was apparently using the concept in the same way as he had previously used ‘faith’, namely, as denoting an intuitive faculty akin to feeling but at the same time sporting the clarity of a concept. And this was a combination of notes just as obscure when it went under the name of ‘faith’ as it did when called ‘reason’. Whether the new distinction, and the new language that it made possible, in fact ever clarified Jacobi's position is a question, therefore, open to debate.
Jacobi's earliest publications, some done in collaboration with his brother Georg, were of a purely literary nature. And Jacobi continued to publish the occasional piece in this vein also later, when engrossed in philosophical debate. His reputation as a literary figure is mostly based, however, on his two novels, Edward Allwill's Collection of Letters, and Woldemar. Both productions underwent a long process of development, and were published in different forms at different times. (David, 1913; Jacobi, 1957) The central character of the first, Edward Allwill, very likely underwent radical changes in the course of formation. We are only interested here with the substantially definitive form that Jacobi gave to them in the editions of, respectively, 1792 and 1794 (the latter as reproduced in 1820). Both, but the Woldemar especially, came in for devastating criticisms upon publication. But they both also enjoyed a certain popularity. To call them ‘novels’ in any modern sense of the word would be misleading. Both lack in serious dramatic action, and the characters, in each case, lack credibility. They are one dimensional figures, mouthpieces of Jacobi's moral and social ideas rather than fully bodied personalities. In the case of the Woldemar especially, Jacobi seems to be talking about his characters rather than letting them act on their own. (David, 1913: 92 & notes) As narrations, the two pieces are in fact philosophical arguments thinly disguised by a veneer of imagination. Yet this feature, which might count as a fatal flaw from a purely artistic point of view, is precisely what makes them an indispensable part of Jacobi's philosophical output.
As literary productions, the two pieces belong to the popular Enlightenment genre of Erziehungsroman, ‘education-novel’. In both cases the education at issue, as one would expect from the genre, is that of a Herzensmensch. This is the kind of human being who presumes to live by natural feelings alone but who, when confronted by actual social situations, learns (or fails to learn, to his ultimate destruction) that such feelings are insufficient for coping with the complexities of real life. Nature must rather be subjected to social discipline. Allwill and Woldemar, the main characters in Jacobi's two novels, are both this type of Mensch. Both behave as young men, though the biological age of Allwill is an object of discussion among the other characters of the novel, and he might well be taken to be young by vocation only. Both seem to have come out of nowhere but to be at the moment deeply involved in the affairs of a family circle. Both are temperamentally gifted with strong feelings yet also given to highly abstract reflections -- both, sensitive products of nature yet refined products of thought at the same time. And it is as such juxtapositions of extremes that they play an influential and at times also disturbing role in the societies within which each has been admitted as an eccentric but also interesting permanent visitor.
The education that each of these ‘young men’ undergoes (or should undergo) is shaped within the framework of these societies. From what we learn about Allwill, since early age, out of sheer natural impetuosity, he was given to some most extraordinary behaviour -- the kind that would have appeared to an outside observer as indicative, at times, of a noble and compassionate frame of mind; at other times, of sheer foolishness. So far as Allwill himself was concerned, however, such distinctions would have seemed immaterial, even meaningless. Allwill (whose name in German, as in English, means just that, ‘all will’) did whatever he did out of sheer impulse -- his only norm of action, the action itself. And now that he has grown older, he displays this character trait in the arena of speculative dispute as well. For the impetuous young man has also become a skilled dialectician, as we learn from a scene in which we see him deliver a long disquisition on the nature of knowledge in the course of a social gathering. (Jacobi, 1792: 143ff) Anyone familiar with Jacobi's position on the subject can easily recognize that Allwill's expressed views are also Jacobi's. But Allwill apparently defends them only as an exercise in intellectual virtuosity, simply for the sake of winning a point. In a completely different mood, as he displays his skill at the clavier moments after his disquisition, we see him flippantly rejecting them all, in sharp contrast to the eagerness with which he has just defended them. (Jacobi, 1792: 156ff) Allwill thus moves in his social circle as an insubstantial being, one who appears now under one form, now under another, all the time giving the impression of an inner core that he in fact does not possess. Precisely for this reason, by holding out possibilities that are all the more interesting just because they are indefinite -- the illusionary products of a non-self -- he exercises in the eyes of some of the women in the circle the fascination of a seducer.
Allwill, who might have been taken as a beautiful product of nature in his first literary appearances, became an ever darker character as he developed at his creator's hand. This is especially true in the 1792 edition of Jacobi's novel, because of the singularly ominous shadow retrospectively cast upon his figure by a letter addressed to a certain ‘Erhard O**’, and carrying Jacobi's own signature, added to it at the end. (Jacobi, 1799: 13) There are dark references in the letter to the demonic nature of this Erhard, and even more disturbing hints at the connection between his behaviour and the social destruction being wrought by the French revolution. It is significant that in the body of the novel itself, the one character who has penetrated through to the true nature of Allwill and recognizes the destructiveness of his character is a woman who, like him, does not belong to the family circle that provides the social context of the narration but, like Allwill again, preys upon the emotions of its members. She is a widow (Sylli is her name) who has lost her only child besides her husband, and now, left to her own, is tempted to despair. As a woman she stands according to the convention of the time for mother earth, and thus reveals another aspect of nature that might be lost in the brilliant figure of Allwill -- the one who would be the innocent first child of it. By itself, nature has no determinations. It is a shapeless, dark power, that absorbs its products just as much as it gives birth to them. Sylli, if not saved by the intervention of her friends, is on the verge of collapsing into an inner maelstrom of painful feelings and distracted passions. Among all the women of the family circle, she understands and fears Allwill because, in her more elemental ways, she is just as seductive and destructive as he. Together, the two convey the message that Jacobi intends from the beginning of the narration. The cult of nature is just as misguided as the cult of reason; each is the reflection of the other. For nature as well as reason, when taken in abstraction from the social relations such as we see realized among the inner members the family circle in the narration, have no structure, no centre of gravity, and therefore only lead to a dispersion of existence. Those family members might not display the emotional power of a Sylli, or the brilliance of an Allwill. They actually look rather dull, and they certainly lack the intellectual acumen of Allwill. Yet, it is in the virtues they have developed by living in communion that Jacobi pins his hopes for a true humanity.
True rationality is social rationality. This is Jacobi's lesson in Allwill, and it is repeated in the Woldemar -- though the central character there, Woldemar, while exhibiting the same propensity to abstract feeling and abstract thought as Allwill, is treated by Jacobi with much warmth. The character might well have been intended by him as a self-portrait. The novel itself, in its final form, was put together from two pieces originally published independently. (Jacobi, 1779 (3) (4)) The synthesis never quite worked. The result is that the narration is both convoluted and disjointed -- the overall theme, inasmuch as there is one, never transparent. There is, however, a sort of clarification at the end, in the emotional resolution of an intricate social situation that has been brewing from the beginning. Woldemar, unrealistic man of feelings that he is, has construed his whole world around the friendship he has developed with one of the women in the circle of friends he frequents. He has invested his whole existence in that friendship. And the woman has colluded with him. She has however secretly made an oath to her dying father, who has always distrusted Woldemar, never to marry him. And this secret, even though neither she nor Woldemar have ever considered marriage, none the less stands in the way of complete transparency in her relationship with Woldemar -- a circumstance for which she feels guilty. Woldemar learns about the secret by accident. His whole existence, built as it had been on the assumption of total reciprocity with the woman, is shattered. He totters on the verge of insanity. The woman, for her part, is distraught by the strange behaviour of Woldemar. But fortunately she learns about Woldemar's knowledge of her secret, and Woldemar in turn finds out about her knowledge of his knowledge. And this newly shared wisdom provides the basis for a renewed and healthier relationship between the two. Both acknowledge their guilt -- Woldemar, for having expected the kind of total transparency on the part of his woman friend that would have dissolved her individuality; the woman, for having used her individuality as an occasion for deception. The two are now ready to begin sharing their existence in friendship, fully aware of the dependence of each upon the other, yet also of the limits that such a sharing must respect. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 5, 457ff)
The story might sound improbable to the modern ear, and Jacobi's lack of artistry does nothing to help it. Yet, despite its many flaws, the ethical lesson it was supposed to convey is interesting as well as significant. Jacobi was actually harking back to the notion of reason he had adumbrated even as early as the first edition of the Spinoza Letters. Rationality is constituted in the relationship between an I’ and a ‘Thou’, a relationship that respects the conditions of both its terms. Within the context of the Woldemar, this conclusion also brings resolution to a question discussed in a dialogue (the Waldgespräch) introduced in the first part of the narration -- the question, namely, of the extent to which virtue depends on either nature or art. The answer is that it depends on both, provided that each is tested by the limits of actual human relations. At the conclusion of the novel, just as in the earlier dialogue, it is also clearly implied that the mutual respect that such relations demand from the individuals entering into them is possible only on the assumption of a ‘Thou’ greater than any human ‘I’ -- a ‘Thou’ whose transcendent pull forces the human ‘I’ outside its otherwise purely natural limitations. Jacobi's last word, in his novels just as much as in his philosophical productions, always belongs to God.
All of Jacobi's publications are polemical in nature. Some, however, were occasional pieces written with a particular event or situation in mind. Abstraction made of the perversely polemical tracts surrounding the Spinoza dispute and the controversy with Schelling (Jacobi, 1916, 1967), all of them are historically as well as conceptually interesting. Among them, we can single out a few.
In 1777, Jacobi's friend and literary collaborator C.M. Wieland (1733-1813) had published an essay arguing that power is the only source of legitimacy for political authority, hence that the only adequate form of government is a strictly autocratic one. Right follows upon the physical ability to enforce obedience. Jacobi replied with a point-by-point rebuttal that was published only four years later. (Jacobi, 1781) For one thing, Wieland was historically wrong by misconstruing the actual origin of societies. Even more important, Wieland was conceptually wrong by not recognizing that ‘moral law’ and ‘natural necessity’ can be subsumed under the one concept of ‘natural right’ only in a very broad sense. Moral rights derive their force from the freedom of individuals, not from any consideration of natural laws. There is an irreducible difference between the domain of nature and that of freedom. On Wieland's assumption, it would follow that any human action is morally right by the very fact it is performed, just as a natural event gives evidence of its natural necessity by the very fact that it occurs. Thus the attempt on a monarch's life would be justified, provided it is successful. And even if, per impossibile, Wieland's assumption were right, and ‘moral necessity’ were identical with ‘natural necessity’, his conclusions regarding the state, Jacobi argues, would still not follow necessarily. A philosopher such as Spinoza, though a naturalist in moral matters, had arrived at directly opposite results so far as the organization of the state is concerned.
Jacobi renewed his political polemic in 1782, this time on the occasion of the publication by the historian Johann von Müller of a pamphlet entitled The Travels of the Popes, in which, contrary to current ‘enlightened’ views, a positive revaluation of the role of the Popes in the Middles Ages was offered. Jacobi responded with a pamphlet of his own (Jacobi, 1782) in which he defended Müller's position -- not because he had any sympathy for Catholicism, or because he was opposed to secularism, but because he thought that the Popes's spiritual despotism was much to be preferred to the secular, allegedly enlightened, despotism of the princes. Especially interesting about the pamphlet is the essentially classical, even Platonic, conception of reason that Jacobi advances there, in defence, however, of a theory of individual liberalism which, in the eighteenth-century, was being defended rather on the basis of quite an opposite mechanistic conception of rationality.
In 1788, Jacobi published a piece in dialogue form in the Deutsches Museum. (Jacobi, 1788) He did it in the midst of the notorious Starck affair, and in response to the campaign being waged at the time by the Berlin Aufklärer against the pious religiosity of people like Lavater -- a religiosity which they took as a form of crypto-Catholicism, and as an attack on the universal religion of reason which they promoted. (Blum, 1912) The dialogue is between a pious believer and an enlightened philosopher. The believer's main point is that the philosopher has the right indeed to criticize faith. But the believer has just as much right not to accept the philosopher's portrayal of his faith. For, at the abstract level of conceptualization at which the philosopher operates, he is in no position even to recognize the true nature of the object of his attack. He cannot understand that there is nothing in what he says abstractly about God and the world that has not already been known by the believer from time immemorial in the medium of the latter's historical faith. The philosopher, moreover, forgets that his philosophy has a history as well; that its past is shrouded in a faith on which it still depends for the meaning of its abstract conceptions. By attacking faith, therefore, the philosopher risks undermining his own world of meaning.
In 1802, Jacobi published a short piece (Jacobi, 1802 (2)) in response to a prophesy made by G. C. Lichtenberg, a well known science popularizer of the day, to the effect that some day, as science progresses in its efforts at reducing matter to the laws governing it, our world will become so refined in our eyes that it will be just as laughable to believe in God as is now to believe in ghosts. Jacobi replied with a prophesy of his own, imitating the Gospels's account of the last days. The day prophesized by Lichtenberg will come indeed. But, after a while yet, as the world becomes even more refined, the sages will reverse their judgements. And then -- that will be the end of all things -- they will believe in nothing but ghosts. They will be like God, in the knowledge that being and substance are everywhere but ghosts. (Jacobi, 1811: 3-4) Jacobi reproduced the piece at the opening of his Of Divine Things and their Revelation in 1811, in obvious parody of Schelling's philosophy of nature.
The first volume of Jacobi's collected works was published in 1812; the second, in 1815. This last is especially important because it contains, added to the text of the David Hume, a long new Preface intended by Jacobi, as the title indicates, also as Introduction to his life long philosophical production. (’Preface and also Introduction to the Author's Philosophical Collected Works’, Jacobi, 1812-25, vol. 2) In the piece, Jacobi tried to sum up his intellectual odyssey by articulating the interest that had motivated it from beginning to end, and thereby also to bring some systematic unity to what might otherwise have appeared a scattered philosophical production. Jacobi was obviously sensitive to the charge of irrationalism that had repeatedly been brought against him over the years, and anxious to disarm it. He appealed to the distinction between ‘reason’ and ‘understanding’ that he had adopted from around 1800 to argue, as he had already done in Of Divine Things, that the kind of knowledge he had earlier presented under the rubric of ‘faith’ should be understood rather as a product of ‘reason’ -- a ‘reason’ properly understood, of course, as an intuitive faculty for the immediate apprehension of such eternal verities as the Good, the True, and the Beautiful. (Jacobi, 1812-1825, vol. 2, 1815: 59-63 and passim) He accordingly edited the 1787 text of the David Hume, attributing what he thought was the inconclusiveness of the dialogue to his yet unclarified concept of ‘reason’ at the time of the first edition. He added long footnotes to it, and even modified some crucial passages of the text itself -- a circumstance, incidentally, for the most part ignored by later commentators -- in an obvious effort to dispel the naturalism otherwise clearly implied in the original text. While thus distancing himself from any possible evidence of naturalism, Jacobi however also tried to deflect the accusation, sometime brought against him even by friends, that he was against science. He tried to compensate for his past repeatedly made remark that science is but a game of abstractions (Jacobi, 1799: 22-27) by reasserting now, as he had already done in Of Divine Things, that, without the understanding's power to synthesize in the medium of abstract representations the content of sensations, reason, just like the senses, would have no form and hence no cognition of itself. (Jacobi, 1812-25: vol. 2, 58, 110)
How successful these defensive tactics were is open to discussion. The additions and modification made to the David Hume only succeeded in disrupting Jacobi's earlier theory without offering a credible new resolution to it. Moreover, as already remarked, it made little difference replacing ‘faith’ with ‘reason’ when the meaning of the latter remained just as unclarified as that of the earlier term. And Jacobi's positive remarks about science did not come unqualified. Jacobi also stressed that, however necessary the functions of the understanding, the latter is none the less still naturally prone to naturalism and to the atheism consequent upon it. The question could naturally be asked how, on Jacobi's premises, reason was both dependent on the understanding for its form yet naturally exposed to falsification at its hand. One could legitimately doubt, as Friedrich Schlegel had done earlier in a review of Of Divine Things, whether Jacobi had truly made peace with reason. None the less, despite all ambivalence, there was no doubt about Jacobi's motivation throughout. Jacobi had always perceived himself as the champion of personalism, of human individuality and of human transcendence over nature -- values these, that he had always thought threatened by the rationalism of the Enlightenment. At the end of his life, reviewing his long struggle against Kant's Critique and its idealistic aftermath, he judged the struggle justified. For, as he thought events had demonstrated amply, that idealism was but a more sophisticated form of traditional metaphysics, and had indeed led to the same naturalism.
A measure of the great influence that Jacobi had in his own lifetime, and continued to have in the rest of the nineteenth century, is that he was the first to put in circulation the term ‘nihilism’, and to inaugurate the discourse associated wit it. Ironically, however, more often than not that influence did not work itself out in ways Jacobi himself would have wanted. He had been the one to bring Spinoza to the centre of philosophical discussion, and many were to be the young philosophers (Schleiermacher among them) who were first exposed to his pantheism through Jacobi's intermediary. Rather than rejecting it, however, as Jacobi would have expected, they often embraced it enthusiastically. Jacobi's influence on Fichte can also not be overestimated. And his crisp formulation of how Kantian idealism stood with respect to Spinoza's philosophy of substance -- namely, that it repeated the latter in subjective terms, the result being that, while it reintroduced the language of personalism, it also subverted it by changing its meaning -- caught indeed the imagination of many nineteenth century philosophers. But these took it to mean that the values of the old morality had run its historical course, and that it was high time to reestablish humanism on a new foundation. And this was a conclusion that Jacobi would have found just as abhorrent as he had found the French revolution.
Because of Jacobi's insistence on the primacy of immediate existence over reflective conceptualization, and of the rights of the ‘exception’, the possibility is there to interpret his position as case of proto-existentialism, and to treat him, just as Kierkegaard, as an essentially religious thinker. (Beiser, 1987) Indeed, some of the language Jacobi uses, and the themes he explores, are to be found in Kierkegaard again. (Whether the latter was himself an existentialist is, of course, itself an open question.) One must however keep in mind that the language of the ‘leap of faith’ does not belong to Jacobi. The salto mortale he had proposed to Lessing was no leap into the unknown but, according to his explicit testimony, a jump that would have brought Lessing, who had been walking on his head in the manner of philosophers, back to his feet. (Jacobi, 1787: 62; 1789: 353) And as for the religious outpourings that pervade his writings, and often mar them, they must be measured against what Jacobi himself had to say about his religiosity when confiding to Reinhold late in life. As he said, his problem, the source of his many ambiguities, was that, though temperamentally endowed with a Christian heart, his mind was just as temperamentally pagan. (Jacobi, 1825-27: vol. 2, 478) And there are testimonies to the effect that he always kept himself at a psychological distance from Christian believers. (di Giovanni, 1994: 42) At the end, he identified with ‘reason’ what he had earlier referred to as ‘faith’. Also to be kept in mind is that the personalist values that Jacobi championed were Enlightenment values as well. Jacobi belongs very much to his times. To label him ‘an anti-Enlightenment figure’, as is routinely done, is perhaps misleading.
In sum, Jacobi's figure, including its place within the Enlightenment, is much more complex than usually assumed, and still in need of discussion. It might well be that the secret of this complexity is that Jacobi, just like Kierkegaard after him, was motivated by deeply conservative beliefs which he saw threatened by the culture of the day; but, again like Kierkegaard, in trying to reassert them, developed a language that was later to be used, contrary to anything he would have ever imagined, to undermine them instead.
|George di Giovanni