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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
The diversity, complexity and adaptation of the biological realm is evident. Until Darwin, the best explanation for these three features of the biological was the conclusion of the “argument from design.” Darwin's theory of natural selection provides an explanation of all three of these features of the biological realm without adverting to some mysterious designing entity. But this explanation's success turns on the meaning of its central explanatory concept, ‘fitness’. Moreover, since Darwinian theory provides the resources for a purely causal account of teleology, wherever it is manifested, its reliance on the concept of ‘fitness’ makes it imperative that conceptual problems threatening the explanatory legitimacy of this notion be solved.
The leading idea of Darwin's theory of natural selection is often expressed in terms first coined by Herbert Spencer as the claim that among competing organisms “the fittest survive.” If there is random variation among the traits of organisms, and if some variant traits fortuitously confer advantages on the organisms that bear them, i.e. enhance their fitness, then those organisms will live to have more offspring, which in turn will bear the advantageous traits. Whence descent with adaptive modification, i.e. evolution. Evolution by random heritable variation and natural selection will explain ever increasing adaptation to given environments, increasing diversity in the occupation of new environments, and the complexity of organisms and their parts as their lineages adapt to one another and to their environments.
But what is fitness and how can one tell when a trait enhances fitness, or more to the point, when one organism is fitter than another? Opponents of the theory of natural selection have long claimed that the theory is so treated by its proponents as to define fitness in terms of rates of reproduction, thus condemning the principle of the survival of the fittest to triviality: the claim that those organisms with higher rates of reproduction leave more offspring is an empty, unfalsifiable tautology bereft of explanatory power. In the century and a half since the publication of On the Origin of Species biologists have all too often reinforced this objection by actually so defining fitness. For example, C.H. Waddington writes, in Towards a Theoretical Biology, the fittest individuals are those that are “most effective in leaving gametes to the next generation.” It appears therefore that evolutionary theory requires a definition of fitness that will protect it from the charges of tautology, triviality, unfalsifiabilty, and consequent explanatory infirmity. If no such definition is in fact forthcoming, then what is required by the theory's adherents is an alternative account of its structure and content or its role in the research program of biology.
x is fitter than y if and only if x's traits enable it to solve the ‘design-problems’ set by the environment more fully than y's traits do.
One may ask what are these design-problems? How many of them are there? Is there any way of measuring the degree to which x exceeds y in their solution? Answers to these questions simply reinforce the threat of tautology the faces the theory. To begin with the notion of “design problems” is vague and metaphorical; or, if treated literally, design problems will be all be ones relative to the overarching objective of leaving more descendants. Thus the definition may simply hide the original problem of distinguishing fitness from reproductive rates, instead of solving it.
Second, the number of design problems is equal to the number of distinct environmental features that effect survival, and of course reproduction, and this number is probably uncountable. Accordingly, the definition provides no hope of cardinal or even ordinal measurement that would enable us to predict or explain quantitatively differences in rates of reproduction, and the evolutionary processes that depend on these rates. It is no wonder that biologists, sensible of the importance of predictive precision and explanatory testability, have had little truck with ecological fitness and have defined ‘x is fitter than y’ in terms of quantitatively measurable reproductive rates. This tendency of course simply adds force to the original argument. If the only way to make fitness-differences scientifically tractable is to trivialize the theory, so much the worse for the theory.
On this view, though the word ‘fitness’, and the symbol ‘w’ which names the property both figure in the theory, they are to be understood as simply expressing probabilistic reproduction rates for populations. The theory of natural selection is then treated as a set of claims about how populations' and subpopulations' sizes changes over time as a function of differing reproductive rates at some initial time, holding environments constant. Since the theory makes no claims about the local adaptation of individual organisms to their particular environment, or for that matter about the local adaptation of populations to their environment, it does not provide an explanation of these changes in organism or gene frequency. Explanations for these changes are to be sought elsewhere, and will not cite some general property like “ecological fitness” as a cause of these changes.
Proponents of this view generally endorse a so-called probabilistic propensity definition of fitness which we shall now examine. It should be noted that many philosophers and biologists endorse the propensity view without accepting the independent claim that the theory of natural selection is about ensembles and not about individual fitness-differences between organisms taken two at a time. But it will be obvious that the probabilistic propensity definition of fitness is a natural one for a purely population-level theory of natural selection.
These concepts have explanatory power even though they are defined in terms of causes and effects from which they are nevertheless distinct, and are realized by the molecular properties of matter on which they supervene. The fact that fitness is a probabilistic disposition makes for no special difficulty on this analysis. The charge of tautology against the theory thus rests on the mistaken demand that an explanatory variable must always be defined in terms distinct from its causes and effects. This is a demand shown to be unreasonable by the failed Logical Positivist's attempts to give the empirical meanings of theoretical terms independent of their explanatory roles.
Mutatis mutandis for comparative fitness differences. These will be dispositions supervening on the complex of relations between organisms' and environments' manifest properties (Rosenberg, 1978), and will give rise to differential reproductive rates. Thus, definitions such as the following were advanced by proponents of this approach (Beatty and Mills, 1979, Brandon, 1978):
x is fitter than y in E = x has a probabilistic propensity >.5 to leave more offspring than y
Of course, if fitness is a probabilistic propensity, then the fitter among competing organisms will not always leave more offspring, and the theory of natural selection will have to be understood as making the claim that (probabilistic) fitness difference result in reproductive differences not invariably but only with some probability. Since the theory of natural selection allows for drift, this qualification on its claims will be a welcome one. However, this latter probability to leave more offspring will have to be distinct from its cause—the probabilistic propensities that constitute fitness differences. The only candidate that will do the work required is the interpretation of probability as long run relative frequency. The idea here is that chances explain long run frequencies: if x has a probabilistic propensity >.5 to leave more offspring than y in every generation, then the long run relative frequency of x's having more offspring than y in any generation is more than .5
But there must be a theoretically detectable difference between the chance and the frequency for former to causally explain the latter. And there certainly are philosophers of science who deny that such a distinction between probabilistic propensities and long run relative frequencies is in general possible (Earman , 1985, p.149). Some philosophers have argued that there are such chancy probabilistic fitness propensities(Brandon and Carson. 1996). They hold that here, as in quantum mechanics, we find a brute unanalyzable probabilistic dispositional property of a particular item, which generates the long run relative frequencies. It is indeed the case that among philosophers of quantum mechanics some hold that probabilistic propensities can explain actual frequencies [cf. Railton, 1978, p. 216], and some hold that they do so via a detour into long run relative frequencies. But few are comfortable with such arguments and adopt them only because, at the level of the quantum mechanical probabilistic propensities are indispensable and irreducible [cf. Lewis, 1984]. Proponents of probabilistic propensities in biology may envision two possibilities here. One is that probabilistic propensities at the levels of phenomena that constitute the biological are the result of quantum probabilities “percolating up” in Sober  and Brandon's and Carson's  phrase; the second is that there are brute unexplainable probabilistic propensities at the level of fitness-differences [Brand and Carson, idem]. No one doubts the biological significance of quantum percolation. It may well be an important source of mutation [cf. Stamos, 1999 for a discussion]. But the claim that it has a significant role in fitness differences is not supported by any independent evidence [cf. Millstein 2000 and Glymour 2000 for a discussion]. The claim that there are brute probabilistic propensities at the level of organismal fitness differences is only slightly more tenable. No one has adduced any evidence that, for instance, the probabilistic generalizations about the behavior of animals that ethology and behavioral biology provide, are irreducibly probabilistic, instead of simply expressions of the current state of our knowledge and ignorance of the causes and conditions of the behavior in question.
The first thing to notice about the “definition”
x is fitter than y in E = x has a probabilistic propensity >.5 to leave more offspring than y
is that it is of course false. That is, there are many circumstances in which the organism of greater fitness has the propensity to leave fewer immediate offspring than the organism of lower fitness; as when for example, the larger number of a bird's chick all die owing to the equal division of a quantity of food which would have kept a smaller number viable. More generally, as Gillespie  has shown, the temporal and/or spatial variance in number of offspring may also have an important selective effect. To take a simple example from Brandon . If organism a has 2 offspring each year, and organism b has 1 offspring in odd numbered years and 3 in even numbered ones, then, ceteris paribus, after ten generations there will be 512 descendants of a and 243 descendants of b. The same holds if a and b are populations, and b's offspring vary between 1 and 3 depending on location instead of period.
Accordingly, we need to change the “definition” to accommodate the effects of variance:
x is fitter than y = probably x will have more offspring than y, unless their average numbers of offspring are equal and the temporal and/or spatial variance in y's offspring numbers is greater than the variance in x's, or the average numbers of x's offspring are lower than y's, but the difference in offspring variance is large enough to counterbalance y's greater number of offspring.
It is also the case that in some biologically actual circumstances — for example, in circumstances in which mean fitnesses are low, increased variance is sometimes selected for [Ekbohm, G., Fagerstrom, T., and Agren, G., 1979]. As Beatty and Finsen  further showed, our “definition” will also have to accommodate “skew” along with offspring numbers and variance. Skew 'appears' when one of the 'tails' of the distribution contains more observations and the median is therefore shifted away from the normal. Our “definition” of fitness must take these conditions into account on pain of falsity. One simple way to do so is to add a ceteris paribus clause to the definition. But the question must then be raised of how many different exceptions to the original definiens need to be accommodated? If the circumstances under which greater offspring numbers do not make for greater fitness are indefinitely many, then this “definition” will be unsatisfactory.
Some proponents of the propensity definition recognize this difficulty and are prepared to accept that at most a ‘schematic’ definition can be provided. Thus Brandon writes:
We can … define the adaptedness [a synonym for expected fitness] of an organism O in an environment E as follows:A* (O, E) = ΣP(QiOE)QiOE − f(E, σ2).
Here QiOE are a range of possible offspring numbers in generation i, P(QiOE) is the probabilistic propensity to leave QiOE in generation i, and most important f(E, σ2) is “some function of the variance in offspring numbers for a given type, σ2, and of the pattern of variation” [p. 20] Brandon means “some function or other, we know not what in advance of examining the case.” Moreover, we will have to add to variance other factors that determine the function, such as Beatty and Finsen's skew, or the conditions which Ekbohm, Fagerstrom, and Agren identify as making higher variance adaptive, etc. Thus, the final term in Brandon's definition will have to be expanded to f(E, σ2, …), where the ellipses indicate the additional statistical factors which sometimes combine with or cancel the variance to determine fitness-levels.
But how many such factors are there, and when do they play a non-zero role in fitness? The answer is that the number of such factors is probably indefinitely large. The reason for this is given by the facts about natural selection as Darwin and his successors uncovered them. The fact about selection which fates our “definition” either to being forever schematic or incomplete is the “arms-race” strategic character of evolutionary interaction. Since every strategy for enhancing reproductive fitness (including how many offspring to have in a given environment) calls forth a counter-strategy among competing organisms (which may undercut the initial reproductive strategy), the number of conditions covered by our ceteris paribus clause, or equivalently the number of places in the function f(E, σ2, …) is equal to the number of strategies and counter-strategies of reproduction available in an environment. Brandon writes, “in the above definition of A* (O, E), the function f(E, σ2) is a dummy function in the sense that the form can be specified only after the details of the selection scenario have been specified” [p. 20] But, besides the fact Brandon admits, that the function f will differ for different O, and E, f will have to be expanded to accommodate an indefinite number of further statistical terms beyond variance. Schematically, it will take the form f(E, σ2, …). Again, adapting Brandon's notation, none of the members of the set which express his multiply generic “definition” of “adaptedness” or “expected fitness,” [ΣP(QiOE)QiOE − f1(E, σ2, …), ΣP(QiOE)QiOE − f2(E, σ2, …), ΣP(QiOE)QiOE − f3(E, σ2, …) …], is in fact a definition of either term. It is the set of operational measurements of the property of comparative fitness.
These biological problems of the propensity definition (along with others elaborated in Sober, 2002, and Lewontin and Ariew, 2002) force one to consider alternative approaches to the treatment of fitness, or to consider interpretations of the theory of natural selection that circumvent the problem of defining fitness so as assure the theory's explanatory power.
Brandon, for example, has argued that the theory of natural selection should not be viewed as a body of general laws, but as the prescription for a research program. As such its central claims need not meet standards of testability and fitness need not be defined in terms which assure the nontriviality, testability and direct explanatory power of the theory of natural selection. In that sense, Brandon makes common cause with the later Popper. Popper originally argued the claim that the theory of natural selection was unfalsifiable pseudoscience. Later he came to hold that theory of natural selection was a scientifically respectable but nevertheless untestable organizing principle for biological science [Brandon, 1990, p. 139-140].
On this view, in each particular selective scenario, a different specification of the schematic propensity definition figures in the antecedent of different and highly restricted principle of natural selection which is applicable only in that scenario. Properly restricted to the right function and the right set of statistical features of its reproductive rate for a given environment, these versions will presumably each be a highly specific claim about natural selection for the given population in the given environment.
The notion that there is a very large family of principles of natural selection, each with a restricted range of application, will be attractive to those biologists uncomfortable with a single principle or law of natural selection, and to those philosophers of science who treat the theory of natural selection as a class of models. On the “semantic approach” to the theory of natural selection, each of the substitution instances of the schematic principle of natural selection generated by a particular specification of the propensity definition of fitness is treated as a definition of a different Darwinian system of population change over time. See Lloyd (1994), Beatty (1981), and Thompson (1989) for exposition of this position. The evolutionary biologist's task is to identify which definition is instantiated by various populations in various environments.
But for every such definition instantiated by a population, there is the synthetic truth that the members of the population, or all of its subpopulations, instantiate the definition, and the further broader truth that many populations of otherwise diverse species instantiate a small sub-set of the models, and the yet broader truth that all populations instantiate one of this set of really quite similar models. Presumably, all these statements of varying degrees of generality need explanation. Consequently, those who resist the “semantic interpretation” of theories argue that we might as well treat each as a substitution instances of the principle of natural selection generated by a different probabilistic propensity measure of fitness as a distinct empirical generalization to begin with instead of a model-theoretic definition. But, one will want to ask, does this set of generalizations with similar antecedents and identical consequents have something in common, which in turn explains and unifies them, or are they the fundamental principles of the theory of natural selection? The question is obviously rhetorical. Of course they have something in common that needs to be explained, and every one knows what it is. For each of the members of the set of functions which turn the definition-schema for fitness into a complete property is a measurement of the fitness of some actual or potential individuals or populations. Each is a measurement appropriate to its particular environmental circumstances, a measurement inappropriate for the same or different individuals at different locations or times in the same environment.
On a realist interpretation of the theory of natural selection, treating fitness as a subjective probability would commit the theory to the existence of sentient creatures having cognitive states and prepared to place bets in light of them: the theory of natural selection would be a psychological theory about such creatures along with the processes of heritable random variation and natural selection. Such an interpretation may not trouble the working biologist, but then the whole problem of giving a definition of fitness altogether is one biologists might reasonably treat as “academic.” Any one seeking to employ the theory with a naturalistic philosophical agenda, for example to give a reductive account of cognition, must reject a subjective probability interpretation of fitness or seek an alternative to Darwinian accounts of teleology in nature and the mind.
To see what these tasks are, consider the question how do we decide whether a divergence from a long run relative frequency prediction about fitness differences is a matter of drift, a disconfirmation of the hypothesis of natural selection or a reflection of a mismeasurement of fitness differences to begin with? Suppose we measure the fitness differences between population a and population b to be in the ratio of 7:3 (e.g. wa = 1, wb = .428) and suppose further that in some generation, the actual offspring ratio is 5:5. There are four alternatives: a) the fitness measure of 7:3 is right but there was drift-i.e. the initial condition at this generation are unrepresentative of those which obtain in all relevant generations; b) the fitness measure of 7:3 was incorrect and there was no drift; c) both drift and wrong fitness measure or d) the principle of natural selection is disconfirmed. Ignoring the fourth alternative, how do we discriminate among the first three of these?
In the absence of information about the initial conditions of the divergence, there is only one way empirically to choose between alternatives a) - c). This way requires that there are ecological fitness differences, and that we can detect them. Suppose that fitness differences were matters of probabilistic differential reproductive success (no matter what interpretations of probability is adopted). Then the only access to fitness differences is via population censuses in previous generations (since these form the bases of the probabilities). Suppose that this census does indeed show a 7:3 ratio between as and bs in the recent past. In order to exclude the absence of fitness differences instead of drift, as the source of the current generation's 5:5 outcome, we need to be able to establish that the 7:3 differences in previous populations were not themselves the result of drift. But this is the first step in a regress, since we began with the problem of discriminating drift from mismeasures of fitness. To solve the initial problem, we now have to assure ourselves that the 7:3 ratios in the past were not the result of drift. Whence the regress. Of course the problem does not arise if we have access to fitness differences independently of previous population censuses. And this access we have, at least in principle, if fitness is a matter of differences in the solution of identifiable design-problems, that is, if there is such a thing as ecological fitness and it is (fallibly) measured by probabilistic propensities to leave offspring.
Once we have access to ecological fitness differences, we can, at least in principle, decide whether the divergence from predicted long-run relative frequencies, especially where small populations are concerned, is a matter of drift or reflects our ignorance either of ecological fitness differences or the unrepresentativeness of the initial conditions of individual births, deaths, and reproductions.
This result also has important implications for the interpretation of the theory of natural selection as a one wholly about populations, and not also about individual fitness-differences, discussed above (Fitness in Population Biology). Note that the problem of distinguishing drift from selection in ensembles—i.e. large populations—has the same character, and is in principle susceptible to the same solution as the problem of drift makes for evolution among lineages with small numbers of individual members. We can distinguish drift from selection in ensembles as well, if we accept that there is such epistemic access to ecological fitness differences and to the initial conditions of births, deaths and reproductions, taken one at a time, and we accept that these individual-differences aggregate into ensemble-differences.
Because populations no matter how large are always finite in size, there is always some drift which needs to be distinguished from fitness differences. Thus even in population biology there is in the end no substitute for ecological fitness and no way to dispense with its services to the theory of natural selection. And since ecological fitness is ultimately a relationship between organisms taken two at a time, the theory is as much a set of claims about individuals as it is about ensembles
The problem of defining fitness remains. Or at any rate, it does so if biology cannot live with a definition of fitness in terms of over-all design-problem solution.