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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Although there are many different and sometimes conflicting approaches to feminist philosophy, it is instructive to begin by asking what, if anything, feminists as a group are committed to. Considering some of the controversies over what feminism is provides a springboard for seeing how feminist commitments generate a host of philosophical topics, especially as those commitments confront the world as we know it.
Our goal here is not to survey the history of feminism -- as a set of ideas or as a series of political movements -- but rather is to sketch some of the central uses of the term that are most relevant to those interested in contemporary feminist philosophy. The references we provide below are only a small sample of the work available on the topics in question; more complete bibliographies are available at the specific topical entries and also at the end of this entry.
In the mid-1800s the term ‘feminism’ was used to refer to "the qualities of females", and it was not until after the First International Women's Conference in Paris in 1892 that the term, following the French term féministe, was used regularly in English for a belief in and advocacy of equal rights for women based on the idea of the equality of the sexes. Although the term "feminism" in English is rooted in the mobilization for woman suffrage in Europe and the US during the late 19th and early 20th century, of course efforts to obtain justice for women did not begin or end with this period of activism. So some have found it useful to think of the women's movement in the US as occurring in "waves". On the wave model, the struggle to achieve basic political rights during the period from the mid-19th century until the passage of the Nineteenth Amendment in 1920 counts as "First Wave" feminism. Feminism waned between the two world wars, to be "revived" in the late 1960's and early 1970's as "Second Wave" feminism. In this second wave, feminists pushed beyond the early quest for political rights to fight for greater equality across the board, e.g., in education, the workplace, and at home. More recent transformations of feminism have resulted in a "Third Wave". Third Wave feminists often critique Second Wave feminism for its lack of attention to the differences among women due to race, ethnicity, class, nationality, religion (see Section 2.3 below; also Breines 2002; Spring 2002), and emphasize "identity" as a site of gender struggle. (For more information on the "wave" model and each of the "waves", see Other Internet Resources.)
However, some feminist scholars object to identifying feminism with these particular moments of political activism, on the grounds that doing so eclipses the fact that there has been resistance to male domination that should be considered "feminist" throughout history and across cultures: i.e., feminism is not confined to a few (White) women in the West over the past century or so. Moreover, even considering only relatively recent efforts to resist male domination in Europe and the US, the emphasis on "First" and "Second" Wave feminism ignores the ongoing resistance to male domination between the 1920's and 1960's and the resistance outside mainstream politics, particularly by women of color and working class women. (Cott 1987)
One strategy for solving these problems would be to identify feminism in terms of a set of ideas or beliefs rather than participation in any particular political movement. As we saw above, this also has the advantage of allowing us to locate isolated feminists whose work was not understood or appreciated during their time. But how should we go about identifying a core set of feminist beliefs? Some would suggest that we should focus on the political ideas that the term was apparently coined to capture, viz., the commitment to women's equal rights. This acknowledges that commitment to and advocacy for women's rights has not been confined to the Women's Liberation Movement in the West. But this too raises controversy, for it frames feminism within a broadly Liberal approach to political and economic life. Although most feminists would probably agree that there is some sense of "rights" on which achieving equal rights for women is a necessary condition for feminism to succeed, most would also argue that this would not be sufficient. This is because women's oppression under male domination rarely if ever consists solely in depriving women of political and legal "rights", but also extends into the structure of our society and the content of our culture, and permeates our consciousness (e.g., Bartky 1990).
Is there any point, then, to asking what feminism is? Given the controversies over the term and the politics of circumscribing the boundaries of a social movement, it is sometimes tempting to think that the best we can do is to articulate a set of disjuncts that capture a range of feminist beliefs. However, at the same time it can be both intellectually and politically valuable to have a schematic framework that enables us to map at least some of our points of agreement and disagreement. We'll begin here by considering some of the basic elements of feminism as a political position or set of beliefs. For a survey of different philosophical approaches to feminism, see "Feminism, approaches to".
So, for example, a Liberal approach of the kind already mentioned might define feminism (rather simplistically here) in terms of two claims:
Disagreements within feminism can occur with respect to either the descriptive or normative claims, e.g., feminists differ on what would count as justice or injustice for women (what counts as "equality," "oppression," "disadvantage", what rights should everyone be accorded?) , and what sorts of injustice women in fact suffer (what aspects of women's current situation are harmful or unjust?). Disagreements may also lie in the explanations of the injustice: two feminists may agree that women are unjustly being denied proper rights and respect and yet substantively differ in their accounts of how or why the injustice occurs and what is required to end it.
Disagreements between feminists and non-feminists can occur with respect to both the normative and descriptive claims as well, e.g., some non-feminists agree with feminists on the ways women ought to be viewed and treated, but don't see any problem with the way things currently are. Others disagree about the background moral or political views.
In an effort to suggest a schematic account of feminism, Susan James characterizes feminism as follows:
Feminism is grounded on the belief that women are oppressed or disadvantaged by comparison with men, and that their oppression is in some way illegitimate or unjustified. Under the umbrella of this general characterization there are, however, many interpretations of women and their oppression, so that it is a mistake to think of feminism as a single philosophical doctrine, or as implying an agreed political program. (James 2000, 576)James seems here to be using the notions of "oppression" and "disadvantage" as placeholders for more substantive accounts of injustice (both normative and descriptive) over which feminists disagree.
Some might prefer to define feminism in terms of a normative claim alone: feminists are those who believe that women are entitled to equal rights, or equal respect, or…(fill in the blank with one's preferred account of injustice), and one is not required to believe that women are currently being treated unjustly. However, if we were to adopt this terminological convention, it would be harder to identify some of the interesting sources of disagreement both with and within feminism, and the term ‘feminism’ would lose much of its potential to unite those whose concerns and commitments extend beyond their moral beliefs to their social interpretations and political affiliations. Feminists are not simply those who are committed in principle to justice for women; feminists take themselves to have reasons to bring about social change on women's behalf.
Taking "feminism" to entail both normative and empirical commitments also helps make sense of some uses of the term ‘feminism’ in recent popular discourse. In everyday conversation it is not uncommon to find both men and women prefixing a comment they might make about women with the caveat, "I'm not a feminist, but…". Of course this qualification might be (and is) used for various purposes, but one persistent usage seems to follow the qualification with some claim that is hard to distinguish from claims that feminists are wont to make. E.g., I'm not a feminist but I believe that women should earn equal pay for equal work; or I'm not a feminist but I'm delighted that first-rate women basketball players are finally getting some recognition in the WNBA. If we see the identification "feminist" as implicitly committing one to both a normative stance about how things should be and an interpretation of current conditions, it is easy to imagine someone being in the position of wanting to cancel his or her endorsement of either the normative or the descriptive claim. So, e.g., one might be willing to acknowledge that there are cases where women have been disadvantaged without wanting to buy any broad moral theory that takes a stance on such things (especially where it is unclear what that broad theory is). Or one might be willing to acknowledge in a very general way that equality for women is a good thing, without being committed to interpreting particular everyday situations as unjust (especially if is unclear how far these interpretations would have to extend). Feminists, however, at least according to popular discourse, are ready to both adopt a broad account of what justice for women would require and interpret everyday situations as unjust by the standards of that account. Those who explicitly cancel their commitment to feminism may then be happy to endorse some part of the view but are unwilling to endorse what they find to be a problematic package.
As mentioned above, there is considerable debate within feminism concerning the normative question: what would count as (full) justice for women? What is the nature of the wrong that feminism seeks to address? E.g., is the wrong that women have been deprived equal rights? Is it that women have been denied equal respect for their differences? Is it that women's experiences have been ignored and devalued? Is it all of the above and more? What framework should we employ to identify and address the issues? (See, e.g., Jaggar 1983; Young 1990a; Tuana and Tong 1995.) Feminist philosophers in particular have asked: Do the standard philosophical accounts of justice and morality provide us adequate resources to theorize male domination, or do we need distinctively feminist accounts? (E.g., Okin 1979; Hoagland 1989; Okin 1989; Ruddick 1989; Benhabib 1992; Hampton 1993; Held 1993; Tong 1993; Baier 1994; Moody-Adams 1997; Walker 1998; Kittay 1999; Robinson 1999).
Note, however, that by phrasing the task as one of identifying the wrongs women suffer (and have suffered), there is an implicit suggestion that women as a group can be usefully compared against men as a group with respect to their standing or position in society; and this seems to suggest that women as a group are treated in the same way, or that they all suffer the same injustices, and men as a group all reap the same advantages. But of course this is not the case, or at least not straightforwardly so. As bell hooks so vividly pointed out, in 1963 when Betty Friedan urged women to reconsider the role of housewife and demanded greater opportunities for women to enter the workforce (Friedan 1963), Friedan was not speaking for working class women or most women of color (hooks 1984, 1-4). Neither was she speaking for lesbians. Women as a group experience many different forms of injustice, and the sexism they encounter interacts in complex ways with other systems of oppression. In contemporary terms, this is known as the problem of intersectionality (Crenshaw 1991). This critique has led some theorists to resist the label "feminism" and adopt a different name for their view. Earlier, during the 1860's-80's, the term ‘womanism’ had sometimes been used for such intellectual and political commitments; more recently, Alice Walker has proposed that a newly defined "womanism" provides a contemporary alternative to "feminism" that better addresses the needs of Black women and women of color more generally (Walker 1990).
Note, however, that not all agree with such an expansive definition of feminism. One might agree that feminists ought to work to end all forms of oppression -- oppression is unjust and feminists, like everyone else, have a moral obligation to fight injustice -- without maintaining that it is the mission of feminism to end all oppression. One might even believe that in order to accomplish feminism's goals it is necessary to combat racism and economic exploitation, but also think that there is a narrower set of specifically feminist objectives. In other words, opposing oppression in its many forms may be instrumental to, even a necessary means to, feminism, but not intrinsic to it. E.g., bell hooks argues:
Feminism, as liberation struggle, must exist apart from and as a part of the larger struggle to eradicate domination in all its forms. We must understand that patriarchal domination shares an ideological foundation with racism and other forms of group oppression, and that there is no hope that it can be eradicated while these systems remain intact. This knowledge should consistently inform the direction of feminist theory and practice. (hooks 1989, 22)On hooks' account, the defining characteristic that distinguishes feminism from other liberation struggles is its concern with sexism:
Unlike many feminist comrades, I believe women and men must share a common understanding -- a basic knowledge of what feminism is -- if it is ever to be a powerful mass-based political movement. In Feminist Theory: From Margin to Center, I suggest that defining feminism broadly as "a movement to end sexism and sexist oppression" would enable us to have a common political goal…Sharing a common goal does not imply that women and men will not have radically divergent perspectives on how that goal might be reached. (hooks 1989, 23)Hooks' approach depends on the claim that sexism is a particular form of oppression that can be distinguished from other forms, e.g., racism and homophobia, even though it is currently (and virtually always) interlocked with other forms of oppression. Feminism's objective is to end sexism, though because of its relation to other forms of oppression, this will require efforts to end other forms of oppression as well. For example, feminists who themselves remain racists will not be able to fully appreciate the broad impact of sexism on the lives of women of color. Furthermore because sexist institutions are also, e.g., racist, classist and homophobic, dismantling sexist institutions will require that we dismantle the other forms of domination intertwined with them. Following hooks' lead, we might characterize feminism schematically (allowing the schema to be filled in differently by different accounts) as the view that women are subject to sexist oppression and that this is wrong. This move shifts the burden of our inquiry from a characterization of what feminism is to a characterization of what sexism, or sexist oppression is.
As mentioned above, there are a variety of interpretations -- feminist and otherwise -- of what exactly oppression consists in, but the leading idea is that oppression consists in "an enclosing structure of forces and barriers which tends to the immobilization and reduction of a group or category of people (Frye 1983, 10-11). Not just any "enclosing structure" is oppressive, however, for plausibly any process of socialization will create a structure that both limits and enables all individuals who live within it. In the case of oppression, however, the "enclosing structures" in question are part of a broader system that asymmetrically and unjustly disadvantages one group and benefits another. So, e.g., although sexism restricts the opportunities available to -- and so unquestionably harms -- both men and women (and considering some pairwise comparisons may even have a greater negative impact on a man than a woman), overall, women as a group unjustly suffer the greater harm. It is a crucial feature of contemporary accounts, however, that one cannot assume that members of the privileged group have intentionally designed or maintained the system for their benefit. The oppressive structure may be the result of an historical process whose originators are long gone, or it may be the unintended result of complex cooperative strategies gone wrong.
Leaving aside (at least for the moment) further details in the account of oppression, the question remains: What makes a particular form of oppression sexist? If we just say that a form of oppression counts as sexist oppression if it harms women, or even primarily harms women, this is not enough to distinguish it from other forms of oppression. Virtually all forms of oppression harm women, and arguably some besides sexism harm women primarily (though not exclusively), e.g., body size oppression, age oppression. Besides, as we've noted before, sexism is not only harmful to women, but is harmful to all of us.
What makes a particular form of oppression sexist seems to be not just that it harms women, but that someone is subject to this form of oppression specifically because she is (or at least appears to be) a woman. Racial oppression harms women, but racial oppression (by itself) doesn't harm them because they are women, it harms them because they are (or appear to be) members of a particular race. The suggestion that sexist oppression consists in oppression to which one is subject by virtue of being or appearing to be a woman provides us at least the beginnings of an analytical tool for distinguishing subordinating structures that happen to affect some or even all women from those that are more specifically sexist. (Haslanger forthcoming) But problems and unclarities remain.
First, we need to explicate further what it means to be oppressed "because you are a woman". E.g., is the idea that there is a particular form of oppression that is specific to women? Is to be oppressed "as a woman" to be oppressed in a particular way? Or can we be pluralists about what sexist oppression consists in without fragmenting the notion beyond usefulness?
Two strategies for explicating sexist oppression have proven to be problematic. The first is to maintain that there is a form of oppression common to all women. For example, one might interpret Catharine MacKinnon's work as claiming that to be oppressed as a woman is to be viewed and treated as sexually subordinate, where this claim is grounded in the (alleged) universal fact of the eroticization of male dominance and female submission (MacKinnon 1987; MacKinnon 1989). Although MacKinnon allows that sexual subordination can happen in a myriad of ways, her account is monistic in its attempt to unite the different forms of sexist oppression around a single core account that makes sexual objectification the focus. Although MacKinnon's work provides a powerful resource for analyzing women's subordination, many have argued that it is too narrow, e.g., in some contexts (especially in developing countries) sexist oppression seems to concern more the local division of labor and economic exploitation. Although certainly sexual subordination is a factor in sexist oppression, it requires us to fabricate implausible explanations of social life to suppose that all divisions of labor that exploit women (as women) stem from the "eroticization of dominance and submission". Moreover, it isn't obvious that in order to make sense of sexist oppression we need to seek a single form of oppression common to all women.
A second problematic strategy has been to consider as paradigms those who are oppressed only as women, with the thought that complex cases bringing in additional forms of oppression will obscure what is distinctive of sexist oppression. This strategy would have us focus in the U.S. on White, wealthy, young, beautiful, able-bodied, heterosexual women to determine what oppression, if any, they suffer, with the hope of finding sexism in its "purest" form, unmixed with racism or homophobia, etc. (See Spelman 1988, 52-54). This approach is not only flawed in its exclusion of all but the most elite women in its paradigm, but it assumes that privilege in other areas does not affect the phenomenon under consideration. As Elizabeth Spelman makes the point:
…no woman is subject to any form of oppression simply because she is a woman; which forms of oppression she is subject to depend on what "kind" of woman she is. In a world in which a woman might be subject to racism, classism, homophobia, anti-Semitism, if she is not so subject it is because of her race, class, religion, sexual orientation. So it can never be the case that the treatment of a woman has only to do with her gender and nothing to do with her class or race. (Spelman 1988, 52-3)Recent accounts of oppression are designed to allow that oppression takes many forms, and refuse to identify one form as more basic or fundamental than the rest. For example, Iris Young describes five "faces" of oppression: exploitation, marginalization, powerlessness, cultural imperialism, and systematic violence (Young 1990c, Ch. 2). Plausibly others should be added to the list. Sexist or racist oppression, for example, will manifest itself in different ways in different contexts, e.g., in some contexts through systematic violence, in other contexts through economic exploitation. Acknowledging this does not go quite far enough, however, for monistic theorists such as MacKinnon could grant this much. Pluralist accounts of sexist oppression must also allow that there isn't an over-arching explanation of sexist oppression that applies to all its forms: in some cases it may be that women's oppression as women is due to the eroticization of male dominance, but in other cases it may be better explained by women's reproductive value in establishing kinship structures (Rubin 1975), or by the shifting demands of globalization within an ethnically stratified workplace. In other words, pluralists resist the temptation to "grand social theory," "overarching metanarratives," "monocausal explanations," to allow that the explanation of sexism in a particular historical context will rely on economic, political, legal, and cultural factors that are specific to that context which would prevent the account from being generalized to all instances of sexism (Fraser and Nicholson 1990). It is still compatible with pluralist methods to seek out patterns in women's social positions and structural explanations within and across social contexts, but in doing so we must be highly sensitive to historical and cultural variation.
Some feminists would urge us to recognize that there isn't a systematic way to unify the different instances of sexism, and correspondingly, there is no systematic unity in what counts as feminism: instead we should see the basis for feminist unity in coalition building (Reagon 1983). Different groups work to combat different forms of oppression; some groups take oppression against women (as women) as a primary concern. If there is a basis for cooperation between some subset of these groups in a given context, then finding that basis is an accomplishment, but should not be taken for granted.
An alternative, however, would be to grant that in practice unity among feminists cannot be taken for granted, but to begin with a theoretical common-ground among feminist views that does not assume that sexism appears in the same form or for the same reasons in all contexts. We saw above that one promising strategy for distinguishing sexism from racism, classism, and other forms of injustice is to focus on the idea that if an individual is suffering sexist oppression, then an important part of the explanation why she is subject to the injustice is that she is or appears to be a woman. This includes cases in which women as a group are explicitly targeted by a policy or a practice, but also includes cases where the policy or practice affects women due to a history of sexism, even if they are not explicitly targeted. For example, if women are deprived an education and so are, on the whole, illiterate. And if under these circumstances only those who are literate are entitled to vote. Then we can say that women as a group are being disenfranchised and that this is a form of sexist oppression because part of the explanation of why women cannot vote is that they are women, and women are deprived an education. The commonality among the cases is to be found in the role of gender in the explanation of the injustice rather than the specific form the injustice takes. Building on this we could unify a broad range of feminist views by seeing them as committed to the (very abstract) claims that:
Note, however, that in both sorts of cases the fact that one is or appears to be a woman need not be the only factor relevant in explaining the injustice. It might be, for example, that one stands out in a group because of one's race, or one's class, or one's sexuality, and because one stands out one becomes a target for injustice. But if the injustice takes a form that, e.g., is regarded as especially apt for a woman, then the injustice should be understood intersectionally, i.e., as a response to an intersectional category. For example, the practice of raping Bosnian women was an intersectional injustice: it targeted them both because they were Bosnian and because they were women.
Of course, these two understandings of being oppressed because you are a woman are not incompatible; in fact they typically support one another. Because human actions are often best explained by the framework employed for justifying them, one's sex may play a large role in determining how one is treated because the background understandings for what's appropriate treatment draw invidious distinctions between the sexes. In other words, the causal mechanism for sexism often passes through problematic representations of women and gender roles.
In each of the cases of being oppressed as a woman mentioned above, Paula suffers injustice, but a crucial factor in explaining the injustice is that Paula is a member of a particular group, viz., women (or females). This, I think, is crucial in understanding why sexism (and racism, and other -isms) are most often understood as kinds of oppression. Oppression is injustice that, first and foremost, concerns groups; individuals are oppressed just in case they are subjected to injustice because of their group membership. On this view, to claim that women as women suffer injustice is to claim that women are oppressed.
Where does this leave us? ‘Feminism’ is an umbrella term for range of views about injustices against women. There are disagreements among feminists about the nature of justice in general and the nature of sexism, in particular, the specific kinds of injustice or wrong women suffer; and the group who should be the primary focus of feminist efforts. Nonetheless, feminists are committed to bringing about social change to end injustice against women, in particular, injustice against women as women.
However, there is also important philosophical work to be done in what we have been calling the "descriptive" component of feminism. Careful critical attention to our practices can reveal the inadequacy of dominant philosophical tropes. For example, feminists working from the perspective of women's lives have been influential in bringing philosophical attention to the phenomenon of care and care-giving (Ruddick 1989, Held 1995), dependency (Kittay 1999), women's labor (Waring 1999, Delphy 1984), scientific bias and objectivity (Longino 1990), and have revealed weaknesses in existing ethical, political, and epistemological theories. More generally, feminists have called for inquiry into what are typically considered "private" practices and personal concerns, such as the family, sexuality, the body, to balance what has seemed to be a masculine pre-occupation with "public" and impersonal matters. Philosophy presupposes interpretive tools for understanding our everyday lives; feminist work in articulating additional dimensions of experience and aspects of our practices is invaluable in demonstrating the bias in existing tools, and in the search for better ones.
Feminist explanations of sexism and accounts of sexist practices also raise issues that are within the domain of traditional philosophical inquiry. For example, in thinking about care, feminists have asked questions about the nature of the self; in thinking about gender, feminists have asked what the relationship is between the natural and the social; in thinking about sexism in science, feminists have asked what should count as knowledge. In some such cases mainstream philosophical accounts provide useful tools; in other cases, alternative proposals have seemed more promising.
In the sub-entries included under "feminism: topics" in this Encyclopedia, authors will survey some of the recent feminist work on a topic, highlighting the issues that are of particular relevance to philosophy. Currently the following topics are in progress:
Other topics are under consideration.