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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
These are among the questions investigated by environmental ethics. Some of them are specific questions faced by individuals in particular circumstances, while others are more global questions faced by groups and communities. Yet others are more abstract questions concerning the value and moral standing of the natural environment and its nonhuman components.
In the literature on environmental ethics the distinction between instrumental value and intrinsic value (i.e., non-instrumental value) has been of considerable importance. The former is the value of things as means to further some other ends, whereas the latter is the value of things as ends in themselves regardless of whether they are also useful as means to other ends. For instance, certain fruits have instrumental value for bats who feed on them, since feeding on the fruits is a means to survival for the bats. However, it is not widely agreed that fruits have value as ends in themselves. We can likewise think of a person who teaches others as having instrumental value for those who want to acquire knowledge. Yet, in addition to any such value, it is normally said that a person, as a person, has intrinsic value, i.e., value in his or her own right independently of his or her prospects for serving the ends of others. For another example, a certain wild plant may have instrumental value because it provides the ingredients for some medicine or as an aesthetic object for human observers. But if the plant also has some value in itself independently of its prospects for furthering some other ends such as human health, or the pleasure from aesthetic experience, then the plant also has intrinsic value. Because the intrinsically valuable is that which is good as an end in itself, it is commonly agreed that something's possession of intrinsic value generates a prima facie direct moral duty on the part of moral agents to protect it or at least refrain from damaging it.
Many traditional western ethical perspectives, however, are anthropocentric or human-centered in that either they assign intrinsic value to human beings alone (i.e., what we might call anthropocentric in an absolute sense) or they assign a significantly greater amount of intrinsic value to human beings than to any nonhuman things such that the protection or promotion of human interests or well-being at the expense of nonhuman things turns out to be nearly always justified (i.e., what we might call anthropocentric in a relative sense). Aristotle (Politics, Bk. 1, Ch. 8) maintains that ‘nature has made all things specifically for the sake of man' and that the value of nonhuman things in nature is merely instrumental. The Bible (Genesis 1:27-8) says: “God created man in his own image, in the image of God created he him; male and female created he them. And God blessed them, and God said unto them, Be fruitful, and multiply, and replenish the earth, and subdue it: and have dominion over fish of the sea, and over fowl of the air, and over every living thing that moveth upon the earth.” Thomas Aquinas (Summa Contra Gentiles, Bk. 3, Pt 2, Ch 112) argues that because nonhuman animals are ‘ordered to man's use’, he can kill them or use them in any way he wishes without any injustice. Generally, anthropocentric positions find it problematic to articulate what is wrong with the cruel treatment of nonhuman animals, except to the extent that such treatment may lead to bad consequences for human beings. Immanuel Kant (‘Duties to Animals and Spirits’, in Lectures on Ethics), for instance, suggested that cruelty towards a dog might encourage a person to develop a character which would be desensitized to cruelty towards humans. From this standpoint, cruelty towards nonhuman animals would be instrumentally, rather than intrinsically, wrong. Likewise, anthropocentrism often recognizes some non-intrinsic wrongness of anthropogenic (i.e. human-caused) environmental devastation. Such destruction might damage the well-being of human beings (now and in the future), since our well-being is essentially dependent on a sustainable environment (see Passmore 1974, Bookchin 1990, Norton, Hutchins, Stevens, and Maple (eds.) 1995).
When environmental ethics emerged as a new sub-discipline of philosophy in the early 1970s, it did so by posing a challenge to traditional anthropocentrism. In the first place, it questioned the assumed moral superiority of human beings to members of other species on earth. In the second place, it investigated the possibility of rational arguments for assigning intrinsic value to the natural environment and its nonhuman contents.
It should be noted, however, that some theorists working in the field see no need to develop new, non-anthropocentric theories. Instead, they advocate what may be called enlightened anthropocentrism (or, perhaps more appropriately called, prudential anthropocentrism). Briefly, this is the view that all the moral duties we have towards the environment are derived from our direct duties to its human inhabitants. The practical purpose of environmental ethics, they maintain, is to provide moral grounds for social policies aimed at protecting the earth's environment and remedying environmental degradation. Enlightened anthropocentrism, they argue, is sufficient for that practical purpose, and perhaps even more effective in delivering pragmatic outcomes, in terms of policy-making, than non-anthropocentric theories given the theoretical burden on the latter to provide sound arguments for its more radical view that the nonhuman environment has intrinsic value (cf. Norton 1991, de Shalit 1994, Light and Katz 1996). Furthermore, some prudential anthropocentrists may hold what might be called cynical anthropocentrism, which says that we have a higher-level anthropocentric reason to be non-anthropocentric in our day-to-day thinking. The reason for this is that a day-to-day non-anthropocentrist tends to act more benignly towards the nonhuman environment on which human well-being depends. In order to be an effective cynical anthropocentrist, unfortunately, one may need to hide one's cynical anthropocentrism from others and even from oneself.
Among the accessible work that drew attention to a sense of crisis was Rachel Carson's Silent Spring (1963), which consisted of a number of essays earlier published in the New Yorker magazine detailing how pesticides such as DDT, aldrin and deildrin concentrated through the food web. Commercial farming practices aimed at maximizing crop yields and profits, Carson speculated, were capable of impacting simultaneously on environmental and public health. On the other hand, historian Lynn White jr., in a much-cited essay published in 1967 (White 1967) on the historical roots of the environmental crisis, argued that the main strands of Christian thinking had encouraged the overexploitation of nature by maintaining the superiority of humans over all other forms of life, and by depicting all of nature as created for the use of humans. Nevertheless, White argued that some minority traditions within Christianity (e.g., the views of St. Francis) might provide an antidote to the ‘arrogance’ of a mainstream tradition steeped in anthropocentrism. Two years later, the Stanford ecologist, Paul Ehrlich, published The Population Bomb (1968), warning that the growth of human population threatened the viability of planetary life-support systems. The sense of environmental crisis stimulated by those and other popular works was intensified by NASA's production and wide dissemination of a particularly potent image of earth from space taken at Christmas 1968 and featured in the Scientific American in September 1970. Here, plain to see, was a living, shining planet voyaging through space and shared by all of humanity, a precious vessel vulnerable to pollution and to the overuse of its limited capacities. In 1972 a team of researchers at MIT led by Dennis Meadows produced the Limits to Growth study, a work that summed up in many ways the emerging concerns of the previous decade and the sense of vulnerability triggered by the view of the earth from space. In §10 of the commentary to the study, the researchers wrote:
We affirm finally that any deliberate attempt to reach a rational and enduring state of equilibrium by planned measures, rather than by chance or catastrophe, must ultimately be founded on a basic change of values and goals at individual, national and world levels.The call for a ‘basic change of values’ in connection to the environment (a call that could be interpreted in terms of either instrumental or intrinsic values) reflected a need for the development of environmental ethics as a new sub-discipline of philosophy.
The new field emerged almost simultaneously in three countries -- the United States, Australia, and Norway. In the first two of these countries, direction and inspiration largely came from the earlier twentieth century American literature of the environment. For instance, the Scottish emigrant John Muir (founder of the Sierra Club and ‘father of American conservation’) and subsequently the forester Aldo Leopold had advocated an appreciation and conservation of things ‘natural, wild and free’. Their concerns were motivated by a combination of ethical and aesthetic responses to nature as well as a rejection of crudely economic approaches to the value of natural objects (a historical survey of the confrontation between Muir's reverentialism and the utilitarian conservationism of Gifford Pinchot (one of the major influences on the development of the US Forest Service) is provided in Norton 1991; also see Cohen 1984 and Nash (ed) 1990). Leopold's A Sand County Almanac (1949), in particular, advocated the adoption of a ‘land ethic’:
That land is a community is the basic concept of ecology, but that land is to be loved and respected is an extension of ethics. (vii-ix)However, Leopold himself provided no systematic ethical theory or framework to support these ethical ideas concerning the environment. His views therefore presented a challenge and opportunity for moral theorists: could some ethical theory be devised to justify the injunction to preserve the integrity, stability and beauty of the biosphere?
A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise. (224-5)
The land ethic sketched by Leopold, attempting to extend our moral concern to cover the natural environment and its nonhuman contents, was drawn on explicitly by the Australian philosopher Richard Routley (later Sylvan). According to Routley (1973 (cf. Routley and Routley 1980)), the anthropocentrism imbedded in what he called the ‘dominant western view’, or ‘the western superethic’, is in effect ‘human chauvinism’. This view, he argued, is just another form of class chauvinism, which is simply based on blind class ‘loyalty’ or prejudice, and unjustifiably discriminates against those outside the privileged class. Furthermore, in his ‘last man’ (and ‘last people’) arguments, Routley asked us to imagine the hypothetical situation in which the last person, surviving a world catastrophe, acted to ensure the elimination of all other living things and the destruction of all the landscapes after his demise. From the human-chauvinistic (or absolutely anthropocentric) perspective, the last person would do nothing morally wrong, since his or her destructive act in question would not cause any damage to the interest and well-being of humans, who would have by then disappeared. Nevertheless, Routley believed that that the imagined last act would be morally wrong. An explanation for this judgment, he suggested, is that those nonhuman objects in the environment, whose destruction is ensured by the last person, have intrinsic value, a kind of value independent of their usefulness for humans. From his critique, Routley concluded that the main approaches in traditional western moral thinking were unable to allow the recognition that natural things have intrinsic value, and that the tradition required overhaul of a significant kind.
Leopold's idea that the ‘land’ as a whole is an object of our moral concern also stimulated writers to argue for certain moral obligations toward ecological wholes, such as species, communities, and ecosystems, not just their individual constituents. American environmental philosopher Holmes Rolston III (1975), for instance, argued that species protection was a moral duty. It would be wrong, Rolston maintained, to eliminate a rare butterfly species simply to increase the monetary value of specimens already held by collectors. Like Routley's ‘last man’ arguments, Rolston's example is meant to draw attention to a kind of action that seems morally dubious and yet is not clearly ruled out or condemned by traditional anthropocentric ethical views. Species, Rolston went on to argue, are intrinsically valuable and are usually more valuable than individual specimens, since the loss of a species is a loss of genetic possibilities and the deliberate destruction of a species would show disrespect for the very biological processes which make possible the emergence of individual living things (also see Rolston 1989, Ch 10).
Meanwhile, the work of Christopher Stone (a professor of law at the University of Southern California) had become widely discussed. Stone (1972) proposed that trees and other natural objects should have at least the same standing in law as corporations. This suggestion was inspired by a particular case in which the Sierra Club had mounted a challenge against the permit granted by the U.S.Forest Service to Walt Disney Enterprises for surveys preparatory to the development of the Mineral King Valley, which was at the time a relatively remote game refuge, but not designated as a national park or protected wilderness area. The Disney proposal was to develop a major resort complex serving 14000 visitors daily to be accessed by a purpose-built highway through Sequoia National Park. The Sierra Club,as a body with a general concern for conservation, challenged the development on the grounds that the valley should be kept in its original state for its own sake.
Stone reasoned that if trees, forests and mountains could be given standing in law then they could be represented in their own right in the courts by groups such as the Sierra Club. Moreover, like any other legal person, these natural things could become beneficiaries of compensation if it could be shown that they had suffered compensatable injury through human activity. When the case went to the U.S. Supreme Court, it was determined by a narrow majority that the Sierra Club did not even meet the condition for bringing a case to court, for the Club was unable and unwilling to prove the likelihood of injury to the interest of the Club or its members. In a dissenting minority judgment, however, justices Douglas, Blackmun and Brennan mentioned Stone's argument: his proposal to give legal standing to natural things, they said, would allow conservation interests, community needs and business interests to be represented, debated and settled in court.
Reacting to Stone's proposal, Joel Feinberg (1974) raised a serious problem. Only items that have interests, Feinberg argued, can be regarded as having legal standing and, likewise, moral standing. For it is interests which are capable of being represented in legal proceedings and moral debates. This same point would also seem to apply to political debates. For instance, the movement for ‘animal liberation’, which also emerged strongly in the 1970s, can be thought of as a political movement aimed at representing the previously neglected interests of some animals (see Regan and Singer (eds.) 1976, and Clark 1977). Granted that some animals have interests that can be represented in this way, would it also make sense to speak of trees, forests, rivers, barnacles, or termites as having interests of a morally relevant kind? This issue was hotly contested in the years that followed. Meanwhile, John Passmore (1974) argued, like White, that the Judeo-Christian tradition of thought about nature, despite being predominantly ‘despotic’, contained resources for regarding humans as ‘stewards’ or ‘perfectors’ of God's creation. Skeptical of the prospects for any radically new ethic, Passmore cautioned that traditions of thought could not be abruptly overhauled. Any change in attitudes to our natural surroundings which stood the chance of widespread acceptance, he argued, would have to resonate and have some continuities with the very tradition which had legitimized our destructive practices. In sum, then, Leopold's land ethic, the historical analyses of White and Passmore, the pioneering work of Routley, Stone and Rolston, and the warnings of scientists, had by the late 1970s focused the attention of philosophers and political theorists firmly on the environment.
The confluence of ethical, political and legal debates about the environment, the emergence of philosophies to underpin animal rights activism and the puzzles over whether an environmental ethic would be something new rather than a modification or extension of existing ethical theories were reflected in wider social and political movements. The rise of environmental or ‘green’ parties in Europe in the 1980s was accompanied by almost immediate schisms between groups known as ‘realists’ versus ‘fundamentalists’ (see Dobson 1992). The ‘realists’ stood for reform environmentalism, working with business and government to soften the impact of pollution and resource depletion especially on fragile ecosystems or endangered species. The ‘fundies’ argued for radical change, the setting of stringent new priorities, and even the overthrow of capitalism and liberal individualism, which were taken as the major ideological causes of anthropogenic environmental devastation. Underlying these disagreements was the distinction between ‘shallow’ and ‘deep’ environmental movements, a distinction introduced in the early 1970s by another major influence on contemporary environmental ethics, the Norwegian philosopher and climber Arne Næss. Since the work of Næss has been significant in environmental politics, the discussion of his position is given in a separate section below.
‘Deep ecology’ was born in Scandinavia, the result of discussions between Næss and his colleagues Sigmund Kvaløy and Nils Faarlund (see Næss 1973 and 1989; also see Witoszek and Brennan (eds.) 1999 for a historical survey and commentary on the development of deep ecology). All three shared a passion for the great mountains. On a visit to the Himalayas, they became impressed with aspects of ‘Sherpa culture’ particularly when they found that their Sherpa guides regarded certain mountains as sacred and accordingly would not venture onto them. Næss decided to formulate a position which extended the reverence he and the Sherpas felt for mountains to other natural things in general.
The ‘shallow ecology movement’, as Næss (1973) calls it, is the ‘fight against pollution and resource depletion’, the central objective of which is ‘the health and affluence of people in the developed countries.’ The ‘deep ecology movement’, in contrast, endorses ‘biospheric egalitarianism’, the view that all living things are alike in having value in their own right, independent of their usefulness to human purposes. The deep ecologist respects this intrinsic value, taking care, for example, when walking on the mountainside not to cause unnecessary damage to the plants. Furthermore, deep ecology also endorses what Næss calls the ‘relational, total-field image’, understanding organisms (human or otherwise) as ‘knots’ in the biospherical net, the identities of which are defined in terms of their ecological relations to each other. Næss maintains that the ‘deep’ satisfaction that we receive from close partnership with other forms of life in nature contributes significantly to our life quality. As developed by Næss and others, the position also came to focus on the possibility of the ‘identification’ of the human ego with nature. The idea is briefly that by identifying with nature we can enlarge the boundaries of the self. Self-respect thus extends beyond the boundaries of my skin. My larger -- ecological -- Self (the capital ‘S’ emphasizes that I am an individual some of whose parts are found outside of my skin), according to Næss, deserves respect as well. And to respect and to care for myself is also to respect and to care for the natural environment with which I identify myself. ‘Self-realization’, in other words, is the reconnection of the shriveled human individual with the wider natural environment. One clear historical antecedent to this view is the romanticism of Jean-Jacques Rousseau as expressed in his last work, the Reveries of the Solitary Walker, though Næss himself cites Spinoza as the major historic inspiration of his deep ecology.
When Næss's view crossed the Atlantic, it was sometimes merged with ideas emerging from Leopold's land ethic (see Devall and Sessions 1985; also see Sessions (ed) 1995). But Næss -- wary of the apparent totalitarian political implications of Leopold's position that individual interests and well-being should be subordinated to the holistic good of the earth's biotic community (see section 4 below) -- has always taken care to distance himself from advocating any sort of ‘land ethic’. Some later critics have argued that Næss's deep ecology is no more than an extended social-democratic version of utilitarianism, which counts human interests in the same calculation alongside the ‘interests’ of all natural things (e.g., trees, wolves, bears, rivers, forests and mountains) in the natural environment (see Witoszek 1997). However, Næss failed to explain in any detail how to make sense of the idea that oysters or barnacles, termites or bacteria could have interests of any morally relevant sort at all. Without an account of this, Næss 's early ‘biospheric egalitarianism’ - that all living things whatsoever had a similar right to live and flourish - was an indeterminate principle. It also remains unclear how rivers, mountains and forests can be regarded as possessors of any kind of interests at all. This is an issue on which Næss has always remained elusive.
Biospheric egalitarianism was modified in the 1980s to the weaker claim that the flourishing of both human and non-human life have value in themselves. At the same time, Næss declared that his own favoured ecological philosophy -- ’Ecosophy T’, as he called it after his Tvergastein mountain cabin-- was only one of several possible foundations for an environmental ethic. Deep ecology ceased to be a specific doctrine, but instead became a ‘platform’, of eight points, on which Næss hoped all deep green thinkers could agree. The platform was conceived as establishing a middle ground, between underlying philosophical orientations, whether Christian, Buddhist, Taoist, process philosophy, or whatever, and the practical principles determining action in specific situations. Thus the deep ecological movement became explicitly pluralist (see Brennan 1999; c.f. Light 1996).
While Næss's Ecosophy T sees human Self-realization as a solution to the environmental crises resulting from human selfishness and exploitation of nature, some of the American and Australian followers of the deep ecology platform further argue that the expansion of the human self to include nonhuman nature is supported by the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum theory, which is said to have dissolved the boundaries between the observer and the observed (see Fox 1984, 1990, and Devall and Sessions 1985; cf. Callicott 1985). These developments of deep ecology were, however, criticized by some feminist theorists, who argued that the theory of the expanded self is in effect a disguised form of human -- indeed masculine -- egoism, unable to give nature its due respect as a genuine ‘other’ independent of human interest and well-being (see Plumwood 1993, Ch. 7, 1999, and Warren 1999). Meanwhile, some third-world critics have accused deep ecology of being elitist in its attempts to preserve wilderness experiences for only a select group of economically and socio-politically well-off people. The Indian writer Ramachandra Guha (1989, 1999) for instance, depicts the activities of many western-based conservation groups as a new form of cultural imperialism, aimed at securing converts to conservationism (cf. Bookchin 1987 and Brennan 1998a). ‘Green missionaries’, as Guha calls them, represent a movement aimed at further dispossessing the world's poor and indigenous people. “Putting deep ecology in its place,” he writes, “is to recognize that the trends it derides as "shallow" ecology might in fact be varieties of environmentalism that are more apposite, more representative and more popular in the countries of the South.” Although Næss himself repudiates suggestions that deep ecology is committed to any imperialism (see Witoszek and Brennan (eds.) 1999, Ch. 36-7 and 41), Guha's criticism raises important questions about the application of deep ecological principles in different social, economic and cultural contexts. In other critiques, deep ecology has been portrayed as having an inconsistent utopian vision (see Anker and Witoszek 1998).
Broadly speaking, a ‘feminist issue’ is any issue that contributes in some way to understanding the oppression of women. Feminist theories attempt to analyze women's oppression, its causes and consequences, and suggest strategies and directions for women's liberation. By the mid 1970s, feminist writers had raised the issue of whether patriarchal modes of thinking encouraged not only widespread inferiorizing and colonizing of women, but also of coloured people, animals and nature. Sheila Collins (1974), for instance, argued that male-dominated culture or patriarchy is supported by four interlocking pillars: sexism, racism, class exploitation, and ecological destruction.
Emphasizing the importance of feminism to the environmental movement and various other liberation movements, some writers, such as Ynestra King (1989a and 1989b), argue that the domination of women by men is the original form of domination in human society, from which all other hierarchies -- of rank, class, and political power -- flow. For instance, human domination of nature, it has been argued, is a manifestation and extension of the oppression of women, in that it is the result of associating nature with the female, which had been already inferiorized and oppressed by the male-dominating human culture. But within the plurality of feminist positions, other writers, such as Val Plumwood (1993), understand the oppression of women as only one of the many parallel forms of oppressions sharing and supported by a common structure, in which one party (the colonizer) uses a number of conceptual and rhetorical devices to privilege its interests over that of the other party (the colonized). It is argued that male-centered (androcentric) and human-centered (anthropocentric) thinking have some common characteristics, such as ‘dualism’ and the ‘logic of domination’, which are also manifested in the oppressions of many other social groups, and that in being facilitated by a common ideological structure, diverse forms of oppression often mutually-reinforce each other (Warren 1987, 1990, 1994, Cheney 1989, and Plumwood 1993). A central target of feminist analysis are those patterns of ‘dualism’ that lie deep in patriarchal thought. Examples are polar opposites, such as male/female, human/nonhuman, culture/nature, mind/body, reason/emotion, freedom/necessity. These dualisms are not just descriptive dichotomies, according to many feminists, but involve a prescriptive privileging of one side of the opposed items over the other, which is often rationalized by alleged ‘discovery’ of some qualities of the dominating groups that are meant to justify the domination that the privileged wields over the subjugated. For instance, the male may be said to excel in rationality over the emotional female; the active Cartesian mind, being free from physical constrains, may be seen as superior to the mechanical passive body; the civilized and progressive human culture may be deemed superior to the primitive nonhuman nature.
The insight of feminism, however, is not just that the dominating party often falsely sees the dominated party as lacking (or possessing) the allegedly superior (or inferior) qualities. More important, according to feminist analyses, the very premise of prescriptive dualism -- the valuing of attributes of one polarized side and the devaluing of those of the other, the idea that domination and oppression can be justified by appealing to attributes like masculinity, rationality, being civilized or developed, etc. -- is itself problematic.
Feminism represents a radical challenge for environmental thinking, politics, and traditional social ethical perspectives. It promises to link environmental questions with wider social problems concerning various kinds of discrimination and exploitation, and fundamental investigations of human psychology. However, whether there are conceptual or merely contingent connections among the different forms of oppression and liberation remains a contested issue (see Green 1994). The term ‘ecofeminism’ (first coined by Françoise d'Eaubonne in 1974) is now generally applied to any view that combines environmental advocacy with feminist analysis. However, because of the varieties of, and disagreements among, feminist theories, the label may be too wide to be informative. Some feminist writers on environmental issues are wary of calling themselves ‘ecofeminists’.
Apart from feminist-environmentalist theories and Næss's deep ecology, Murray Bookchin's ‘social ecology’ has also claimed to be radical, subversive, or countercultural (see Bookchin 1980, 1987, 1990).
One major influence on Bookchin's social ecology is the Frankfurt School of ‘critical theory’. Classical Marxists regarded Nature as a resource to be transformed by human labour and utilized. Members of the Frankfurt School such as Max Horkheimer and Theodore Adorno interpret Marx himself as representative of the problem of human alienation from nature. At the root of this alienation, they argue, is a narrow positivist conception of rationality -- which sees rationality as an instrument for pursuing power, technological control and progress, and takes observation, measurement and the application of purely quantitative methods to be capable of solving all problems. This conception, Horkheimer and Adorno (1969) argue, requires revision. Their project is to replace the narrow positivistic model of rationality with the so-called ‘Romantic’ values of the aesthetic, moral, sensual and expressive aspects of human nature, and bring these into harmony with our rational faculties. The oppression of what they call ‘outer nature’ (i.e., the natural environment) through science and technology, they argue, is bought at a very high price: the project of domination requires the suppression of our ‘inner nature’, the world of manifold needs and longings at the center of human life and its vulnerability (also see Eckersley 1992 and Vogel 1996, for a review of the Frankfurt School's thinking about nature).
Bookchin's version of critical theory takes the ‘outer’ physical world as constituting what he calls ‘first nature’, from which culture or ‘second nature’ has evolved. Environmentalism, on his view, is a social movement, and the problems it confronts are social problems. While Bookchin is prepared, like Horkheimer and Adorno, to regard (first) nature as an aesthetic and sensuous marvel, he regards our intervention in it as necessary. He suggests that we can choose to put ourselves at the service of natural evolution, to help maintain complexity and diversity, diminish suffering and reduce pollution. In this way, we can also to some extent overcome the kind of alienation that so worried the Frankfurt School. Bookchin's social ecology recommends that we use our gifts of sociability, communication and intelligence as if we were ‘nature rendered conscious’, instead of turning them against the very source and origin from which such gifts derive. Oppression of nature should be replaced by a richer form of life devoted to nature's preservation.
Deep ecology, feminism, and social ecology have had a considerable impact on the development of political positions in regard to the environment. Feminist analyses have often been welcomed for the psychological insight they bring to several social, moral and political problems. There is, however, considerable unease about the implications of critical theory, social ecology and some varieties of deep ecology. Some recent writers have argued, for example, that critical theory is bound to be ethically anthropocentric, with nature as no more than a ‘social construction’ whose value ultimately depends on human determinations (see Vogel 1996). Others have argued that the demands of ‘deep’ green theorists and activists cannot be accommodated within contemporary theories of liberal politics and social justice (see Ferry 1998). A further suggestion is that there is a need to reassess traditional theories such as virtue ethics, which has its origins in ancient Greek philosophy (see the following section) within the context of a form of stewardship similar to that earlier endorsed by Passmore (see Barry 1999). If this last claim is correct, then the radical activist need not, after all, look for philosophical support in radical, or countercultural, theories of the sort deep ecology, feminism and social ecology claim to be.
Consequentialist ethical theories consider intrinsic ‘value’/‘disvalue’ or ‘goodness’/‘badness’ to be more fundamental moral notions than ‘rightness’/‘wrongness’, and maintain that whether an action is right/wrong is determined by whether its consequences are good/bad. From this perspective, answers to question (2) are informed by answers to question (1). For instance, utilitarianism, a paradigm case of consequentialism, regards pleasure (or, more broadly construed, the satisfaction of interest, desire, and/or preference) as the only intrinsic value in the world, whereas pain (or the frustration of desire, interest, and/or preference) the only intrinsic disvalue, and maintains that right actions are those that would produce the greatest balance of pleasure over pain.
As the utilitarian focus is the balance of pleasure and pain as such, the question of to whom a pleasure or pain belongs is irrelevant to the calculation and assessment of the rightness or wrongness of actions. Hence, the eighteenth century utilitarian Jeremy Bentham (1789), and now Peter Singer (1993), have argued that the interests of all the sentient beings (i.e., beings who are capable of experiencing pleasure or pain) -- including nonhuman ones -- affected by an action should be taken equally into consideration in assessing the action. Furthermore, rather like Routley (see section 2 above), Singer argues that the anthropocentric privileging of members of the species Homo sapiens is arbitrary, and that it is a kind of ‘speciesism’ as unjustifiable as sexism and racism. Singer regards the animal liberation movement as comparable to the liberation movements of women and people of colour. Unlike the environmental philosophers who attribute intrinsic value to the natural environment and its inhabitants, Singer and utilitarians in general attribute intrinsic value to the experience of pleasure or interest satisfaction as such, not to the beings who have the experience. Similarly, for the utilitarian, non-sentient objects in the environment such as plant species, rivers, mountains, and landscapes, all of which are the objects of moral concern for environmentalists, are of no intrinsic but at most instrumental value to the satisfaction of sentient beings (see Singer 1993, Ch. 10). Furthermore, because right actions, for the utilitarian, are those that maximize the overall balance of interest satisfaction over frustration, practices such as whale-hunting and the killing of an elephant for ivory, which cause suffering to nonhuman animals, might turn out to be right after all: such practices might produce considerable amounts of interest-satisfaction for human beings, which, on the utilitarian calculation, outweigh the nonhuman interest-frustration involved. As the result of all the above considerations, it is unclear to what extent a utilitarian ethic can also be an environmental ethic. This point may not so readily apply to a wider consequentialist approach, which attributes intrinsic value not only to pleasure or satisfaction, but also to various objects and processes in the natural environment.
Deontological ethical theories, in contrast, maintain that whether an action is right or wrong is for the most part independent of whether its consequences are good or bad. From the deontologist perspective, there are several distinct moral rules or duties (e.g., ‘not to kill or otherwise harm the innocent’, ‘not to lie’, ‘to respect the rights of others’, ‘to keep promises’), the observance/violation of which is intrinsically right/wrong; i.e., right/wrong in itself regardless of consequences. When asked to justify an alleged moral rule, duty or its corresponding right, deontologists may appeal to the intrinsic value of those beings to whom it applies. For instance, ‘animal rights’ advocate Tom Regan (1983) argues that those animals with intrinsic value (or what he calls ‘inherent value’) have the moral right to respectful treatment, which then generates a general moral duty on our part not to treat them as mere means to other ends. We have, in particular, a prima facie moral duty not to harm them. Regan maintains that certain practices (such as sport or commercial hunting, and experimentation on animals) violate the moral right of intrinsically valuable animals to respectful treatment. Such practices, he argues, are intrinsically wrong regardless of whether or not some better consequences ever flow from them. Exactly which animals have intrinsic value and therefore the moral right to respectful treatment? Regan's answer is: those that meet the criterion of being the ‘subject-of-a-life’. To be such a subject is a sufficient (though not necessary) condition for having intrinsic value, and to be a subject-of-a-life involves, among other things, having sense-perceptions, beliefs, desires, motives, memory, a sense of the future, and a psychological identity over time.
Some authors have extended concern for individual well-being further, arguing for the intrinsic value of organisms achieving their own good, whether those organisms are capable of consciousness or not. Paul Taylor's version of this view (1981 and 1986), which we might call biocentrism, is a deontological example. He argues that each individual living thing in nature -- whether it is an animal, a plant, or a micro-organism -- is a ‘teleological-center-of-life’ having a good or well-being of its own which can be enhanced or damaged, and that all individuals who are teleological-centers-of life have equal intrinsic value (or what he calls ‘inherent worth’) which entitles them to moral respect. Furthermore, Taylor maintains that the intrinsic value of wild living things generates a prima facie moral duty on our part to preserve or promote their goods as ends in themselves, and that any practices which treat those beings as mere means and thus display a lack of respect for them are intrinsically wrong. Unlike Taylor's egalitarian and deontological biocentrism, Robin Attfield (1987) argues for a hierarchical view that while all beings having a good of their own have intrinsic value, some of them (e.g., persons) have intrinsic value to a greater extent. Attfield also endorses a form of consequentialism which takes into consideration, and attempts to balance, the many and possibly conflicting goods of different living things (also see Varner 1998 for a more recent defense of what he calls biocentric individualism with affinities to both consequentialist and deontological approaches). However, some critics have pointed out that the notion of biological good or well-being is only descriptive not prescriptive (see Williams 1992 and O'Neill 1993, Ch. 2). For instance, the fact that HIV has a good of its own does not mean that we ought to assign any positive moral weight to the realization of that good.
Note that the ethics of animal liberation or animal rights and biocentrism are both individualistic in that their various moral concerns are directed towards individuals only -- not ecological wholes such as species, populations, biotic communities, and ecosystems. None of these is sentient, a subject-of-a-life, or a teleological-center-of-life, but the preservation of these collective entities is a major concern for many environmentalists. Moreover, the goals of animal liberationists, such as the reduction of animal suffering and death, may conflict with the goals of environmentalists. For example, the preservation of the integrity of an ecosystem may require the culling of feral animals or of some indigenous populations that threaten to destroy fragile habitats. So there are disputes about whether the ethics of animal liberation is a proper branch of environmental ethics (see Callicott 1980, 1988, Sagoff 1984, Jamieson 1998, Crisp 1998 and Varner 2000).
Criticizing the individualistic approach in general for failing to accommodate conservation concerns for ecological wholes, J. Baird Callicott (1980) has advocated a version of land-ethical holism which takes Leopold's statement “A thing is right when it tends to preserve the integrity, stability, and beauty of the biotic community. It is wrong when it tends otherwise” to be the supreme deontological principle. In this theory, the earth's biotic community per se is the sole locus of intrinsic value, whereas the value of its individual members is merely instrumental and dependent on their contribution to the ‘integrity, stability, and beauty’ of the larger community. A straightforward implication of this version of the land ethic is that an individual member of the biotic community ought to be sacrificed whenever that is needed for the protection of the holistic good of the community. For instance, Callicott maintains that if culling a white-tailed deer is necessary for the protection of the holistic biotic good, then it is a land-ethical requirement to do so. But, to be consistent, the same point also applies to human individuals because they are also members of the biotic community. Not surprisingly, the misanthropy implied by Callicott's land-ethical holism has been widely criticized and regarded as a reductio of the position (see Aiken (1984), Kheel (1985), Ferré (1996), and Shrader-Frechette (1996)). Tom Regan (1983, p.362), for example, has condemned the holistic land ethic's disregard of the rights of the individual as ‘environmental fascism’. Under the pressure from the charge of ecofascism and misanthropy, Callicott (1989 Ch. 5, and 1999, Ch. 4) has later revised his position and now maintains that the biotic community (indeed, any community to which we belong) as well as its individual members (indeed, any individual who shares with us membership in some common community) all have intrinsic value. The controversy surrounding Callicott's original position, however, has inspired efforts in environment ethics to investigate possibilities of attributing intrinsic value to ecological wholes, not just their individual constituent parts (see Lo 2001 for an overview and critique of Callicott's changing position over the last two decades; also see Ouderkirk and Hill (eds.) 2002 for debates between Callicott and others concerning the metaethical and metaphysical foundations for the land ethic and also its historical antecedents).
Individual natural entities (whether sentient or not, living or not), Andrew Brennan (1984) argues, are not designed by anyone to fulfill any purpose and therefore lack ‘intrinsic function’ (i.e., the function of a thing that constitutes part of its essence or identity conditions). This, he proposes, is a reason for thinking that individual natural entities should not be treated as mere instruments, and thus a reason for assigning them intrinsic value. Furthermore, he argues that the same moral point applies to the case of natural ecosystems, to the extent that they lack intrinsic function. In the light of Brennan's proposal, Eric Katz (1991 and 1997) argues that all natural entities, whether individuals or wholes, have intrinsic value in virtue of their ontological independence from human purpose, activity, and interest, and maintains the deontological principle that nature as a whole is an ‘autonomous subject’ which deserves moral respect and must not be treated as a mere means to human ends. Carrying the project of attributing intrinsic value to nature to its ultimate form, Robert Elliot (1997) argues that naturalness itself is a property in virtue of possessing which all natural things, events, and states of affairs, attain intrinsic value. Furthermore, Elliot argues that even a consequentialist, who in principle allows the possibility of trading off intrinsic value from naturalness for intrinsic value from other sources, could no longer justify such kind of trade-off in reality. This is because the reduction of intrinsic value due to the depletion of naturalness on earth, according to him, has reached such a level that any further reduction of it could not be compensated by any amount of intrinsic value generated in other ways, no matter how great it is.
As the notion of ‘natural’ is understood in terms of the lack of human contrivance and is often opposed to the notion of ‘artifactual’, one much contested issue is about the value of those parts of nature that have been interfered with by human artifice -- for instance, previously degraded natural environments which have been humanly restored. Based on the premise that the properties of being naturally evolved and having a natural continuity with the remote past are ‘value adding’ (i.e., adding intrinsic value to those things which possess those two properties), Elliot argues that even a perfectly restored environment would necessarily lack those two value-adding properties and therefore be less valuable than the originally undegraded natural environment. Katz, on the other hand, argues that a restored nature is really just an artifact designed and created for the satisfaction of human ends, and that the value of restored environments is merely instrumental. However, some critics have pointed out that advocates of moral dualism between the natural and the artifactual run the risk of diminishing the value of human life and culture, and fail to recognize that the natural environments interfered with by humans may still have morally relevant qualities other than pure naturalness (see Lo 1999). Two other issues central to this debate are that the key concept ‘natural’ seems ambiguous in many different ways (see Hume 1751, App. 3, and Brennan 1988, Ch. 6, Elliot 1997, Ch. 4), and that those who argue that human interference reduces the intrinsic value of nature seem to have simply assumed the crucial premise that naturalness is a source of intrinsic value. Some thinkers maintain that the natural, or the ‘wild’ construed as that which ‘is not humanized’ (Hettinger and Throop 1999, p. 12) or to some degree ‘not under human control’ (ibid., p. 13) is intrinsically valuable. Yet, as Bernard Williams points out (Williams 1992), we may, paradoxically, need to use our technological powers to retain a sense of something not being in our power. The retention of wild areas may thus involve planetary and ecological management to maintain, or even ‘imprison’ such areas (Birch 1990), raising a question over the extent to which national parks and wilderness areas are free from our control. An important message underlying the debate, perhaps, is that even if ecological restoration is achievable, it might have been better to have left nature intact in the first place.
As an alternative to consequentialism and deontology both of which consider ‘thin’ concepts such as ‘goodness’ and ‘rightness’ as essential to morality, virtue ethics proposes to understand morality -- and assess the ethical quality of actions -- in terms of ‘thick’ concepts such as ‘kindness’, ‘honesty’, ‘sincerity’ and ‘justice’. As virtue ethics speaks quite a different language from the other two kinds of ethical theory, its theoretical focus is not so much on what kinds of things are good/bad, or what makes an action right/wrong. One question central to virtue ethics is what the moral reasons are for acting one way or another. For instance, from the perspective of virtue ethics, kindness and loyalty would be moral reasons for helping a friend in hardship. These are quite different from the deontologist's reason (that the action is demanded by a moral rule) or the consequentialist reason (that the action will lead to a better over-all balance of good over evil in the world). From the perspective of virtue ethics, the motivation and justification of actions are both inseparable from the character traits of the acting agent. Furthermore, unlike deontology or consequentialism the moral focus of which is other people or states of the world, one central issue for virtue ethics is how to live a flourishing human life, this being a central concern of the moral agent himself or herself. ‘Living virtuously’ is Aristotle's recipe for flourishing. Versions of virtue ethics advocating virtues such as ‘benevolence’, ‘piety’, ‘filiality’, and ‘courage’, have also been held by thinkers in the Chinese Confucian tradition. The connection between morality and psychology is another core subject of investigation for virtue ethics. It is sometimes suggested that human virtues, which constitute an important aspect of a flourishing human life, must be compatible with human needs and desires, and perhaps also sensitive to individual affection and temperaments. As its central focus is human flourishing as such, virtue ethics may seem unavoidably anthropocentric and unable to support a genuine moral concern for the nonhuman environment. But just as Aristotle has argued that a flourishing human life requires friendships and one can have genuine friendships only if one genuinely values, loves, respects, and cares for one's friends for their own sake, not merely for the benefits that they may bring to oneself, some have argued that a flourishing human life requires the moral capacities to value, love, respect, and care for the nonhuman natural world as an end in itself (see O'Neill 1992, O'Neill 1993, Barry 1999).
The importance of wilderness experience to the human psyche has been emphasized by many environmental philosophers. Næss, for instance, urges us to ensure we spend time dwelling in situations of intrinsic value, whereas Rolston meditates in the wilderness on the importance of ‘re-creation’ afforded by experiences of wild nature. However, lifestyles in which enthusiasms for mountaineering, nature rambles and woodland meditations can be indulged demand a standard of living that is far beyond the dreams of most of the world's population. Hugh Stretton (1976) has characterized those environmentalists ‘driven chiefly by love of the wilderness’ as ‘natural aristocrats’. Mass access to wild places would likely destroy the very values held in high esteem by Stretton's ‘aristocrats’. So a question hangs over how to reconcile limiting the access of people to wilderness while maintaining the individual freedoms central to liberal democracies. Furthermore, lovers of wilderness sometimes consider the high human populations in some developing countries as a key problem underlying the environmental crisis. Rolston (1996), for instance, claims that humans are a kind of planetary ‘cancer’. He maintains that while “feeding people always seems humane, ... when we face up to what is really going on, by just feeding people, without attention to the larger social results, we could be feeding a kind of cancer.” This remark is meant to justify the view that saving nature should, in some circumstances, have a higher priority than feeding people. But such a view has been criticized for seeming to reveal a degree of misanthropy, directed at those human beings least able to protect and defend themselves (see Attfield 1998, Brennan 1998a). Guha's worries about the elitist and ‘missionary’ tendencies of some kinds of ‘deep’ green environmentalism in certain rich western countries can be quite readily extended to theorists such as Rolston. Can such elitism of the environmental sort ever be democratized? How can the psychically-reviving power of the wild become available to those living in the slums of Calcutta or Sao Paolo? These questions so far lack convincing answers.
The economic conditions which support the kind of enjoyment of wilderness by Stretton's ‘aristocrats’, and more generally the lifestyles of many people in the affluent countries, seem implicated in the destruction and pollution which has provoked the environmental turn in the first place. For those in the rich countries, for instance, engaging in outdoor recreations usually involves the motor car. Car dependency, however, is at the heart of many environmental problems, a key factor in urban pollution, while at the same time central to the economic and military activities of many nations and corporations, for example those activities associated with securing and exploiting oil resources. A range of new moral and political problems may open up for us. These include the problems of the environmental cost of tourist access to wilderness areas, and the fair ways in which limited access could be arranged to areas of natural diversity and beauty. International problems concern the exploitation of people in the world's economically poor nations as an aspect of an economic system supporting the lifestyles of the wealthy, and also oppression and war associated with securing oil and other resources of significance to the industrialized countries. In an increasingly crowded world, the answers to such problems will not be obvious and may require academic co-operation between philosophers and workers in other disciplines in an attempt to solve them.
Connections between environmental destruction, unequal resource consumption, poverty and the global economic order have been discussed by political scientists, development theorists, geographers and economists as well as by philosophers. Links between economics and environmental ethics are particularly well established. Work by Mark Sagoff (1988), for instance, has played a major part in bringing the two fields together (also see Shrader-Frechette 1987, O'Neill 1993, and Brennan 1995). Sagoff argued forcefully against confusing values with matters of preference (even considered preference), and claimed that íV as citizens rather than consumers íV people are concerned about values that cannot plausibly be monetized. The potentially misleading appeal to economic reason used to justify the expansion of the corporate sector has also come under critical scrutiny (see Korten 1999, Ch. 2, Plumwood (formerly V. Routley) 2002). These critiques do not aim to eliminate economics from environmental thinking; rather, they resist any reductive, and strongly anthropocentric, tendency to believe that all social problems are ‘fundamentally’ or ‘essentially’ economic. Interestingly, many of the assessments of issues concerned with biodiversity, ecosystem health, poverty, environmental justice and sustainability look at both human and environmental issues, eschewing in the process commitment either to a purely anthropocentric or purely non-anthropocentric ethic (Hayward and O'Neill 1997, and Dobson 1999 for collections of essays looking at the links between sustainability, justice, welfare and the distribution of environmental goods).
Other interdisciplinary approaches link environmental ethics with biology, policy studies, public administration, political theory, cultural history, post-colonial theory, literature, geography, and human ecology (for some examples, see Norton, Hutchins, Stevens, Maple 1995, Shrader-Frechette 1984, Gruen and Jamieson (eds.) 1994, Karliner 1997, Diesendorf and Hamilton 1997). The newest collection on environmental ethics (Schmidtz and Willott 2002) contains, in addition to readings on the questions discussed in the present article, sections devoted explicitly to cost-benefit analysis and environmental policy, the impact of cities on resource consumption, poverty as an environmental problem, sustainability and the growth of human population. This is in keeping with the developing philosophical interest in ethical analysis of policy fundamentals. The future development of environmental ethics may depend on these, and other interdisciplinary synergies, as much as on its anchorage within philosophy.