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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Naturalized epistemology is best seen as a cluster of views according to which epistemology is closely connected to natural science. Some advocates of naturalized epistemology emphasize methodological issues, arguing that epistemologists must make use of results from the sciences that study human reasoning in pursuing epistemological questions. The most extreme view along these lines recommends replacing traditional epistemology with the psychological study of how we reason. A more modest view recommends that philosophers make use of results from sciences studying cognition to resolve epistemological issues. A rather different form of naturalized epistemology is about the content of paradigmatically epistemological statements. Advocates of this kind of naturalized epistemology propose accounts of these statements entirely in terms of scientifically respectable objects and properties. In this they seem to contrast with more traditional epistemologists whose accounts make free use of evaluative terms such as "good reasons" and "adequate evidence". The significance of the claims of advocates of naturalized epistemology can best be appreciated by seeing them as a reaction to the methods and views that have been prominent in much of the twentieth century.
A great deal of work in epistemology is devoted to two projects: replying to arguments for skepticism and analyzing key epistemological concepts. Although the discussion of skepticism goes back to ancient times, much of the contemporary thought on the topic is a reaction to Descartes. According to the Cartesian picture, if we have knowledge of the world around us, this knowledge is ultimately traceable to our knowledge of our own experiences. We know how we are experiencing the world, and somehow we reason from this knowledge out to the world. There is, however, a possibility of error in such reasoning. Our experiences might result from dreams, hallucinations, or the manipulations of an evil demon or his modern counterpart, an evil neuroscientist artificially stimulating a bodiless brain in a vat. Arguments beginning with premises involving hypotheses such as these yield skeptical conclusions. Other skeptical arguments begin with premises about more routine sorts of errors and confusions. These arguments call into question apparent knowledge gained by ordinary people in ordinary circumstances as well as apparent knowledge gained through scientific inquiry. Epistemologists continue to try to identify precisely the structure of these skeptical arguments and the assumptions about knowledge and the world that they rely on. Traditional epistemologists, that is, those who do not advocate naturalizing epistemology, typically carry out this activity in their armchairs. They often see the scientific study of our cognitive systems as at best only distantly related to their effort to reply to skeptical arguments.
Arguments for skepticism rely, implicitly or explicitly, on assumptions about what is required for knowledge. Hence, consideration of those arguments invites analysis of what is necessary for knowledge. Widely shared views imply that for a person to know a proposition to be true, the person must have a well justified belief in the proposition and the proposition must in fact be true. Independent interest in what differentiates knowledge from mere true belief and shared opinion also generates interest in questions about the analysis of knowledge, as well as its key components. These analyses are intended to state necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of the concept. The details of the many analyses of knowledge epistemologists have offered are not crucial for present purposes, nor are the details of the varying accounts of justification that have occupied center stage in the epistemological literature. Section 4 will review the general differences between the sorts of analyses some naturalists propose and more traditional purportedly non-natural analyses. The central point to be reviewed in Sections 2 and 3 turns on the fact that the discussion of these analyses has typically gone on by means of reflection on possible cases. Epistemologists describe possible cases, consult their intuitions about whether the cases would be cases of knowledge or not, and decide on that basis whether or not the cases show the proposed analysis to fail. Once again, the task is carried out in the epistemologist's armchair, without the aid of science. It is this method of inquiry to which some naturalists object.
The source of much of the recent interest in Naturalized Epistemology is W.V.O Quine's celebrated essay, "Epistemology Naturalized" (Quine, 1969). Quine begins this essay by saying that "Epistemology is concerned with the foundations of science." In an effort to show that science has an adequate foundation, epistemologists attempted to derive statements about the world around us from statements about our own sensations. Given that we are certain about our own sensations, if we could strictly derive our beliefs about the world from our beliefs about sensations, we could then be certain of the derived truths about the world as well. We would then have a firm foundation for both everyday knowledge and scientific knowledge. Quine argues that such efforts to ground our beliefs about the world have failed. The proposed derivations just don't work. Virtually all contemporary philosophers agree. Quine concludes that the traditional effort to respond to skepticism is a failure and recommends what on the surface seems to be the abandonment of epistemology altogether. He apparently thinks that the failure of this sort of foundationalism shows that epistemology is impossible. He writes:
The stimulation of his sensory receptors is all the evidence anybody has had to go on, ultimately, in arriving at his picture of the world. Why not just see how this construction really proceeds? Why not settle for psychology? (Quine, 1969: 75)
Quine seems to be recommending that we abandon the effort to show that we do in fact have knowledge and that we instead study the ways in which we form beliefs. His proposal is that we study the psychological processes that take us from sensory stimulations to beliefs about the world. He elaborates on this idea in a widely quoted passage:
Epistemology, or something like it, simply falls into place as a chapter of psychology and hence of natural science. It studies a natural phenomenon, viz., a physical human subject. This human subject is accorded a certain experimentally controlled input -- certain patterns of irradiation in assorted frequencies, for instance -- and in the fullness of time the subject delivers as output a description of the three-dimensional external world and its history. The relation between the meager input and the torrential output is a relation that we are prompted to study for somewhat the same reasons that always prompted epistemology: namely, in order to see how evidence relates to theory, and in what ways one's theory of nature transcends any available evidence...But a conspicuous difference between old epistemology and the epistemological enterprise in this new psychological setting is that we can now make free use of empirical psychology. (Quine, 1969: 82-3)
As Jaegwon Kim points out in a widely cited critical discussion of Quine, another conspicuous difference between traditional epistemology and what Quine recommends is that they study strikingly different topics (Kim, 1988: 390). The old epistemology was interested in questions about rationality, justification, and knowledge. The central questions concerned whether an epistemic support relation--a justifying relation--holds between our basic evidence and our beliefs about the world. Analysis of some of the arguments for skepticism reveals that they rely on the view that our evidence supports our beliefs only if our beliefs are deducible from that evidence. Seeing that they are not, many epistemologists are drawn to investigate other accounts of the epistemic support relation, accounts that allow for the possibility that our beliefs about the world are well supported by our sensory evidence, even if they are not strictly derivable from that evidence. As Kim sees it, Quine has proposed ignoring these questions about epistemic support and investigating instead the causal connections between our sensory evidence and our beliefs about the world. Thus, if we follow the Quinean recommendation, we will study the same relata--our basic evidence and our beliefs about the world. However, we will study a different relation. In the original case, we looked to see if there was an epistemic support relation between the data and the beliefs. In the new case, we look to see the nature of the causal connection between them.
The Quinean view that we should abandon epistemology for psychology is not widely accepted by contemporary naturalists in epistemology. (See Almeder, 1998; BonJour, 1994; Foley, 1994; Fumerton, 1994.) Even Quine's later views were more moderate (Quine, 1990). Perhaps this is because questions about the quality of our reasons for our beliefs about the world strike even naturalists as perfectly good questions, questions deserving of investigation and analysis. Perhaps it is because new views about the nature of knowledge and justification hold that they require the use of processes and methods that reliably lead to truth rather than recognizably good reasons. Whether we actually use such processes and methods seems to be a perfectly good question. In any case, Quinean Replacement Naturalism finds relatively few supporters.
One recent author who does defend a view close to Quine's is Hilary Kornblith. Kornblith contends that once traditional epistemologists admit that the Cartesian program of deriving beliefs about the world from certain foundations fails, they end up endorsing as legitimate whatever principles enable them to ratify the beliefs they started with. He writes,
Of course knowledge is possible if we weaken the standards for knowledge far enough, in particular if we weaken them until we can show that many of our beliefs then pass the standards. But this seems to be nothing more than an exercise in self-congratulation. Why should we care about knowledge so defined? (Kornblith, 1999: 160)
He goes on to say,
But if our standards for knowledge are merely designed to allow us to attach the epithet ‘knowledge’ to whatever it is we pretheoretically believe, then ... the result is an uncritical endorsement of the epistemological status quo. (Kornblith, 1999: 160)
Somewhat similar sentiments, though perhaps for different reasons, can be found in the writings of Stephen Stich. (Stich, 1990)
There is, however, a difference between the view that our pretheoretical beliefs are justified (or amount to knowledge), no matter what else is true of them, and the search for plausible general principles about knowledge and justification that have the result that those beliefs are justified. The principles philosophers put forward, including inference to the best explanation, principles about coherence and the conservation of belief, and so on, can be assessed and criticized. Few armchair epistemologists say that "whatever it is we pretheoretically believe" amounts to knowledge. Virtually all epistemologists agree that many everyday beliefs fall short of what's needed for justification and knowledge. Some conclude that knowledge is less common than one would initially think. By reflecting carefully on what they take to be realistic examples, they attempt to identify what is good about possible ways of reasoning. By calling our attention to the reasoning that withstands scrutiny and reflection, they can contribute to an effort to help us improve. So many defenders of traditional epistemology would deny that they are simply endorsing the status quo. (See Feldman, 1999)
Although Quine's Replacement Naturalism is not widely accepted, a more modest descendant of his view is extremely popular. This view, Cooperative Naturalism, holds that, while there are evaluative questions to pursue, empirical results from psychology concerning how we actually think and reason are essential or useful for making progress in addressing evaluative questions. A representative claim of this sort can be found in Susan Haack's Evidence and Inquiry, " ... the results from the sciences of cognition may be relevant to, and may be legitimately used in the resolution of traditional epistemological problems" (Haack, 1993: 118). Many philosophers who are more favorably disposed to naturalism than Haack is have voiced similar sentiments. (For example, Goldman, 1992; Stich and Nisbett, 1980: 118; Harman, 1986: 7; Kornblith, 1994: 7.)
What role empirical results can play in epistemology depends in large part on what counts as epistemology. Philip Kitcher's 1992 article, "The Naturalists Return," is a long and comprehensive study of naturalism in epistemology, arguing in part that the apsychologistic tendencies of the 20th century are in fact departures from what was standard in philosophy. Kitcher asks, "How could our psychological and biological capacities and limitations fail to be relevant to the study of human knowledge?" (Kitcher, 1992: 58) Obviously, empirical work is relevant to "the study of human knowledge." But this shows its relevance to epistemology only if epistemology is itself as broad as the study of human knowledge. If, however, there are specifically philosophical questions about knowledge, and epistemology is the study of those questions, then the relevance of empirical work about such things as our psychological and biological capacities remains open for debate. Disputes about which questions count as philosophical are likely to be futile. However, it is possible to examine fruitfully the merits of Cooperative Naturalism with respect to some of the issues typically addressed by epistemologists.
In thinking about the role of empirical information in epistemology it is helpful to keep in mind the fact that there are at least three possible views about the potential sources of information for epistemological theorizing, rather than the two that are sometimes identified. Some philosophers seem to be a priorists, in that they think that only what can be known a priori is relevant to epistemological questions. Other philosophers are armchair epistemologists, since they are willing to rely on common sense empirical knowledge -- what can be known from one's armchair, as well as a priori information. And scientific epistemologists proclaim the value of (or need for) the results from empirical studies for epistemology. This three way classification complicates the discussion of Cooperative Naturalism. If Cooperative Naturalism is the view that empirical information is important for resolving epistemological issues, then armchair epistemologists can accept it. However, if Cooperative Naturalism is the view that detailed information from the empirical sciences is important for epistemology, then armchair epistemologists are likely not to agree. There is no point in arguing about what Cooperative Naturalism "really" is. It will be enough to notice these different possibilities.
Traditional epistemologists often attempt to reply to arguments for skepticism without appeal to information available from the sciences. The arguments they consider typically include premises of two sorts. Premises of one sort specify some necessary condition for knowledge. Premises of the other sort say that people's beliefs never, or rarely, satisfy that necessary condition, or perhaps that they can't satisfy that condition. To the extent that an evaluation of the skeptical argument focuses on a premise of the first sort, a priorists will be often be in a position to carry out the task. A good analysis of knowledge will enable them to determine whether knowledge really does have the necessary condition the argument describes. Premises of this sort are in fact the focus of a good deal of the traditional debate. Thus, there are debates about whether knowledge and justification require conclusive reasons or merely very strong reasons, whether they require reasons at all rather than mere reliability or causal connectedness, whether the fact that a belief provides a good explanation of some data, or is natural, or is widely accepted provide epistemic support for that belief. It is not clear that empirical studies of how we actually reason help with these debates. They can be carried out in the armchair.
Traditionalists often turn their attention to our knowledge in specific domains. They wonder whether, given the sort of basic evidence we have, can we know about other minds, about right and wrong, or about religious matters. They might assume, for example, that our evidence for our beliefs about the mental states of others consists primarily in our observations of their behavior. The key question is then whether that sort of evidence is good evidence for the sort of conclusion we tend to draw. Traditionalists seem to assume the general character of evidence we have for beliefs about other minds (or any of the other categories listed) and then to ask whether that sort of evidence is good enough to justify beliefs of the kind in question. It is not clear that detailed information from empirical studies of human reasoning is needed here. The key issue concerns what is needed for knowledge and whether the general sort of evidence we have - something we can identify from our armchairs - meets the relevant necessary condition for knowledge. Given what they have set out to do, it seems sensible for traditionalists to proceed without scientific input. But it is important to realize that even if traditionalists succeed in refuting arguments for skepticism, they will not thereby show that we do have knowledge. They will only have refuted arguments for the denial of that claim.
It is possible that naturalists tend to focus on different questions: Can we show that we do have knowledge in one area or another? In the various areas do we in fact tend to draw the right conclusions from the evidence we do have? Are the processes we actually use reliable ones? Quine seemed to take the question to be whether our actual scientific beliefs had a firm foundation. The goal was to "reconstruct" our knowledge. There is no doubt that answering these questions requires empirical input. While we can from our armchairs have some ideas about the sorts of inferences we make and the reliability of the processes that occur in us, detailed scientific information is needed to have a clear picture of our actual practices. Furthermore, information about the sorts of errors and mistakes we are apt to make about specific topics is vital to assessing the merits of our actual beliefs about those topics.
Claims to the effect that actual people know actual facts about the world are contingent propositions about the world. They cannot be known a priori. Perhaps such things can be known from our armchairs, since we can know quite a bit from our armchairs. It is difficult to see why we cannot know some things about knowledge from our armchairs. Still, information from empirical sciences cannot be irrelevant to issues about what people actually know. We might plausibly judge from our armchairs that we have knowledge in some range of cases. It is possible that cognitive science will discover that in some or all of these cases our beliefs result from bizarre, thoroughly unreliable, deviant causal chains. If that were to happen, we might learn that we lack knowledge in cases where we thought we had it. Though the possibility that we will learn such things in a variety of familiar cases is extremely small, it is not zero. So empirical results could overturn our judgments about these cases. Thus, if it is epistemology's business to make judgments about whether actual people have knowledge in actual cases, and Cooperative Naturalism is the view that empirical information from the natural sciences is potentially relevant to those judgments, then Cooperative Naturalism is unquestionably true. What would be remarkable about this is that anyone ever denied it.
Some traditional epistemologists give the impression that they simply assume that we do have knowledge and that no empirical information can overturn that judgment. The claim, or assumption, they make is that we know pretty much what we think we know. A representative formulation of this approach can be found in John Pollock's Contemporary Theories of Knowledge. Pollock writes:
In typical skeptical arguments, we invariably find that we are more certain of the of the knowledge seemingly denied us than we are of some of the premises. Thus it is not reasonable to adopt the skeptical conclusion that we do not have that knowledge. The rational stance is instead to deny one or more of the premises. (Pollock, 1986: 6)
Pollock goes on to say that contemporary epistemologists largely see figuring out what knowledge is as their goal, rather than refuting skepticism. As he puts it, we "need not refute the skeptic - we already know that the skeptic is wrong" (Pollock, 1986: 6). This view, of course, has its similarities to views endorsed by G. E. Moore, and it is by no means uncommon. More generally, many epistemologists proceed on the assumption that we do know pretty much what we think we know, and thus on the assumption that skepticism is false. It may seem that this position, or this attitude, rules out the possibility that empirical results will overturn their philosophical starting point. (For discussion, see Kornblith, 1988.)
It is not clear, however, that the philosophers who take this position really do need to say anything quite so strong. What they may be committed to, in fact, is the more modest claim that no abstract philosophical claim is initially more plausible than the claim that we do have knowledge in a typical range of actual cases. They need not be committed to the more extreme, and quite implausible, claim that no empirical results could possibly show that we lack knowledge in particular actual cases. Surely empirical results could show that any contingent claim to knowledge that we make is false, either by showing that the thing we claim to know is false or by showing that our belief in that fact arose in some untoward way. The Moorean assumption is better taken to be a position toward highly abstract philosophical arguments for skepticism, typically arguments that imply that we lack knowledge no matter what the facts in the world are. It may be a mistake to reject these arguments out of hand. But whatever we say about such arguments, it would be mistake to attribute to Pollock, Moore, and others who share their views the idea that specific claims about what we know cannot be overthrown on the basis of empirical information. Nothing about their philosophical positions requires them to maintain that extreme view.
On a related point, Philip Kitcher takes tradtionalists to hold that "our favored logical principles are prescriptions for thought" (Kitcher, 1992: 63). But he thinks that the mere fact that we favor certain logical principles is of no value in establishing that they are meritorious principles. Our principles are good ones only if they actually do enable us to attain our epistemic ends. "Simply asserting that [certain rules] unfold our conception of rationality will be beside the crucial point" (Kitcher, 1992: 63). What needs to be determined is whether our principles actually get us to the truth, and empirical inquiry is needed to find that out. So, as he sees it, traditionalists simply endorse the principles we favor whereas naturalists are willing to put those principles to empirical tests.
Kitcher illustrates his point by means of Hume's problem of induction. Hume famously asked whether we have any good reason to believe the conclusions of our inductive arguments. We notice that all observed instances of some sort of object have had a certain property and we infer that the next object of that kind will have that property. Our premise does not entail our conclusion and it turns out that it is extraordinarily difficult to justify these inductive inferences in a way that does not illicitly rely on induction itself. One solution to the problem, associated with Peter Strawson (1952), is that "adopting the inductive practices and principles that we do is constitutive of our concept of rationality." But, Kitcher asks, "why should we treat our current concept of rationality as privileged?" (Kitcher, 1992: 63). After all, rival societies might have rival conceptions. Anti-inductivists could proclaim their practices rational because they are constitutive of their conception of rationality. As Stephen Stich asks, "Why should we care one whit whether the cognitive processes we use are sanctioned by [our] evaluative concepts?" (Stich, 1990: 92).
Once again, it is possible that the debate between naturalists and traditionalists results in part from an emphasis on different questions. One way to view the issue about induction that Hume raised makes it a very general issue about whether it is ever reasonable to use past, or unobserved, cases as the basis for beliefs about future, or observed cases. The Strawsonian view he mentions says that it is, and defends this on the basis of claims about our concept of rationality. Kitcher takes this to be a defense of our adoption of "the inductive practices and principles" that we actually use. If the principles to which he refers are more specific principles licensing particular inductive inferences, then it may be that they are contingent principles that cannot be justified by a priori or even armchair methods. Kitcher is right to object to philosophers who contend that these lower level principles are necessary consequences of our concept of rationality may be mistaken. Still, Strawson may have been right about the more general issue about the rationality of using past cases as the basis for belief about future cases. Analogously, there may be some general issues about the rationality of reliance on testimony, but claims about whether particular sources are trustworthy require empirical defense.
Paradigmatic epistemological facts are expressed by sentences using terms such as those on the following list provided by Alvin Goldman:
has (good) grounds,
has reason (to believe),
is probable (in an epistemic or inductive sense),
(Goldman, 1979: 1-2)
The crucial thing about sentences using these terms are that they seem to do more than merely describe how things are. They say or imply how something is to be evaluated from an epistemological perspective. Traditional epistemologists take these evaluative epistemological sentences to be objectively true or false, and thus they are committed to there being epistemological facts. The status and nature of these facts constitutes a second major issue falling under the heading of epistemological naturalism.
In a discussion of naturalism in ethics Gilbert Harman writes:
[Ethical naturalism] is the doctrine that moral facts are facts of nature. Naturalism as a general view is the sensible thesis that all facts are facts of nature. (Harman, 1977: 17)
Substantive epistemological naturalism is the view that all epistemic facts are natural facts.
This is not informative unless it is supplemented with some account of what counts as a natural fact. One view is that the natural facts include all the facts that a complete science will acknowledge. Another way to characterize the natural facts is to provide a list of representative examples of the sorts of things that count as natural, with the hope that we have at least a reasonably good idea of what else might be included. The two approaches are not incompatible, since the examples might be a list of the sorts of facts science acknowledges. One such list was produced by Alvin Goldman in his classic paper, "What is Justified Belief?" (Goldman, 1979). Though Goldman was not explicitly discussing naturalism in this paper, the things he mentions will serve present purposes quite well. Goldman suggests that the following are non-epistemic terms:
believes that,He says:
it is necessary that,
is deducible from
is probable (either in the frequency sense or the propensity sense)
(Goldman, 1979: 2)
In general, (purely) doxastic, metaphysical, modal, semantic, or syntactic expressions are not epistemic. (Goldman, 1979: 2)
Naturalized epistemologists contend that if epistemic terms make sense at all, they must be understood in terms of items such as those on this list. Their view seems to contrast with that of traditional epistemologists, who are content to formulate their analyses using evaluative epistemic terms.
It is possible for naturalists to deny that epistemic sentences report facts at all. Defenders of such a view might contend that the sentences are sheer nonsense. More plausibly, they might argue that they are meaningful but non-factual, perhaps because they are expressions of approval or disapproval of the beliefs and believers or the acts and actors mentioned. There have been some defenses of this view, though more frequently in ethics than in epistemology. (See Gibbard, 1990)
Another approach for naturalists is to argue that epistemic terms can be given naturalistic definitions. For present purposes it will suffice to take a definition of a term to be a statement of logically necessary and sufficient conditions for its application. Familiar accounts of epistemic terms seem to be divisible into those that employ only clearly naturalistic terms and those that do not. Many traditional definitions of epistemic justification make essential use of other evaluative epistemic terms. Thus, it is common to define justification in terms of good reasons, adequate evidence, strong grounds, the right to be sure, and the like. For example, evidentialism holds that a person is justified in believing a proposition at a time if and only if the evidence the person has at that time supports believing that proposition (rather than disbelieving it or suspending judgment about it). This definition appeals to two crucial elements: the evidence a person has at a time and the support relation that can hold between a body of evidence and an attitude toward a proposition.
There is no reason for naturalists to worry about the naturalistic credentials of the idea of evidence possessed. This is not to say that the concept is entirely clear. But there is nothing metaphysically spooky, or even evaluative, about it. The evidence one possesses is some combination or other of the experiences one is having, the memories one has, and the other beliefs one has. It may be that other beliefs count as evidence only if they themselves are justified, but this at most shows that the account of justification will turn out to be recursive. It does not show that this element of the evidentialist definition invokes anything non-natural.
The second component of the evidentialist definition of justification is the idea of evidential support. It is easy enough to give examples of cases in which this relation is supposed to obtain and other cases in which it does not obtain. There may also be some cases that are difficult to assess. Despite this, its naturalistic credentials are in doubt. Evidential support seems to be precisely the sort of relation whose connection to the scientifically identifiable objects and properties is difficult to ascertain. Similar worries apply to accounts of epistemic justification in terms of epistemic duties or rights or in terms of epistemically responsible behavior.
In contrast to evidentialism are causal and reliabilist accounts. The simplest version of the causal theory says that a belief that p is justified when the fact that p is causally connected to the belief that p. This theory invokes facts, beliefs, and causal connections, all terms acceptable to naturalists. Reliabilism also seems to invoke only naturalistically respectable terms. In its simplest form it holds that a belief is justified provided it is produced by a belief-forming process that reliably leads to true beliefs. More complex forms of reliabilism also appear to be naturalistically acceptable.
These considerations suggest that one aspect of the debate between naturalists and non-naturalists is best understood as a debate about whether knowledge and justification can be understood in naturalistically acceptable causal and reliabilist terms or must be understood in terms of naturalistically suspect evaluative terms. What remains unclear, however, is whether philosophers who defend traditional accounts of justification, such as evidentialism, are committed to any troubling form of non-naturalism.
Defenders of evidentialist accounts are not (or at least need not be) committed to the idea that no naturalistic definitions of the terms they employ in their definitions are possible. It may be that they just have not produced such definitions yet. And even if the terms are not strictly definable, it does not follow that they are not themselves perfectly good naturalistic terms. This is because it remains possible that evaluative epistemic facts supervene on naturalistic ones. To say that the evaluative facts supervene on the natural ones is to say that in any two worlds in which all the natural facts are alike, all the evaluative facts are also alike. Alternatively, one might say that facts about the epistemic status of beliefs supervene on natural facts provided that, necessarily, if two believers share all the same natural properties, then same beliefs are justified for them. If this supervenience thesis is true, then, arguably, the epistemic facts depend on the natural facts and, perhaps, they are therefore natural facts.
The supervenience thesis is endorsed by a great many philosophers. A representative assertion of it is:
...if a belief is justified, that must be so because it has certain factual, non-epistemic properties...That it is a justified belief cannot be a brute fundamental fact... [it] must be grounded in the factual descriptive properties of that particular belief. (Kim, 1988: 399)
This quotation comes from Kim's critical discussion of Quine's "Naturalized Epistemology." One can find similar passages in the writings of philosophers, including many who would not typically be regarded as naturalists. (Chisholm, 1982: 12; Van Cleve, 1985: 97-101 ). Indeed, there are very few who deny the supervenience thesis. One who does is Keith Lehrer (Lehrer, 1997).
So, the supervenience thesis is widely accepted. There is, of course, considerable disagreement about which facts are central to the supervenience base for epistemic facts. Evidentialism holds that the key natural facts that determine whether a belief is justified are facts about the evidence the person has for that belief. The evidence one has is some combination or other of the experiences one is having, the memories one has, and the other beliefs one has. All of these are unquestionably natural facts about a person. And evidentialism holds that necessarily, people who have the same evidence are justified in believing the same things. In other words, the theory is that natural facts about evidence possessed determine epistemic facts. Reliabilism holds that the crucial facts in the supervenience base of epistemic facts are facts about the reliability of the causal produce producing or sustaining the belief. These too are unquestionably natural facts.
If supervening on natural facts is sufficient for making a fact natural, then it follows that it is widely agreed that epistemic facts are natural facts. It difficult to determine whether supervening on what is natural is sufficient for naturalness, but things participants to the debate say can help to clarify the issues. In an extensive review of naturalism in epistemology, James Maffie writes that a key claim of naturalism is that:
epistemic value is anchored to descriptive fact, no longer entering the world autonomously as brute, fundamental fact...(Maffie, 1990: 284)
One can find comparable claims in the writings of many others. (See Steup, 1996: 185-6; Lycan, 1988: 122) If epistemic facts supervene on unquestionably natural facts, then they do not float free, they are not autonomous, they are not brute facts, they are anchored in the natural world. That seems like a good reason to conclude that they are natural facts.
Of course, some naturalists may contend that a substantive naturalist view must treat epistemic facts as supervening on causal rather than logical facts. (See Kitcher, 1992) Perhaps some support for rejecting the view that anything that supervenes on what's natural is itself natural comes from the fact that this thesis yields the surprising result that the famous ethical non-naturalists were actually naturalists. For example, G. E. Moore would have endorsed the supervenience thesis. However, Kim says that we use the term "naturalism" ambiguously in "ethical naturalism" and "epistemological naturalism". The former requires definitions in natural terms. The latter requires only supervenience. (Kim, 1988: 398) So Kim's view seems to be that, so far as the debate about naturalistic epistemology goes, epistemic facts are natural facts if they supervene on unquestionably natural facts. His view, like nearly all participants to the debate, is that they do.
Even if supervenience of the sort just discussed shows that many epistemic facts are natural facts, a question remains for some traditionalists. In addition to facts about particular people being justified in believing particular propositions, they are committed to the existence of epistemic facts about what beliefs are supported by a particular body of evidence. It remains unclear whether these are natural facts. Traditionalists often regard these facts as necessary truths, and it is their necessity that enables evidentialists to endorse the supervenience thesis. The sentences expressing these epistemic relations express facts - call them epistemic support facts. It is legitimate to ask whether they count as natural facts.
If the epistemic support facts are not natural facts, then not all epistemic facts are natural facts and, according to traditionalists, substantive epistemological naturalism is false. If the epistemic support facts are natural facts, and justification is defined in terms of evidence possessed and epistemic support, then justification is defined in entirely natural terms. In that case, evidentialists do not need to rely on supervenience to defend naturalism. (If reliabilists admit that there are epistemic support facts, then they too must account for their status.)
Whether epistemic support facts are natural facts is a difficult and unexplored question. Epistemic support facts are, on many views, necessary truths. On standard definitions of supervenience, it is trivial that necessary truths supervene on natural facts. (They supervene on anything.) Given that supervening on what is natural is sufficient for being natural, it follows that they are natural facts. However, this response seems to avoid the central questions. This is because some traditionalists, notably Roderick Chisholm, assert the existence of a special class of epistemic support facts whose naturalistic status is questionable. Chisholm contends that "there are principles of evidence other than the formal principles of deductive logic and inductive logic" (Chisholm, 1977: 67). For example, Chisholm held that there were special principles about perceptual evidence along the lines of:
(R). Being in the state of seeming to see something red (being appeared to redly) is evidence for the proposition that one really does see something red.
The evidential support described in (R) is, of course, defeasible. One could have evidence that one is not really seeing something red in spite of being appeared to redly. The key thing about (R) is that it is not, or at least not obviously, an instance of some general deductive or probabilistic principle. It is not a principle of logic. It is, instead, a fundamental principle of epistemology. Thus, at least some evidentialists seem to be committed to there being fundamental epistemic principles, or evidential support relations, that differ from any deductive or probabilistic relations and cannot be defined in terms of any complex of psychological relations and familiar logical relations. Naturalists are apt to find this all highly suspect.
Some traditionalists go further. They hold that to be justified in a belief not only must we have evidence that supports the belief, but we must "grasp" the connection between the evidence and the proposition believed (Fumerton, 1995: 183-224) This grasping of evidential relations may strike some naturalists as exceedingly dubious. However, it is best not to see the issue here as one about naturalism itself. If traditionalists say that there is a special sort of grasping or understanding or acquaintance with epistemic support facts and naturalists deny that there is any such thing, it is seriously misleading to attribute some sort of non-naturalism to the traditionalists. They are making a claim about what natural relations there actually are. Their view is that acquaintance is a particularly fundamental sort of psychological, hence natural, relation. Possibly some naturalists will deny that any such grasping of connections occurs, but the issue here is something like an issue that arises in discussions of extra-sensory perception. Clear-headed defenders of the view that we are capable of perceiving things that ordinary psychology would declare us incapable of perceiving differ with their opponents over what natural relations (or abilities) we have. While some may try to cast their view in mystical language, there is no reason to invoke non-naturalism here. If a hard-headed naturalist became convinced that some people did have some abilities previously thought to be beyond us, the response should be a change in views about what nature is like, not a renunciation of naturalism.
Still, there remains the question of the status of facts like (R). As noted, Chisholm regarded it as a special epistemic principle. But not all traditionalists must follow suit. They might argue that these principles are special cases of naturalistically acceptable general principles. For example, one could argue that (R) follows from some general principle about best explanations. Or perhaps it really does have inductive support. Support from appeals to conservatism (what we already believe), what we naturally believe, what is generally accepted, and other factors are possible. Philosophers who endorse any such view can proudly proclaim themselves substantive naturalists.
Chisholm, of course, would not accept this. He thought that there were fundamental epistemic principles that could not be explained in any such terms. Perhaps this counts as non-naturalism. Even here, however, the issues are less than fully clear. Chisholm apparently thought that, in addition to deductive and probabilistic connections, there was another species of connection between propositions (or between experiences and propositions). His view was that these relations are part of the real, or natural, world. Some may deny that there are any such relations. This seems, once again, to be a dispute about what there is, not a dispute about whether there is something beyond what is natural. In other words, if Chisholm is right, it is quite unclear why terms such as "supports" and other epistemic terms do not belong on the list of naturalistically acceptable terms in the first place. If they do, then even Chisholm can plausibly maintain that epistemic support facts are natural facts. If so, then almost all epistemologists are substantive naturalists.