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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
“Elias” is the name of an author which, in the course of a complicated history of textual transmission, has become associated with some manuscripts of commentaries on Aristotle and Porphyry. Due to a certain similarity in style and content, it is generally supposed that “Elias,” like “David,” belonged to the school of Olympiodorus and that he lived and worked perhaps in Alexandria in the second half of the 6th century CE. However, the evidence that a Neoplatonic philosopher bearing the Christian monastic name “Elias” in fact existed is scant. In this article “Elias” refers simply to the author of the commentaries that nowadays go under this name. (See further below, section 3.)
The 6th century witnesses at once the culmination and the demise of a long tradition of writing philosophical commentaries on the works of Plato and especially Aristotle. This tradition began in the 1st century BCE and only becomes tangible for us with the commentaries on Aristotle of Aspasius in the 2nd century CE and especially with Alexander of Aphrodisias in the early 3rd century. This exegetical tradition reached its pinnacle in the first half of the 6th century with the great works of Ammonius Hermeiou and his pupils Simplicius and John Philoponus. The latter was a Christian who, after much criticism and polemic, broke with (pagan) Neoplatonic school philosophy and turned his energy to the exegesis of biblical texts as well as the theological controversies of his day. However, because of the survival of even later commentaries attributed to philosophers with Christian names such as Elias and David, it is commonly supposed that in the later 6th century pagan philosophy was indeed still being taught in Alexandria, by Christians. In contrast to this, pagan philosophy in Athens gradually died out after the philosophical school there was closed by the Emperor Justinian in the year 529.
Three works attributed to Elias have been published, a commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge, a commentary on Aristotle’s Categories (both in Commentatia in Aristotelem Graeca Vol 18) and a third highly truncated work, on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics (see Westerink 1961). The author of these works may have been a pupil of Olympiodorus, and in that case it is quite possible that his commentary on the Isagoge was composed as a transcript of Olympiodorus’ lectures.
In the tradition of Neoplatonic philosophical training, Porphyry’s Isagoge and Aristotle’s Categories were part of the standard curriculum for beginners, a practice that was well established by the 5th and 6th centuries. Like Ammonius Hermeiou before him, Elias prefaces the lectures on the Isagoge with a very general ‘Introduction’ to philosophy. This text belongs to the well-established genre in ancient philosophy of protreptic or exhortational literature. Elias’exhortation to philosophy consists of 12 lectures designed to serve a triple purpose: 1. to outline and define the scope of philosophy, 2. to justify the subject matter of the set of further lectures the students are about to hear, and 3. to motivate them to pursue a course in philosophy.
To some extent, Elias’ introduction to philosophy brings out the individual character and temperament of the author. He was a very lively lecturer who dazzled his students with quotations and allusions of many kinds. For example, in his 12 introductory lectures, Plato is mentioned 22 times; there are 15 quotations from Homer as well as numerous scattered references to Aristotle, Plotinus, Proclus, Marinus, Hierocles, Pythagoras, Archilochus, Theognis, Herodotus, Callimachus, Demosthenes, Sophocles, Euripides, Menander, Galen and an unnamed Stoic. Moreover, Elias repeatedly emphasizes the Platonic-Neoplatonic conviction that the purpose of philosophy is the transformation or assimilation of a human being to the godhead, a genuinely Platonic ideal explicitly stated in the Theaetetus, 176A-B). Given that by the late 6th century a professor in Alexandria, or anywhere else in the Eastern empire, would address a predominantly, if not exclusively, Christian audience, these remarks give one pause, especially if one is supposed to believe that they stem from an author who himself subscribed to Christianity. For a Christian, of course, drawing near the godhead would not be the result of reading and embracing Platonic philosophy, but a blessing that depended on faith and divine grace.
In his preface to Aristotle’s Categories, Elias gives a concise and admirable summary of the qualities an ideal commentator ought to have (CAG 18.1, pp. 122f. as quoted by Wilson 1983, 47):
The commentator should be both commentator and scholar at the same time. It is the task of the commentator to unravel obscurities in the text; it is the task of the scholar to judge what is true and what is false, or what is sterile and what is productive. He must not assimilate himself to the authors he expounds, like actors on the stage who put on different masks because they are imitating different characters. When expounding Aristotle he must not become an Aristotelian and say there has never been so great a philosopher, when expounding Plato he must not become a Platonist and say that there has never been a philosopher to match Plato. He must not force the text at all costs and say that the ancient author whom he is expounding is correct in every respect; instead he must repeat to himself at all times ‘the author is a dear friend, but so also is truth, and when both stand before me truth is the better friend’. He must not sympathise with a philosophical school, as happened to Iamblichus, who out of sympathy for Plato is condescending in his attitude to Aristotle and will not contradict Plato in regard to the theory of ideas. He must not be hostile to a philosophical school like Alexander (of Aphrodisias). The latter, being hostile to the immortality of the intellectual part of the soul, attempts to twist in every way the remarks of Aristotle in his third book on the immortality of the soul which prove that it is immortal. The commentator must know the whole of Aristotle in order that, having first proved that Aristotle is consistent with himself, he may expound Aristotle’s works by means of Aristotle’s works. He must know the whole of Plato, in order to prove that Plato is consistent with himself and make the works of Aristotle an introduction to those of Plato.
The title of a recently published manuscript, dated to the 13th or 14th century, containing a Prior Analytics commentary suggests that Elias, who is named as the author of the commentary, once held the political office of prefect in the Byzantine empire, presumably before he became a professor of philosophy. In the Novellae of Justinian a prefect by the name of Elias is in fact mentioned (Novel. CLIII, dated 12 December 541; cf. Westerink 1961). Since the name Elias was rare in secular circles at the time, Westerink (1961) proposes that unless evidence to the contrary emerges, our commentator and the former prefect should be considered identical. Unfortunately, nothing else is known about a philosopher named Elias; apart from the late manuscripts of the extant commentaries we have no further evidence of the existence of a philosopher by that name. Even worse, a fairly comprehensive Byzantine list of commentators on Porphyry and Aristotle does not know of any philosopher Elias, nor does Photius (9th c. Byzantine scholar) or the Suda (10th c. encyclopedia). A look into the manuscript tradition reveals that the texts now attributed to Elias probably circulated as anonymous manuscripts for a considerable time. Given that there is nothing explicitly Christian about these works (there are no references to the Bible, but a lot of references to pagan philosophers and literary figures), and given that we find an explicit avowal of doctrines that are quite obviously at variance with Christianity (e.g. that a philosopher must strive to imitate the sun; that the world is eternal), it is possible to take a more skeptical position (cf. Wildberg 1990). The suspicion arises that the original author may not have been Christian at all, but a latter-day pagan who taught Greek philosophy to a Christian audience. In that case, the attribution of these commentaries to some “Elias” may well have been motivated by later scribes who sought to justify, by giving a monastic name to their author, the copying of what were in fact pagan philosophical texts. Alternatively, if the author was indeed the Christian retired prefect Elias, as Westerink suggests, we are invited to modify our preconceptions about the (im-)possibility of pagan discourse within the Christian culture of the Byzantine empire. In either case, the commentaries testify to the vitality and importance of pagan philosophy and learning in the mid- or late 6th century CE.