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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Anthony Collins (1676-1729) was a wealthy English free-thinker, deist and materialist who in his later years became a country squire and local government official in Essex. Along with John Toland, Collins was the most significant member of a close knit circle of radical free thinkers that arose in England in the first three decades of the eighteenth century. This group included such men as Samuel Bold, Matthew Tindal, Thomas Woolston and William Wollaston. He was a friend of John Locke in Locke's old age and Locke was one important formative influence on his philosophical views. In respect to his materialism and determinism Collins was clearly influenced more by Hobbes and Bayle than he was by Locke. The Latitudinarians may well have influenced his views about free-thinking as well as Locke. Collins' works had some influence in England and much more on the continent during the 18th century.
Collins' central passion is the autonomy of reason particularly with respect to religion. Collins was strongly motivated by an aversion to religious persecution. Issues revolving around religious freedom are the threads that run through all of his writing. It is possible to divide Collins' works into those that are mainly philosophical and those that are more narrowly religious, but they are clearly connected. His 1706-8 pamphlet controversy with Samuel Clarke over whether "matter can think" and other topics, and his book about free will and determinism are chiefly engaged with philosophical topics. Even these topics, however, involve such religious issues as the immortality of the soul and punishment and reward in the next life. His writing about reason and free-thinking may be regarded as on the borderline between philosophy and religion. Although it deals with epistemological and sometimes metaphysical issues, it focuses almost entirely on religious issues. His religious works are even more narrowly focused. The Thirty nine Articles are the only official confessional statement of Anglicanism. Two of Collins' books deal with the authenticity of Article 20 of the Thirty nine Articles and whether the church has the power to make doctrine. In large measure these represent the doctrines of free-thinking applied to the particular case of the Anglican Church. Collins also wrote a book examining the question of whether the prophecies of Christ's messiahship could be accepted. This seems to be a rejection of Christianity as a revealed religion. How far Collins went in the direction of atheism is still a matter of scholarly debate.
Collins was clearly a controversial figure in his time; nor has scholarly treatment down the years done much better at being objective. As Ernest Campbell Mossner remarks: "The Deists were long subjected to the odium theologicum and the historians of the movement have almost without exception downgraded or slandered them both socially as well as intellectually since the time of John Leland in the eighteenth century." (Mossner, 1967b, p. 335)
Anthony Collins was born in Heston, Middlesex on June 21, 1676 into a family of lawyers. He went to Eton and then King's College, Cambridge in 1693. Though he had not graduated from Cambridge, Collins went to the Middle Temple in 1694 to study law. He didn't like the law and was never called to the Bar. In 1698 he married the daughter of a rich London merchant, Sir Francis Child. She died in childbirth in 1703. At the time of his marriage he received some property in Essex from his father. Together with his wife's dowry, this made him a very rich man indeed. Collins met John Locke on a visit to Oates in Essex in 1703, visited Locke five times over the next 18 months and carried on a correspondence with him about various philosophical topics. In one of his letters to Collins Locke remarked: "Believe it, my good friend, to love truth for truth's sake is the principal part of human perfection in this world, and the seed bed of all other virtues; and if I mistake not, you have as much of it as I have ever met with in anybody." Collins was a lifelong bibliophile with a large private research library. In the article on Collins in Birch's Dictionary, Birch notes that his "large and curious [library] was open to all men of letters, to whom he readily communicated all the lights and assistance in his power, and even furnished his antagonists with books to confute himself, and directed them how to give their arguments all the force of which they were capable" (Birch, quoted in Berman, 1975). During this period Collins also met Samuel Bold and John Toland. From 1703 until 1706, after his wife's death, Collins spent the winters in London and the summers at his fine summer mansion in Buckinghamshire -- where Queen Anne and her court visited him. In 1706 Collins began a pamphlet controversy with Samuel Clarke, a prominent British philosopher and member of Newton's inner circle, over the question of whether matter can think. The controversy continued until 1708. In 1707 Collins published anonymously the Essay Concerning the Use of Reason in Propositions, the evidence whereof depends on human testimony. During this period Collins frequented the London coffee shops where the deists and free-thinkers met. Berkeley apparently met him at such a gathering in 1713. In 1710 Collins made his first trip to the Continent, spending his time buying books in Holland and meeting John Churchill, first Duke of Marlborough, and Prince Eugene. Back in England, Collins met several times with Samuel Clarke and William Whiston at the house of Lady Calverly and Sir John Hubern for "frequent but friendly debates about the truth of the Bible and the Christian Religion" (Whiston, quoted in O'Higgins, 1970. p. 77). In 1713 he published A Discourse Concerning Free-Thinking. The Discourse was his most controversial work. He made a second trip to the continent about the time that the Discourse was published. Again he went to Holland and France and planned to go on to Italy. The trip was cut short by the death of a close kinsman. In 1715 Collins, in effect, took root in Essex, moving into Mowdon Hall. Collins probably owned a good 2000 acres in Essex, much of it prime agricultural land. In 1717 he published A Philosophical Enquiry Concerning Human Liberty in which he argues for a compatibilist form of determinism and rejects freedom of the will. Samuel Clarke reviewed the book, continuing the argument that had begun during the Collins-Clarke correspondence of 1706-08.
From 1717 on Collins spent most of his time in the country, but still had a keen interest in national politics at a distance, and local politics in person. Collins was a Whig and became a spokesman for the Whigs in the country. Collins took a serious role in the government of Essex -- serving as a justice, a commissioner for taxes, and then Treasurer of the County. He examined roads and bridges. He was involved in finding a place for housing county records. As Treasurer he was a model of integrity. In considering the relation between Collins, the County official and Collins the writer, O'Higgins notes that Collins was probably less tolerant towards Catholics than other justices (ibid. pp. 128-9). And Collins the writer is consistently anti-Catholic. So, while one might hope that the use of reason would produce a higher degree of toleration towards all religious groups than one would expect to find among true believers, there seems to be little conflict here between the writer and the jurist.
In December 1723 Collins' only son suddenly became ill and died. His father was grief-stricken. Collins remarried in 1724 and he published what is perhaps his most successful book, A Discourse on the Grounds and Reasons of the Christian Religion as well as An Historical and Critical Essay on the Thirty Nine Articles of the Church of England. From 1725 until 1729 Collins' health began to deteriorate. Still, in 1726 he published The Scheme of Literal Prophecy Considered. He was suffering from gall stones and finally died of his disease on December 13, 1729. His second wife Elisabeth and his two daughters survived him.
The chief topic of the Collins Clarke controversy of 1706-08 is whether consciousness can inhere in a material system, a highly controversial issue inspired by Locke's notorious speculation about thinking matter. In Book IV of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, in stressing the limits of human knowledge of substances, Locke writes: "We have the Ideas of Matter and Thinking, but possibly shall never be able to know, whether any mere material Being thinks, or no; it being impossible for us, by the contemplation of our own Ideas, without revelation, to discover whether Omnipotency has not given to some System of Matter fitly disposed, a power to perceive and think, or else joined and fixed to Matter so disposed, a thinking immaterial Substance..." (ibid., IV, iii, 6, pp. 540-1). Locke then went on to conjecture that it might be just as easy for God to add the power of thought to a system of matter organized in the right way as for God to connect an immaterial thinking thing to a body (ibid.). Clearly, the difficulties in explaining how an immaterial mind could relate to a material body plays a significant role in leading Locke to this position. This "thinking matter" passage "raised a storm of protest and discussion that lasted right through to the last years of the eighteenth century" (Yolton, 1983 p. 17). Locke's conjecture about thinking matter is, in effect, the centerpiece of the debate between Samuel Clarke and Anthony Collins between 1706 and 1708.
The correspondence between Clarke and Collins took its inspiration from a book published in 1706 by Henry Dodwell, putting forward the view that the soul was not naturally, but only supernaturally, immortal. The work was the subject of a public refutation by Clarke, who found the possibility of naturally thinking matter implausible. Collins wrote a defense of Dodwell in a public "Letter to Mr. Dodwell", to which Clarke responded. Over the next two years Clarke wrote three more defenses of his original letter to Henry Dodwell and Collins wrote three replies. Each of these was longer than its predecessor. Clarke, who became increasingly irritated as the debate continued, got the final word in "The Fourth Defence of A Letter." While the central issue of the correspondence is whether it is possible for consciousness to inhere in a material system and thus for matter to think, the discussion toward the end turned to other issues such as free will and determinism and the adequacy of Collins' account of personal identity. Rather than explain the Correspondence in detail, what follows is a discussion of Collins' position in respect to two central issues, that of emergent properties and personal identity.
To give a materialist account of life and consciousness, Collins' needs to show that from lifeless and unthinking matter one can get life and thought. In his "Letter to Dodwell" Collins claims that there are material systems all about us whose parts do not have the properties found in the whole. He gives the example of a rose that has the power to produce its sweet scent in us, while the particles that compose it do not have this power (Clarke, p. 751). These material systems provide models and analogies to understand how life and consciousness can arise from lifeless and thoughtless particles. Thus, from the beginning, Collins is arguing that consciousness is an emergent property, i.e. a property had by the whole, but not by the parts that compose that whole.
In his First Defence, Clarke responds by giving an argument to show that there are no real emergent properties. He does this by giving an enumeration of all of the kinds of properties. It turns out that there are only three categories. These categories correspond roughly to the primary, secondary and tertiary qualities of the mechanical philosophy (Attfield, p. 46). The correspondence is not precise because Clarke includes consciousness in the first category, though on a different basis than first category properties of matter such as magnitude or motion. Clarke claims that only properties of the first kind are real. Properties of the second kind are "not really Qualities of the System, and evidently do not in any proper Sense belong to it, but are only Effects occasionally produced by it in some other Substance, and truly are Qualities or Modes of that other Substance in which they are produced..." (Clarke, p. 759). Heat, light, taste and sound are examples of this class of properties. Clarke claims that these properties are largely irrelevant to the question about consciousness because they are modes of the other substance in which they are produced. The properties of the third kind are fictional. They "are not real Qualities at all, residing in any subject, but merely abstract Names to express the Effects of some determinate Motions of certain streams of Matter..." (ibid., p. 760). The examples that Clarke gives of third category properties are magnetism, electrical attractions and gravity.
What conditions are required for belonging to Clarke's first class? In respect to material wholes, Clarke is a reductionist who holds that whatever real property one finds in the whole must be found proportionally in the parts. The height of the bricks and the mortar in a wall sum to the height of the wall as a whole. Thus, all the properties in a material whole are compositions of the properties of the parts. Call this Clarke's Composition Principle. Any property of a material system that fails to conform to this pattern is not a real property. It follows that emergent properties, properties possessed by the whole but not by the parts, cannot be real. They would involve contradictions such as the whole being larger than the parts, or that something (some property of the whole) comes from nothing, or that there is something in the effect that is not to be found in its cause. As a result of his examination of the kinds of categories, Clarke claims that all emergent properties belong in his third class, the class of fictional properties. It follows that since consciousness is a real property it cannot be an emergent property.
Since consciousness is a real property it must belong in Clarke's first class of properties. This being so, it cannot violate the Composition Principle. But consciousness is so strongly unified that it cannot be either compounded or divided. This is why it cannot belong to any material system. So, there must be a second sufficient condition for belonging to Clarke's first category. Clarke second sufficient condition is that "an Individual Power, properly and strictly speaking...can only proceed from or reside in, an Individual Being" (Clarke, p. 750). To be an individual power, Clarke tells us, a power must be truly unitary, and thus not composed of parts. Call this the Individual Power Principle. So, consciousness is an individual power, which belongs to an individual being, the soul. The soul, too, is so unified that it does not have parts. Magnitude, in contrast, satisfies the Composition Principle, but is not an individual power. This is because the matter to which it belongs can always be divided.
Collins challenges the enumeration of categories of properties with which Clarke seeks to prove that consciousness cannot belong to a material system (Clarke, 1738, Vol. 3, pp. 751; 767-70). He continues to maintain that consciousness is a real emergent property.
In responding to Clarke's First Defense, Collins claims that Clarke has not properly enumerated the kinds of properties. He claims that Clarke needs to show that his enumeration is complete but has not done so. There may be powers unknown to Clarke that need to be included in order to give a complete enumeration of the properties and powers of matter. In order to effectively defend his materialist account of consciousness, however, Collins pointed out a new class of properties that are arguably real and that are emergent and do not fit Clarke's composition model for real properties of matter.
Collins' chief strategy for showing that there are real emergent properties is likely derived from Locke's claim in the Chapter "Of Identity and Diversity" in the Essay that living things are individuated not by the matter that composes them at a time but by their functional organization (Locke, 1972, ii. xxvii 3-4, pp. 330-331; see also Attfield, 1977, p. 52). Collins begins by considering the different roles that matter and organization may play in producing all the different kinds of things in the universe. He starts with the hypothesis that different parts of matter are different from one another. If this is so the particles of matter may work in the way different parts of a clock work -- the parts of the clock are different from one another and consequently have different powers. The whole to which they contribute will have powers that none of the parts have (Clarke, p. 768). The second hypothesis Collins puts forth is that all matter is the same and therefore completely interchangeable. Collins prefers this hypothesis because it makes it easy to argue that all of the differences between the various kinds of things are a result of their organization. The distinction between matter and its organization is useful for Collins' purposes because the properties that result from the organization of matter are different from the properties of the particles. As Collins notes:
...if the powers of a System of Matter may intirely cease upon the least Alteration of a Part of that System, it is evident that the Powers of the System inhere not in the Parts in the same Sense with Magnitude and Motion: for divide and vary the Parts of Matter as much as you will, there will be Magnitude and may be Motion; but divide or vary the least Part of the Eye, and the Power of contributing to the Act of Vision is intirely at an end (ibid.).
The organization of the eye is essential to its proper functioning and indeed to it being an eye at all (ibid., p. 769) It is an emergent property. Collins does not explicitly make the point that since the organization of the eye is an essential property it must also be a real property. Perhaps he thought this obvious.
The topic of personal identity comes up as early as Clarke's Second Defence of an Argument because Clarke objects to consciousness being an emergent property of the brain and also objects to the brain being the bearer or seat of personal identity (Clarke, p. 787). Correspondingly, there are important connections between Collins' account of emergent properties and his account of personal identity. Consciousness, for Collins, is both an emergent property and constitutive of personal identity. In addition, Collins claims that because of the mind body problem, dualist views do not serve the ends and purposes of religion. Clarke replies that it is Collins' materialist views that have dangerous consequences for the ends and purposes of religion. Many of these consequences have to do with personal identity.
What are the connections between Collins' account of emergent properties and his account of personal identity? The most important connection is the Lockean distinction between the matter that composes a material thing at any given time and the organization of matter. The distinction comes from Locke's account of the individuation of masses of matter and living things in his chapter "Of Identity and Diversity" in Book II of the Essay. A mass of matter is individuated by the particles that compose it, however organized. If the mass gains or loses a single particle it becomes a different substance. Living things, by contrast, are individuated by their functional organization (Locke, 1972 II. xxvii 3. p. 330). Collins' summary of his views on identity and personal identity make it clear that he agrees completely with Locke's account of identity and the individuation of masses, living things and persons (Clarke p. 875). But Clarke insists that in order for something to remain the same, it must remain the same substance. In the case of material things like oaks, this means that the matter that composes it must remain the same or it is not the same oak. Only atoms and persons fulfill this same substance condition for Clarke. So, oaks are only identical in a fictional sense. In addition, it is not possible for any entity to have the same properties it had previously if its substance has changed, because it is not possible to transfer properties from one substance to another (Clarke, p. 798). So, just as Clarke holds that emergent properties are fictional, so he holds that any identity not based on identity of substance is fictional.
Collins accepts Locke's revolutionary view that consciousness and not the substantial soul is the bearer of personal identity. Again agreeing with Locke, he regards both memory as crucial to personal identity and feelings of pleasure and pain as important concomitants of consciousness. Still, Collins' account of personal identity is not exactly the same as Locke's. Locke's account is officially neutral in regard to whether "the substance that thinks in us" is material or immaterial, simple or compounded. Collins, by contrast, is giving an account that makes "the substance that thinks in us" material and compounded. But the neutrality of Locke's account of personal identity ought to allow Collins to adopt it without significant change, and this is what he does. Collins also defends the view against attacks addressed to the concept of memory involved. Clarke holds that Collins' account of memory violates a basic principle of Clarke's substantialist account of identity -- that properties cannot be transferred from one substance to another.
Collins' response to this is to claim that annexing consciousness to the brain explains the phenomena of consciousness far better than positing an unchanging immaterial substance. It is also a perfectly reasonable sense for properties to be transferred from one substance to another. In his Reflections on Mr. Clarke's Second Defence he writes:
For if we utterly forget, or cease to be conscious of having done many things in former Parts of our Lives which we certainly did, as much as any of those which we are conscious that we have done; and if in fact we do by degrees forget everything which we do not revive by frequent Recollection, and by again and again imprinting our decaying Ideas; and if there be in a determinate Time a partial or total flux of Particles in our Brains: What can better account for out total Forgetfulness of some things, our partial Forgetfulness of others, than to suppose that the Substance of the Brain in constant Flux? (Clarke, p. 809)
As for the problem of transferring consciousness from one substance to another he writes:
I will suppose myself conscious at Forty of having been carried to a Market or Fair at Five Years old, without any Particle of Matter about me, the same which I had at that Age: now in order to retain the Consciousness of that Action, it is necessary to revive the Idea of it before any considerable Flux of Particles, (otherwise I must totally lose the Memory of it (as I do of several things done in my Childhood) and by reviving the Idea of that Action, I imprint afresh the Consciousness of having done that Action, by which the Brain has a lively and Impression of Consciousness (though it be not entirely composed of the same Particles) as it had the day after it did the Action... (ibid.).
This account of how memory works nicely fits the model of the preservation of organization through change of matter that Locke uses to explain the identity of living things. However Clarke does not accept this explanation because he holds that only a theory of the substantial soul can provide the underpinnings for an account of veridical memory.
In evaluating the controversy, one would have to say that of all the encounters between the Newtonians and the free thinkers, the one between Collins and Clarke was the most philosophically significant and influential. O'Higgins holds that Collins is important to us because he defends an early version of materialism. In his insistence that the mind and consciousness are real emergent properties of the brain, Collins was indeed a pioneer. On the other hand, O'Higgins claims that Collins' arguments are not very good. This simply does not give Collins enough credit. It is true that Collins does give some arguments that are not very good. On the other hand, Collins forced Clarke to clarify his position in a number of respects. He uncovered a number of weak points in Clarke's position. One of Collins' strongest points was his critique of Clarke's doctrine that though the soul is immaterial it is extended (Vailatti, 1993). In respect to the central issues of the debate, Collins is struggling to articulate a materialist and empiricist metaphysics that can compete with the well developed dualist metaphysics that Clarke deploys. As Barresi and Martin comment: "His faltering, but often successful attempts to reformulate traditional metaphysical issues empirically, embodies the birth pangs of a new approach" (Martin and Barresi, p. 51).
Collins deals in passing with determinism and freedom of the will in the 1706-08 correspondence with Samuel Clarke and in his 1707 book An Essay concerning the Use of Reason. His A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Liberty of 1717 is entirely devoted to the issue. From the beginning, Collins is a determinist with a compatibalist account of free action. Clarke attacked Collins' determinism in the 1706-08 correspondence. He also reviewed the 1717 book and defended a doctrine of libertarian free will as he had in the earlier correspondence.
Since the nature of human choices and action are central to debates about free will and determinism there is a close connection between positions about these issues and positions about consciousness and personal identity. The kind of determinism that Collins advocates is a natural extension of his materialist, empirical and naturalistic account of consciousness. In his account of consciousness, Collins makes the pursuit of pleasure and the avoidance of pain the most basic motives of action. This makes happiness and misery necessary concomitants of consciousness, and thus conscious beings are endowed with a desire for happiness. This is true as much of animals as it is of human beings and accounts for a large number of similarities in the behavior of humans and animals. Collins holds that if the behavior of animals is determined, then that of humans must be as well.
In the Collins Clarke correspondence of 1706-08 Collins claims that Clarke's dualism is dangerous to religion and morality because of the problem of explaining how the immaterial mind and the material body interact. One of Clarke's counter-charges is that Collins' materialism is dangerous to religion and morality because it implies a determinism that is destructive of religion and morality.
Collins claims that human action is caused in much the same way as the actions of clocks. Both are necessary agents, though the causes that produce the action in either case are very different. "Both are necessarily determined in their Actions: the one by the Appearances of Good and Evil, the other by a Weight or Spring" (ibid., p. 872). Collins also attacks the free will position. He holds that the same causes will always produce the same effects and claims that the free will explanation of being able to do otherwise violates this basic principle of causal explanations (ibid., pp. 873 and 874).
Collins also expressed determinist views in his first book -- An Essay Concerning the Use of Reason, 1707. He does this in the context of the problem of reconciling God's foreknowledge with human free-will. As O'Higgins puts it: "He solved the problem to his own satisfaction by saying that all things, including human choices, are determined in their causes and as such can be foreseen by an all-knowing God" (O'Higgins, 1976, p. 6). This view plays a role in Collins' 1710 critique of Archbishop King's views about the problem of evil and the epistemological status of the attributes of God. King claimed that God's attributes, including his foreknowledge of events, was analogical. In the case of God's foreknowledge, he did this to avoid contradictions between God's knowing what was to come and the contingency of events and human free will. Collins is content to reject human free will and to suppose that ‘foreknowledge’ has a univocal meaning when used with reference to God or humans.
In A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty Collins briefly states his position. He rejects the view that there is any freedom from necessity and claims that insofar as there is human freedom it is "liberty or freedom from outward impediment to action." Such freedom is compatible with necessity. Collins holds that every action has been caused and must necessarily have occurred. The future is as much determined as the past. He then gives six arguments for this form of determinism.
The first of Collins' arguments has to do with experience. Defenders of free will hold that the experience of even ordinary people shows that they choose freely. Collins' response is much the same as that of Hobbes and Spinoza. He claims that that those who say such things are either not attending to, or not seeing, the causes of their actions. Collins goes on to claim that some defenders of free will admit that the issues is tangled and not to be resolved by appeals to vulgar experience.
William Rowe notes that Collins and Clarke share a volitional theory of action. Rowe describes the theory in this way: "According to this theory, actions are of two sorts: thoughts and motions of the body. What makes a thought or bodily motion an action is its being preceded by a certain act of will (volitions) which bring about the thought or motion. Volitions, then, are "action starters" (Rowe, p. 54). Rowe also notes that Collins and Clarke share the assumption that if a volition is causally determined then the person doing the act does not have free will (ibid., p. 53). Rowe says that as the two antagonists agree on these points, they play little or no part in the debate. But they do explain the strategy that Collins uses to argue that experience actually shows that we are determined. He examines experience under four topics relating to choice and action: 1. Perception of Ideas; 2. Judging of Propositions; 3. Willing; and 4. Doing as we will. Collins argues that each of these is causally determined.
In respect to perception he holds that perception, both of ideas of sensation and reflection, is not even voluntary. So, perception can hardly be free. In respect to judging, he claims that we judge in terms of how things appear to us, and that we can't change these appearances. In respect to the will, he claims that there are two questions to be considered. One is whether we are at liberty to will or not. The second is whether we are at liberty to will "one or the other of two or more objects." In respect to the first question he claims that Locke made a mistake in holding that people are at liberty to will because they can suspend willing. So, Collins holds that Locke's answer to the first question would be affirmative. Collins claims that suspense of willing is as much an act of will as any other. So, his answer is negative. In respect to the second question Collins argues for a value determinism that makes the answer to the second question negative as well. In defining willing, he remarks: "Willing or preferring is the same with respect to good and evil, that judging is with respect to truth or falsehood." So, if something seems better than the alternatives we will choose it. Collins is thus a moral determinist who holds that we must do what seems best to us. In giving his negative answer to his second question, Collins is also rejecting the claim that we could have done otherwise. Collins then proceeds to consider cases where we can see no difference between the objects we are to choose among, e.g., which of two eggs we will take. Collins' response is that:
It is not enough to render things equal to the will, that they are equal or alike in themselves. All the various modifications of the man, his opinions, prejudices, temper, habit and circumstances, are to be taken in and considered as causes of election no less than the objects without us among which we chuse; and these will ever incline or determine our wills, and make the choice we do make, preferable to us, though the external objects of our choice are ever so much alike to each other. (O'Higgins, 1976, p. 47)
If one were truly indifferent one simply would not choose. But once there is a will to choose, the cascade of causes that leads to action will determine the choice one way or the other. What Collins means by "doing as we will" is what we do consequent to willing. Here again he finds no freedom from necessity. We do what we have willed unless some external impediment or intervening cause hinders us from doing so. Finally, he compares the actions of animals to those of men. He claims that while animals are supposed to be necessary agents and humans free agents, there is no perceivable difference between their actions that would allow us to make this distinction.
Collins' second argument is that man is a necessary agent because all his actions have a beginning. He holds that whatever has a beginning has a cause and all causes are necessary. Collins (as he had in the Collins Clarke controversy) also rejects the proposition that the same causes could produce different effects. Thus Collins rejects the doctrine of free will because it violates the basic principle of causal explanations. The third argument claimed that liberty is an imperfection. Going back to judging propositions, Collins points out that if we were free, we would be able to judge probable what is improbable, and so on. This is the analog of moral determinism to the epistemic realm. Just as we are not free to knowingly choose the worse over the better, we cannot affirm that what seems improbable to us is the probable. If we could we would be worse off than we are. The fourth argument is that liberty is inconsistent with God's foreknowledge. This is again similar to the view that Hobbes held and repeats the assertions of Collins' first book An Essay concerning the Use of Reason. The fifth is that if man was not a necessary agent, and determined by pleasure and pain, there would be no foundation for rewards and punishments. The sixth is that if a man were not a necessary agent he would be ignorant of morality and have no motive to practice it. These last two arguments make the point that causality is necessary for the operation of morality in the world, and to introduce a causeless free will is to make the teaching of morality or its motivation by punishment or reward pointless.
There was only one response to Collins' book in England. Samuel Clarke reviewed it and argued that the notion of a "necessary agent" was incoherent, for to be an agent one must be active and Collins' position was that the humans are completely passive and thus (in Clarke's sense) not agents at all. Clarke also complained that Collins treated perception as actions when perception is passive. (Clarke, p. 722) Clarke develops his own account of free will arguing that motives, pleasures and pains, reasons and arguments, are simply occasions for the self-moving power that is active to freely determine action. What we have again is a competing set of explanations for the same phenomena. Clarke failed to take a number of Collins' arguments seriously, because the free will arguments being refuted were not his arguments.
In a series of letters Collins discussed Clarke's review of his book with his long time friend and collaborator Pierre Desmaiseaux. Eventually, Collins concluded that Clarke had been threatening him with civil action, and that to reply would provide Clarke with the opportunity to do so. Consequently Collins made no reply to Clarke's review. In 1729 a short book, A Dissertation of Liberty and Necessity, with Collins name on the title page, was published. For a number of reasons O' Higgins holds that Collins is not the author of this work. His first reason is that the book treats the substance of the soul as unknown -- a Lockean doctrine that Collins had rejected. O'Higgins also cites contemporary reviews that claim the arguments of the book are weak compared to the Inquiry. Still, weak or not, the arguments are certainly consistent with the determinist position that Collins was holding in the earlier work. The author also takes into account at least one of Clarke's criticisms of the Inquiry.
The author of A Dissertation remarks that he will "attempt to solve the Point of Free Will, by tracing the progress of the Soul through all its Operations which we are conscious of, and examining in each whether 'tis Active or Passive" (Collins, 1729 p. 1). The point is that at every stage in the process, from perception to action, we are passive. The author apparently accepted Clarke's point in his review of Collins' Inquiry that perception is not an action, for he is now calling it not an ‘action’ but an ‘operation.’ The author explicitly takes up Clarke's views when he argues that we are passive in judgment. He quotes Clarke at length. Clarke holds that judgment is passive, but distinguishes between judging and acting. The author continues: "But I conceive the doctor here begs the Question, by asserting the Self-motive Power in the Soul without proving it, and then reasons from it as granted to him" (ibid., p. 6). The author of A Dissertation thus returns to Clarke a charge that Clarke had made about Collins in his 1717 review of A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty.
The 17th and early 18th century in England saw a rationalist treatment of theology that spanned many competing groups from the Latitudinarians to the Dissenters to the Deists. Samuel Hefelbower in The Relation of John Locke to English Deism remarks that among the progressives -- theologians, philosophers and deists -- all accepted a rationalistic religion. The question then becomes what exactly is the role of reason vis à vis revelation. The discussion of the relation of reason to revelation goes back at least to Albertus Magnus and Thomas Aquinas -- that is to the scholastic authorities. Albert held that reason has a role to play in religion, but there are questions where philosophy has no final answer and revelation must decide. Revelation is above reason but not contrary to it. Thomas has a similar position (Hefelbower, p. 47). Locke still held the view that there is revelation that tells us about things above reason but not contrary to it. And reason is responsible for determining what counts as genuine revelation. The Deists tend to hold a more radical view than the one that Locke advocates.
Samuel Clarke in his Boyle lectures of 1704 distinguishes four grades of deists. First there were those who acknowledged a future life and other doctrines of natural religion. Second were those who while denying a future life, admitted the moral role of the deity. Third are those who acknowledged providence in natural religion, but not in morality. And finally, those who denied providence altogether. Where does Collins fit, in these grades of deism? According to O'Higgins: "In his books, Collins came to emphasize the part that morality should play in religion and to assert the importance of natural religion" (O'Higgins, 1970, p. 40). Collins claims to believe in a future life (if not natural immortality). Collins rejects Revelation. So, if O'Higgins is right, Collins fits Clarke's first grade of deists. David Berman has disputed this view, arguing that Collins is, in fact, an atheist.
An Essay Concerning the Use of Reason, Collins' first book, was published anonymously in 1707. The main thrust of the book is to reject religious mysteries. Collins starts his approach to the issues of religion and reason along the same lines that Locke does. He defines reason as "that faculty of the Mind, whereby it perceives the truth, Falsehood, Probability or Improbability of Propositions" (Essay, p. 3). Propositions consist of words "which stand for Ideas concerning which some agreement is affirm'd or deny'd" (Essay, pp. 3-4). Thus he accepts Locke's definition of knowledge. He also distinguishes in the way Locke does intuitive, demonstrative and probable truths, and treats claims about revelation as probable propositions that largely derive from testimony. Perhaps one diversion from Locke is that Collins distinguishes between two different kinds of probability. The stronger kind resembles demonstration but the connection between ideas is merely probable. The weaker kind of probability is testimony. Collins' position is that a person is not expected to believe anything that is not comprehensible by the human intellect. So, if terms take on meanings that cannot be understood, humans cannot be expected to believe them.
Part of the issue for Collins is what is meant by the phrase "above reason". Things above reason which were compatible with reason are not a problem for Collins. On the other hand, Collins claims that the distinction between reasonable propositions and "things above, and things contrary to reason" is the distinction that theologians use on behalf of mysteries and theological contradictions against those who say that they can only believe what they understand. Collins objected to various mysteries on the basis that one could not understand them. He rejects the Catholic doctrine of transubstantiation. But Collins also objects to the doctrine of the Trinity because it is not understandable and on some interpretations involves contradictions. Acceptance of the doctrine of the Trinity is the first of the Thirty-nine Articles to which an Anglican was supposed to subscribe. It is plain that Collins, like Locke, Newton, Clarke, Whiston, Toland and others, objected to this article. Many of these men concealed their views about the Trinity and claimed that they were orthodox Anglicans.
O'Higgins sees a strong affinity between Collins' book and John Toland's Christianity Not Mysterious, which had been published in 1696. He quotes Toland's remark that:
We hold that reason is the only foundation of all certitude...that nothing reveal'd, whether as to its manner or to its existence, is more exempted from its disquisitions, than the ordinary phenomena of nature ... that there is nothing in the gospel contrary to or above it.
O'Higgins claims that this is very much the position that Collins is taking in the Essay. In An Essay Concerning Human Understanding Locke had allowed that there were some truths that were above reason but compatible with it. Some scholars regard this as a mere verbal commitment to truths above reason, while others regard it as substantive. It seems very unlikely that Locke would accept truths above and contrary to reason. On this point, Locke, Toland, and Collins may be very nearly in complete agreement. Perhaps Toland holds a slightly stronger position than Locke in that he may hold that revelation, even revelation certified by reason, cannot reveal any truths above reason even where these truths are compatible with reason.
In A Vindication of the Divine Attributes, in some Remarks on His Grace the Archbishop of Dublin's sermon intitled "Divine Predestination Consistent with the Freedom of Man's Will", (published in 1710) Collins takes on another way of evading his demand that whatever we believe must be comprehensible to us. This is the doctrine of analogy that goes back to St. Thomas Aquinas. The form in which Collins finds it in the works of Archbishop King of Dublin, is the doctrine that not only does God not have hands and feet and a beard in a literal sense, he does not have wisdom, benevolence or justice in any sense that we can understand these terms. Thus King remarked: "It does not follow from hence, that any of these are more properly or literally in God after the manner they are in us, than hands or eyes, than mercy, than love or hatred are." Collins rejects the claim that God's wisdom and benevolence could have meanings that we do not comprehend. He asserts that God's knowledge and his attributes are univocal with ours (O'Higgins, 1970, p. 63).
David Berman in his A History of Atheism in Great Britain, gives a number of reasons to take Collins as an atheist rather than a deist. He sees Collins' account of the creation of matter ex nihlo in the Answer to Mr. Clarke's Third Defence as an argument for atheism disguised as an argument against atheism (Berman, 1988, pp. 80-81). He sees Collins as using Bayle to raise the problem of evil in the Vindication of the Divine Attributes and then showing that both the solution offered by Bayle and Dr. King are unacceptable. Collins' official position at the end of the Vindication is that King is wrong but atheism is avoidable. Berman asks what the actual conclusion of the Vindication is. He continues:
It is simply that there are very formidable, or insuperable, difficulties in the theistic conception of God -- revealed by the Manichean problems -- and that the latest attempt to cope with, or solve, these difficulties, i.e. King's theory, has failed; for the medicine is as bad as the disease. But the disease remains! (Berman, p. 84)
Collins clearly rejects theism based on revelation. But one could also be a theist based on arguments from natural religion. Berman sees the Vindication as aimed at the heart of natural religion (ibid.). If this were so, we would have good reason to regard Collins as an atheist. On the one hand, Collins' position about analogical language may seem to strongly support natural religion. Insofar as the meaning of the divine attributes is univocal with our use of the same words about human beings, the analogy that natural religion relies on would work at its best. (The basic analogy on which natural religion depends is that humans are to the machines they make as God is to the world.) Archbishop King's position, on the other hand, would completely undermine the analogy. There is, however, a second consideration. Insofar as the problem of evil is left unresolved in natural religion, it would suggest that it can provide no effective answer to this fundamental difficulty in theism. This is Berman's point. O'Higgins, by contrast, claims that in the Vindication Collins simply sets aside the problem of evil (O'Higgins, 1970, p. 63).
Like Locke, Collins is an advocate of the use of reason to determine religious truths. One necessary condition for being able to think freely is not to be persecuted for considering views that are different from the accepted ones. Only in such an environment can one genuinely consider alternatives. It must be possible to adopt whichever of the possibilities turns out to be the most reasonable. Collins, like Locke, is committed to the view that one should proportion assent to a proposition on the basis of the evidence for it. Religious persecution aims to limit the possibilites and the evidence that one can consider. Though Collins was strongly anti-clerical, he does distinguish between good priests and bad priests. The good priests are the ones who advocate freedom of thought, the bad priests, on the other hand, are persecutors who want to prevent people from thinking through the truths of religion for themselves. In his own time, Collins most controversial work was his A Discourse of Freethinking (1714).
Concerning the Discourse, J.M. Robertson writes that it "...may be said to sum up and unify the drift not only of previous English freethinking, but of the great contribution of Bayle, whose learning and temper influence all English deism from Shaftesbury onward" (Robertson, 1936 p. 722). Perhaps the motto of A Discourse of Free-Thinking ought to be "Where experts disagree, any person is free to reason for themselves." Collins is chiefly concerned with religion, so the vast bulk of the disagreements have to do with religious issues, from whether one religion is better than another, down to the details of the Anglicanism. Looking at conflicting claims often leads to skepticism. Where exactly this approach leads Collins is a question that we will have to consider.
In A Discourse of Free-thinking Collins defines free-thinking as "The Use of the Understanding, in endeavouring to find out the Meaning of any Proposition whatsoever, in considering the nature and Evidence for or against it, and in judging of it according to the seeming Force or Weakness of the Evidence" (p. 5). Collins claims that we have a right to think freely. Richard Bently in his Remarks about a Late Discourse of Free-Thinking charges that this definition is too broad -- that it amounts to a definition of thinking. James O'Higgins in his study of Collins agrees with Bently. This, however, is not a good evaluation. Collins' account is surely intended to rule out believing without evidence, or against the evidence, or without carefully considering conflicting evidence. Either these are not going to be admitted as thinking at all, or Collins' definition is not too broad.
The Discourse is divided into three sections. In the first two Collins gives a series of arguments in favor of free-thinking and in the third he answers objections to free-thinking and gives a list of historical figures who he views as free-thinkers. The arguments treat thinking effectively as like a craft or art and a number of the early arguments work on this analogy. He claims that just as putting restrictions on painting would reduce the proficiency of the painter, so putting restrictions on thinking can only reduce the proficiency of the thinker. To fail to think freely leads to the holding of absurd beliefs and superstition. Collins gives a brief history of the efforts of priests to control what people believe by fraud from the ancient world to the Reformation. Collins then claims that free-thinking is responsible for the decline in the belief in witchcraft.
Section 2 begins with Collins arguing that right opinion in matters of religion is supposed to be essential to salvation and errors to lead to damnation. But if one is not to think freely oneself about such subjects, then one must simply take up the opinions of those among whom one happens to live. But this means that they will only be right by accident. On the other hand, if people think freely, they will have "the evidence of things to determine them to the side of truth" (ibid., p. 33). There are in all ages an infinite number of pretenders to revelations from Heaven, supported by miracles. These pretenders offer new notions of the Deity, new doctrines, commands, ceremonies and modes of worship. To decide which of these are genuine and which spurious requires that one think freely about the competing evidence that would show that one is genuine while the other an imposter. Collins remarks that since the Anglican Church has an organization to support foreign missionaries (The Society for Propagating the Gospel in Foreign Lands) this really requires supporting free-thinking throughout the world and therefore at home as well. Indeed: "As there can be no reasonable change of opinions among men, no quitting of any old religion, no reception of any new religion, nor believing any religion at all, but by means of free-thinking; so the Holy Scriptures agreeably to reason, and to the design of our blessed Savior of establishing his religion throughout the whole universe, imply everywhere and press in many places the duty of free thinking" (ibid., pp. 43-6). Finally Collins claims that the conduct of the priests "who are the chief Pretenders to be the Guides to others in matters of Religion, makes free-thinking on the nature and attributes of the eternal being of God, on the authority of the scriptures, and on the sense of scriptures, unavoidable" (ibid., p. 46). He goes on to list disagreements and differences of opinion among priests on all these topics.
In section 3 Collins takes up various objections to free-thinking. To suppose that all men have a right to think freely on all subjects is to suppose that they have the capacity to do so. But they do not. So it is absurd to think that they have a duty to think freely. Collins replies that to suppose a right to a thing "also implies a Right in him to let it alone, if he thinks fit" (ibid., p. 100). As for free-thinking being a duty, Collins responds that it is so only in cases where those who contend "for the Necessity of all Men's assenting to certain Propositions, must allow that men are qualify'd to do so" (ibid.). If it were the case that the great bulk of mankind lacked the capacity to think freely on matters of speculation, then the priests should conclude that men should in no way be concerned about truth and falsehood in speculative matters. In short, they should hold no opinion. Even in this case, however, the right to think freely would remain untouched in those disposed to think freely. The second objection is that to encourage free-thinking "will produce endless Divisions of Opinion and by consequence Disorders in Society." Collins suggests that the consequence is false and that any remedy is worse than the disease. Third, free-thinking may lead to atheism. Collins points out that many divines hold that there never was a real atheist in the world while Bacon holds that contemplative atheists are rare. Still, even if free-thinking were to produce many atheists, the number of those who are superstitious or enthusiastic that will be produced in the absence of free-thinking is even greater. And these are worse evils for society than atheism. Fourthly, priests are the experts who are to be relied upon in their subject as doctors and lawyers are to be relied upon in theirs. Collins argues that the analogy between doctors and lawyers and priests does not hold. First, while doctors and lawyers act for us, we need not believe the principles or opinions on which one prescribes and the other acts. But in matters of religion, "I am obliged to believe certain opinions myself. No man's belief will save me except my own" (ibid., p. 109). Finally, free-thinkers are "the most infamous, wicked and senseless of all mankind." (Ibid., p. 118) Collins answers this objection in various ways -- arguing that in fact free-thinking makes one virtuous. He ends by listing a variety of men he considers free-thinkers whose moral character was impeccable -- Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus, Plutarch, Cicero, Varo and others among the ancients. Among the moderns he includes, Bacon, Hobbes and Archbishop Tillotson.
The Discourse leaves us with a variety of questions. What exactly is Collins trying to achieve in this book? Reflecting on the first two sections of the Discourse, James O'Higgins notes: "A good deal of what he wrote can be interpreted as the writing of an anti-clerical protestant, insisting on private judgment for the laity. A few other passages ... such as those from Varo and Socrates, seem to imply a bias against Christianity itself, or at least against Revelation" (p. 89). Some of Collins critics accused him of being an atheist. But, unless one gives the work an esoteric reading, this hardly seems warranted. Collins is, however, clearly extolling a universal religion based on reason.
The Discourse received a good number of replies. Steele commented that the author of the Discourse deserved "to be denied the common benefits of air and water" (quoted in O'Higgins, 1970 p. 78). The Guardian campaigned against the Discourse. Among the articles it published were some by the young George Berkeley. There is a certain amount of scholarly debate about how effective these replies were. From early on, historians have often claimed that Richard Bently in his Remarks about a late Discourse of Freethinking delivered a crushing rejoinder to Collins. Robertson pretty much alone rejected this opinion. James O'Higgins in his book-length study of Collins probably gives the most balanced assessment. O'Higgins admits that Bently, on the whole, makes a strictly ad hominem attack on Collins. He attacked Collins' scholarship and accused him of atheism. O'Higgins thinks that Bently succeeded in showing that "Collins was not the man to produce a critical edition of the Bible" (O'Higgins, 1970, p. 84). O'Higgins also remarks that Bently correctly points out that Collins did not understand the role of textual variants in reducing (rather than increasing) our uncertainty about the meaning of a text. Since Collins is maintaining that everyone capable of doing so should reason about religious matters, claims that he failed to reason correctly may have more bite to them than other ad hominem arguments. But while these are good points, set against the fact that Bently completely failed to address the main issue of religious authority, this can hardly amount to a crushing rejoinder. Robertson is also surely right in holding that Collins' scholarship is not as bad as Bently claimed and that Bently's scholarship is often not as good as historians have claimed.
In Priestcraft in Perfection, 1709, and An Historical and Critical Essay on the Thirty Nine Articles of the Church of England, 1724, Collins attacks the first clause of Article 20 of the 39 articles: "The Church hath power to decree rites or ceremonies, and authority in controversies of faith." Collins goes over the history of the clause in considerable detail to argue that it is a forgery. Clearly if this were a forgery, the church would have no power to decree rites nor authority in controversies of faith. The point is that: "...the just and true establishment of religion lies, in allowing every man to have a conscience of his own; to use and follow his own private judgment; and particularly, to understand, profess and practice, what he thinks God teaches in the holy scriptures" (Collins, Preface to the Essay, quoted in O'Higgins, 1970 pp. 143-4). O'Higgins notes that this might be the position of any dissenting minister. O'Higgins gives a detailed summary of the controversy in Chapter IX of his study of Collins.
In A Discourse on the Grounds and Reasons of the Christian Religion, 1724, Collins attacks the basis of Christianity as a revealed religion. In The Reasonableness of Christianity, Locke had made the messiahship of Christ the single fundamental tenet for being a Christian. In the Discourse Collins is rejecting it. The argument is that Christianity is founded on Judaism, or the New Testament on the Old. The New Testament is only of importance in this regard insofar as it shows that the prophecies of the Old are fulfilled. This, he claims, is the only proof for Christianity. Collins' critics disputed this claim; there was the proof from miracles. But Collins rejected such proofs.
In rejecting the argument from prophecies Collins is once again jousting with the Newtonians. William Whiston (1667-1752) was a close associate of Newton's and was probably influenced by Newton's interest in prophetic arguments. Stephen Snobelen points out in his review of the controversy that Whiston hoped to set up an exact science of prophecies. As Snobelen notes: "For Whiston, fulfilled prophecy was as certain as a Bolyean experiment or a Newtonian demonstration" (Snobelen, p. 205). Collins shared much of Whiston's desire for precision. Often it was allowed that a prophecy in the old testament had dual fulfillments, one in the prophet's own day and one in the more remote future. One of these was supposed to be literal, the other allegorical. Both Whiston and Collins reject ‘allegorical’ interpretations for literal ones. But while Whiston regarded the later fulfillment as literal and the earlier as allegorical, Collins insisted that it was the earlier one that should be regarded as literal.
We have already considered in some detail Samuel Clarke's reaction to Collins' views about emergent properties, personal identity and issues about determinism and free will in the early eighteenth century. The Collins Clarke correspondence of 1706-08 was reprinted twice and referred to many times in the course of the eighteenth century (Martin and Barresi, p. 33). The conservative reaction to Locke and Collins concerning personal identity and materialism represented by Clarke continued to be maintained by many thinkers in eighteenth century England as well as on the continent. In fact, we can see an on-going debate between the materialists and dualists on these topics all the way through the eighteenth and into the early nineteenth century in England.
George Berkeley (1685-1753) met Collins at a freethinking coffee house meeting and later told his American follower, Samuel Johnson, that Collins was an atheist. As noted earlier, Berkeley attacked the Discourse of Free-Thinking in Steele's Guardian, and continued his attacks on Collins in Alciphron. While Berkeley holds a quite distinct set of philosophical views from those of Clarke, together they represent a conservative Anglican response to Locke and Collins on the issue of personal identity. Berkeley agrees with Clarke about the substantial nature of persons.
Bishop Joseph Butler (1592-1752) a protege of Samuel Clarke attacked the Locke/Collins account of personal identity in the Appendix on Personal Identity to his Analogy of Religion. Butler largely accepted Clarke's substantialist account of identity and personal identity and accused Collins of taking Locke's doctrines "to strange length." By this Butler meant that Collins held a successive view of persons. This has been an influential misinterpretation of Collins.
Thomas Reid (1710-1796) holds positions on materialism, personal identity and free will that have much in common with the views of Clarke. Reid deploys reduplication arguments in objecting to the views about personal identity of Joseph Priestly (see Martin and Barresi, p. 47). Priestly's views have strong connections to those of Collins and Locke.
Joseph Priestley (1733-1804) was sufficiently impressed with Collins' Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Free Will to arrange the publication of a new edition of that work. Priestley also held that matter can think, but his views were based on a different conception of matter than the one which Collins and Clarke shared. Priestley had an active conception of matter derived from Boscovich. Priestley was also impressed by Collins' work on the prophecies.
Collins' influence on the continent in the second half of the eighteenth century was much more considerable than his influence in England. O'Higgins remarks that "Small though his part in English literature may have been, during his own lifetime there were few English writers who were more fully reported in the continental journals, or more noted in foreign universities" (O'Higgins, p. 203). Pierre Desmaiseaux knew Collins for some 26 years and was his friend and collaborator. Collins discussed Clarke's response to his book on determinism with Desmaiseaux and Desmaiseaux kept Collins in contact with the intellectual life on the continent and also served as a publicist for Collins. He had Collins' Inquiry translated into French and handled the printing of his other books. In 1720, under Collins' direction, Desmaiseaux published A collection of several pieces of Mr. John Locke, never before printed, or not extant in his works. Pub. by the author of the Life of the ever-memorable Mr. John Hales, &c which contained a number of Locke's letters to Collins. There was considerable interest on the continent in the thinking-matter controversy. There is a certain amount of debate about the influence on Voltaire of Collins' book on free will and determinism. O'Higgins accepts the evidence produced by Torrey in Voltaire and the English Deists that Voltaire was converted to determinism by reading Collins (O'Higgins, pp. 219-20). As time passed free-thinking came out into the open in France and Collins' name was associated with it. Finally, his works on the materiality of the soul, determinism and free will and the prophecies influenced the group around Baron Holbach. (For a detailed treatment of Collins' influence on the continent, see O'Higgins, 1970, Chapter XI.) Whether Collins would have been happy with this depends on whether we view him as a deist with O'Higgins, or as an atheist with David Berman. This disagreement over whether to regard Collins as a deist or as an atheist is our most serious unresolved problem in determining Collins' proper place in the history of ideas.