This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.



Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

This document uses HTML 4/Unicode to display special characters. Older browsers and/or operating systems may not display these characters correctly.
last substantive
content change


Cognitive Science

Cognitive science is the interdisciplinary study of mind and intelligence, embracing philosophy, psychology, artificial intelligence, neuroscience, linguistics, and anthropology. Its intellectual origins are in the mid-1950s when researchers in several fields began to develop theories of mind based on complex representations and computational procedures. Its organizational origins are in the mid-1970s when the Cognitive Science Society was formed and the journal Cognitive Science began. Since then, more than sixty universities in North America and Europe have established cognitive science programs and many others have instituted courses in cognitive science.

1. History

Attempts to understand the mind and its operation go back at least to the Ancient Greeks, when philosophers such as Plato and Aristotle tried to explain the nature of human knowledge. The study of mind remained the province of philosophy until the nineteenth century, when experimental psychology developed. Wilhelm Wundt and his students initiated laboratory methods for studying mental operations more systematically. Within a few decades, however, experimental psychology became dominated by behaviorism, a view that virtually denied the existence of mind. According to behaviorists such as J. B. Watson, psychology should restrict itself to examining the relation between observable stimuli and observable behavioral responses. Talk of consciousness and mental representations was banished from respectable scientific discussion. Especially in North America, behaviorism dominated the psychological scene through the 1950s. Around 1956, the intellectual landscape began to change dramatically. George Miller summarized numerous studies which showed that the capacity of human thinking is limited, with short-term memory, for example, limited to around seven items. He proposed that memory limitations can be overcome by recoding information into chunks, mental representations that require mental procedures for encoding and decoding the information. At this time, primitive computers had been around for only a few years, but pioneers such as John McCarthy, Marvin Minsky, Allen Newell, and Herbert Simon were founding the field of artificial intelligence. In addition, Noam Chomsky rejected behaviorist assumptions about language as a learned habit and proposed instead to explain language comprehension in terms of mental grammars consisting of rules. The six thinkers mentioned in this paragraph can be viewed as the founders of cognitive science.

2. Representation and Computation

The central hypothesis of cognitive science is that thinking can best be understood in terms of representational structures in the mind and computational procedures that operate on those structures. While there is much disagreement about the nature of the representations and computations that constitute thinking, the central hypothesis is general enough to encompass the current range of thinking in cognitive science, including connectionist theories which model thinking using artificial neural networks.

Most work in cognitive science assumes that the mind has mental representations analogous to computer data structures, and computational procedures similar to computational algorithms. Cognitive theorists have proposed that the mind contains such mental representations as logical propositions, rules, concepts, images, and analogies, and that it uses mental procedures such as deduction, search, matching, rotating, and retrieval. The dominant mind-computer analogy in cognitive science has taken on a novel twist from the use of another analog, the brain. Connectionists have proposed novel ideas about representation and computation that use neurons and their connections as inspirations for data structures, and neuron firing and spreading activation as inspirations for algorithms. Cognitive science then works with a complex 3-way analogy among the mind, the brain, and computers. Mind, brain, and computation can each be used to suggest new ideas about the others. There is no single computational model of mind, since different kinds of computers and programming approaches suggest different ways in which the mind might work. The computers that most of us work with today are serial processors, performing one instruction at a time, but the brain and some recently developed computers are parallel processors, capable of doing many operations at once.

3. Philosophical Relevance

Philosophy, in particular philosophy of mind, is part of cognitive science. But the interdisciplinary field of cognitive science is relevant to philosophy in several ways. First, the psychological, computational, and other results of cognitive science investigations have important potential applications to traditional philosophical problems in epistemology, metaphysics, and ethics. Second, cognitive science can serve as an object of philosophical critique, particularly concerning the central assumption that thinking is representational and computational. Third and more constructively, cognitive science can be taken as an object of investigation in the philosophy of science, generating reflections on the methodology and presuppositions of the enterprise.

3.1 Philosophical Applications

Much philosophical research today is naturalistic, treating philosophical investigations as continuous with empirical work in fields such as psychology. From a naturalistic perspective, philosophy of mind is closely allied with theoretical and experimental work in cognitive science. Metaphysical conclusions about the nature of mind are to be reached, not by a priori speculation, but by informed reflection on scientific developments in fields such as computer science and neuroscience. Similarly, epistemology is not a stand-alone conceptual exercise, but depends on and benefits from scientific findings concerning mental structures and learning procedures. Even ethics can benefit by using greater understanding of the psychology of moral thinking to bear on ethical questions such as the nature of deliberations concerning right and wrong. Goldman (1993) provides a concise review of applications of cognitive science to epistemology, philosophy of science, philosophy of mind, metaphysics, and ethics.

3.2 Critique of Cognitive Science

The claim that human minds work by representation and computation is an empirical conjecture and might be wrong. Although the computational-representational approach to cognitive science has been successful in explaining many aspects of human problem solving, learning, and language use, some philosophical critics such as Hubert Dreyfus and John Searle have claimed that this approach is fundamentally mistaken. Critics of cognitive science have offered such challenges as:
  1. The emotion challenge: Cognitive science neglects the important role of emotions in human thinking.
  2. The consciousness challenge: Cognitive science ignores the importance of consciousness in human thinking.
  3. The world challenge: Cognitive science disregards the significant role of physical environments in human thinking.
  4. The social challenge: Human thought is inherently social in ways that cognitive science ignores.
  5. The dynamical systems challenge: The mind is a dynamical system, not a computational system.
  6. The mathematics challenge: Mathematical results show that human thinking cannot be computational in the standard sense, so the brain must operate differently, perhaps as a quantum computer.
Thagard (1996) argues that all these challenges can best be met by expanding and supplementing the computational-representational approach, not by abandoning it.

3.3 Philosophy of Cognitive Science

Cognitive science raises many interesting methodological questions that are worthy of investigation by philosophers of science. What is the nature of representation? What role do computational models play in the development of cognitive theories? What is the relation among apparently competing accounts of mind involving symbolic processing, neural networks, and dynamical systems? Are psychological phenomena subject to reductionist explanations via neuroscience? Von Eckardt (1993) and Clark (2001) provide discussions of some of the philosophical issues that arise in cognitive science. Bechtel et al. (2001) collect useful articles on the philosophy of neuroscience.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

artificial intelligence | behaviorism | concepts | connectionism | consciousness | emotion | folk psychology: as a theory | folk psychology: as mental simulation | identity theory of mind | innate/acquired distinction | innate ideas | intentionality | language of thought hypothesis | meaning holism | memory | mental content | mental imagery | mental representation | mind: computational theory of | mind: modularity of | neuroscience, philosophy of | propositional attitude reports

Copyright © 1996, 2002
Paul Thagard

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy