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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
The law of causality, I believe, like much that passes muster among philosophers, is a relic of a bygone age, surviving, like the monarchy, only because it is erroneously supposed to do no harm. (Russell, 1913, p. 1).In that paper Russell argued that the philosopher's concept of causation involving, as it does, the law of universal determinism that every event has a cause and the associated concept of causation as a relation between events, is "otiose" and in modern science is replaced by the concept of causal laws understood in terms of functional relations, where these causal laws are not necessarily deterministic.
However, in a later book written in 1948, entitled Human Knowledge Bertrand Russell outlines a similar view but does so in language which is much more flattering to causation. He still holds that the philosophical idea of causation should be seen as a primitive version of the scientific idea of causal laws. Nevertheless, his emphasis now is on certain postulates of causation which he takes to be fundamental to scientific (inductive) inference, and Russell's aim is to show how scientific inference is possible.
The problem with thinking about causal laws as the underpinning of scientific inference is that the world is a complex place, and while causal laws might hold true, they often do not obtain because of preventing circumstances, and it is impractical to bring in innumerable ‘unless’ clauses. But, even though there is infinite complexity in the world, there are also causal lines of quasi-permanence, and these warrant our inferences.
Russell elaborates these ideas into five postulates which he says are necessary "to validate scientific method" (1948, p. 487). The first is ‘The Postulate of Quasi-permanence’ which states that there is a certain kind of persistence in the world, for generally things do not change discontinuously. The second postulate, ‘Of Separable Causal Lines’, allows that there is often long term persistence in things and processes. The third postulate, ‘Of Spatio-temporal Continuity’ denies action at a distance. Russell claims "when there is a causal connection between two events that are not contiguous, there must be intermediate links in the causal chain such that each is contiguous to the next, or (alternatively) such that there is a process which is continuous." (1948, p. 487). ‘The Structural Postulate’, the fourth, allows us to infer from structurally similar complex events ranged about a centre to an event of similar structure linked by causal lines to each event. The fifth postulate, ‘Of Analogy’ allows us to infer the existence of a causal effect when it is unobservable.
The key postulate concerns the idea of causal lines or, in our terminology, causal processes. Russell's 1948 view is that causal lines replace the primitive notion of causation in the scientific view of the world, and not only replace but also explain the extent to which the primitive notion, causation, is correct. He writes,
The concept "cause", as it occurs in the works of most philosophers, is one which is apparently not used in any advanced science. But the concepts that are used have been developed from the primitive concept (which is that prevalent among philosophers), and the primitive concept, as I shall try to show, still has importance as the source of approximate generalisations and pre-scientific inductions, and as a concept which is valid when suitably limited. (1948, p. 471).Russell also says, "When two events belong to one causal line the earlier may be said to "cause" the later. In this way laws of the form "A causes B" may preserve a certain validity." (1948, p. 334). So Russell can be seen, in his 1948 book, as proposing the view that within limits causal lines, or causal processes, may be taken to analyse causation. So what is a causal line? Russell writes,
I call a series of events a "causal line" if, given some of them, we can infer something about the others without having to know anything about the environment. (1948, p. 333).
A causal line may always be regarded as a persistence of something, a person, a table, a photon, or what not. Throughout a given causal line, there may be constancy of quality, constancy of structure, or gradual changes in either, but not sudden change of any considerable magnitude. (1948, pp. 475-7).So the trajectory through time of something is a causal line if it doesn't change too much, and if it persists in isolation from other things. A series of events which display this kind of similarity display what Russell calls ‘quasi-permanence’.
The concept of more or less permanent physical object in its common-sense form involves "substance", and when "substance" is rejected we have to find some other way of defining the identity of a physical object at different times. I think this must be done by means of the concept "causal line". (1948, p. 333).Elsewhere Russell writes,
The law of quasi-permanence as I intend it ... is designed to explain the success of the common-sense notion of "things" and the physical notion of "matter" (in classical physics). ... a "thing" or a piece of matter is not to be regarded as a single persistent substantial entity, but as a string of events having a certain kind of causal connection with each other. This kind is what I call "quasi-permanence". The causal law that I suggest may be enunciated as follows: "Given an event at a certain time, then at any slightly earlier or slightly later time there is, at some neighbouring place, a closely similar event". I do not assert that this happens always, but only that it happens very often- sufficiently often to give a high probability to an induction confirming it in a particular case. When "substance" is abandoned, the identity, for commonsense, of a thing or a person at different times must be explained as consisting in what may be called a "causal line". (1948, pp. 475-7).This has relevance for the question of identity through time, and in Human Knowledge we find that Bertrand Russell sees that there is an important connection between causal process and identity, namely, that the concept of a causal line can be used to explain the identity through time of an object or a person.
So what we may call Russell's causal theory of identity (Dowe, forthcoming) asserts that the identity over time of an object or a person consists in the different temporal parts of that person being all part of the one causal line. This is the causal theory of identity (Armstrong, 1980) couched in terms of causal processes or lines. A causal line in turn is understood by way of an inference which is licensed by the law of quasi permanence.
A "causal line," as I wish to define the term, is a temporal series of events so related that, given some of them, something can be inferred about the others whatever may be happening elsewhere. (1948, p. 459).Salmon's criticism of this is precisely that it is formulated in epistemic terms, "for the existence of the vast majority of causal processes in the history of the universe is quite independent of human knowers." (1984, p. 145). Salmon, as we shall see in the next section, develops his account of causal processes as an explicitly ‘ontic’, as opposed to an ‘epistemic’ account. (1984, ch. 1).
There is a further reason why Russell's epistemic approach is unacceptable. While it is true that causal processes do warrant inferences of the sort Russell has in mind, it is not the case that all rational inferences are warranted by the existence (‘postulation’, in Russell's thinking) of causal lines. There are other types of causal structures besides a causal line. Russell himself gives an example: two clouds of incandescent gas of a given element both emit the same spectral lines, but are not causally connected. (1948, p. 455). Yet we may rightly make inferences from one to the other. A pervasive type of case is where two events are not directly causally connected but have a common cause.
The second objection is that Russell's theory of a causal line does not enable the distinction between pseudo and causal processes to be made, yet to delineate causal from pseudo processes is a key issue which needs to be addressed by any theory of causal processes. As Reichenbach argued (1958, pp. 147-9), as he reflected on the implications of Einstein's special theory of relativity, science requires that we distinguish between causal and pseudo processes. Reichenbach noticed that the central principle that nothing travels faster than the speed of light is ‘violated’ by certain processes. For example, a spot of light moving along a wall is capable of moving faster than the speed of light. (One needs just a powerful enough light and a wall sufficiently large and sufficiently distant.) Other examples include shadows, and the point of intersection of two rulers (see Salmon's clear exposition in his 1984, pp. 141-4). Such pseudo processes, as we shall call them (Reichenbach called them "unreal sequences"; 1958, pp. 147-9), do not violate special relativity, Reichenbach argued, simply because they are not causal processes, and the principle that nothing travels faster than the speed of light applies only to causal processes. Thus special relativity demands a distinction between causal and pseudo processes. But Russell's theory doesn't explain this distinction, because both causal processes and pseudo processes display constancy of structure and quality; and both licence inferences of the sort Russell has in mind. For example, the phase velocity of a wave packet is a pseudo process but the group velocity is a causal process; yet both licence reliable predictions.
Salmon treats causality as primarily a characteristic of continuous processes rather than as a relation between events. His theory involves two elements, the production and the propagation of causal influence. (See, for example, 1984, p. 139.) The latter is achieved by causal processes. Salmon defines a process as anything that displays consistency of structure over time. (1984, p.144). To distinguish between causal and pseudo processes (which Reichenbach called "unreal sequences"; 1958, pp. 147-9). Salmon makes use of Reichenbach's ‘mark criterion’: a process is causal if it is capable of transmitting a local modification in structure (a ‘mark’) (1984, p. 147). Drawing on the work of Bertrand Russell, Salmon seeks to explicate the notion of ‘transmission’ by the ‘at-at theory’ of mark transmission. The principle of mark transmission (MT) states:
MT: Let P be a process that, in the absence of interactions with other processes would remain uniform with respect to a characteristic Q, which it would manifest consistently over an interval that includes both of the space - time points A and B (A B). Then, a mark (consisting of a modification of Q into Q*), which has been introduced into process P by means of a single local interaction at a point A, is transmitted to point B if [and only if] P manifests the modification Q* at B and at all stages of the process between A and B without additional interactions. (1984, p. 148).Salmon himself omits the ‘only if’ condition. However, as suggested by Sober (1987, p. 253), this condition is essential because the principle is to be used to identify pseudo processes on the grounds that they do not transmit a mark (Dowe, 1992b, p. 198). Thus for Salmon a causal process is one which can transmit a mark, and it is these spatiotemporally continuous processes that propagate causal influence.
To accompany this theory of the propagation of causal influence, Salmon also analyses the production of causal processes. According to Salmon, causal production can be explained in terms of causal forks, whose main role is the part they play in the production of order and structure of causal processes. The causal forks are characterised by statistical forks; to Reichenbach's ‘conjunctive fork’ Salmon has added the ‘interactive’ and ‘perfect’ forks, each corresponding to a different type of common-cause.
Firstly there is the ‘conjunctive fork’, where two processes arise from a special set of background conditions often in a non-lawful fashion. (Salmon, 1984, p. 179). In such a case we get a statistical correlation between the two processes which can be explained by appealing to the common cause, which ‘screens off’ the statistical connection. This is the principle of the common cause (due originally to Reichenbach (1956)) which, stated formally, is that if, for two events A and B,
(1) P(A.B) > P(A).P(B)holds, then look for an event C such that
(2) P(A.B|C) = P(A|C).P(B|C)The events A, B, and C form a conjunctive fork (For the full account see Salmon, 1984, ch. 6). In Salmon's theory of causality, conjunctive forks produce structure and order from ‘de-facto’ background conditions.(1984, p. 179).
Secondly, there is the ‘interactive fork’, where an intersection between two processes produces a modification in both (1984, p. 170) and an ensuing correlation between the two processes cannot be screened off by the common cause. Instead, the interaction is governed by conservation laws. For example, consider a pool table where the cue ball is placed in such a position relative to the eight ball that, if the eight ball is sunk in one pocket A , the cue ball will almost certainly drop into the other pocket B. There is a correlation between A and B such that equation (1) holds. But the common cause C, the striking of the cue ball, does not screen off this correlation. Salmon has suggested that the interactive fork can be characterised by the relation
(3) P(A.B|C) > P(A|C).P(B|C)together with (1). (1978, p. 704, n. 31). Interactive forks are involved in the production of modifications in order and structure of causal processes. (1982, p. 265; 1984, p. 179). In this paper ‘interactive fork’ is used to mean precisely ‘a set of three events related according to equations (1) and (3)’.
The idea of a causal interaction is further analysed by Salmon in terms of the notion of mutual modification. The principle of causal interaction (CI) states:
CI: Let P1 and P2 be two processes that intersect with one another at the space-time S, which belongs to the histories of both. Let Q be a characteristic of that process P1 would exhibit throughout an interval (which includes subintervals on both sides of S in the history of P1) if the intersection with P2 did not occur; let R be a characteristic that process P2 would exhibit throughout an interval (which includes subintervals on both sides of S in the history of P2) if the intersection with P1 did not occur. Then, the intersection of P1 and P2 at S constitutes a causal interaction if (1) P1 exhibits the characteristic Q before S, but it exhibits a modified characteristic Q* throughout an interval immediately following S; and (2) P2 exhibits R before S but it exhibits a modified characteristic R throughout an interval immediately following S. (1984, p. 171).Thirdly, there is the perfect fork, which is the deterministic limit of both the conjunctive and interactive fork. It is included as a special case because in the deterministic limit the interactive fork is indistinguishable from the conjunctive fork. (1984, pp. 177-8). Thus, a perfect fork could be involved in either the production of order and structure, or the production of changes in order and structure of causal processes.
1. MT excludes causal processes. Firstly, the principle requires that processes display a degree of uniformity over a time period. This distinguishes processes (causal and pseudo) from ‘spatiotemporal junk’, to use Kitcher's term. One problem with this is that it seems to exclude many causal effects which are short lived. For example, short lived subatomic particles play important causal roles, but they don't seem to qualify as causal processes. On any criterion there are causal processes which are ‘relatively short lived’. Also, the question concerning how long a regularity must persist raises philosophical difficulties about degrees which need answering before we have an adequate distinction between processes and spatiotemporal junk. However, if these were the only difficulties I think that the theory could be saved. Unfortunately, they are not.
More seriously, the MT principle requires that causal processes would remain uniform in the absence of interactions and that marks can be transmitted in the absence of additional interventions. However, in real situations processes are continuously involved in interactions of one sort or another.(Kitcher, 1989, p. 464). Even in the most idealised of situations interactions of sorts occur. For example, consider a universe that contains only one single moving particle. Not even this process moves in the absence of interactions, for the particle is forever intersecting with spatial regions. If we required that the interactions be causal (at the risk of circularity), then it is still true that in real cases there are many causal interactions continuously affecting processes. Even in carefully controlled scientific experiments there are many (admittedly irrelevant) causal interactions going on. Further, Salmon's central insight that causal processes are self propagating is not entirely well founded. For while some causal processes (light radiation, inertial motion) are self propagating, others are not. Falling bodies and electric currents are moved by their respective fields. (In particular there is no electric counterpart to inertia.) Sound waves are propagated within a medium, and simply do not exist ‘in the absence of interactions’. Such processes require a ‘causal background’, some can even be described as being a series of causal interactions. These causal processes cannot move in the absence of interactions. Thus there are a whole range of causal processes which are excluded by the requirement that they would remain uniform in the absence of any interactions.
It seems desirable, therefore, to abandon the requirement that a causal process is one that is capable of transmitting a mark in the absence of further interactions. However, the requirement is there for a reason, and that is that without it the theory is open to the objection that certain pseudo processes will count as being capable of transmitting marks. Salmon considers a case where a moving spot is marked by a red filter held up close to the wall. If someone ran alongside the wall holding up the filter, then it seems that the modification to the process is transmitted beyond the space-time locality of the original marking interaction. Thus there are problems if the requirement is kept, and there are problems if it is omitted. So it is not clear how the theory can be saved from the problem that some causal processes can not move in the absence of further interactions.
2. MT fails to exclude pseudo processes. Salmon's explicit intention in employing the MT principle is to show how pseudo processes are different from causal processes. If MT fails here then it fails its major test. However, a strong case can be made for saying that it does indeed fail this test.
Firstly, there are cases where pseudo processes qualify as being capable of transmitting a mark, because of the vagueness of the notion of a characteristic. We have seen that Salmon's approach to causality is to give an informal characterisation of the concepts of ‘production’ and ‘propagation’. In these characterisations, the primitive notions include ‘characteristic’, but nothing precise is said about this notion. While Salmon is entitled to take this informal approach, in this case more needs to be said about a primitive notion such as ‘characteristic’, at least indicating the range of its application, because the vagueness renders the account open to counter-examples.
For example, in the early morning the top (leading) edge of the shadow of the Sydney Opera House has the characteristic of being closer to the Harbour Bridge than to the Opera House. But later in the day (at time t say), this characteristic changes. This characteristic qualifies as a mark by IV, since it is a change in a characteristic introduced by the local intersection of two processes, namely, the movement of the shadow across the ground, and the (stationary) patch of ground which represents the midpoint between the Opera House and the Harbour Bridge. By III this mark which the shadow displays continuously after time t, is transmitted by the process. Thus, by II, the shadow is a causal process. This is similar to Sober's counter-example of where a light spot ‘transmits’ the characteristic of occurring after a glass filter is bolted in place. (1987, p. 254).
So there are some restrictions that need to be placed on the type of property allowed as a characteristic. Having the property of "occurring after a certain time" (Sober, 1987, p. 254),or the property of "being the shadow of a scratched car" (Kitcher, 1989, p. 638) or the property of "being closer to the Harbour Bridge than to the Opera House" (Dowe, 1992b, sec. 2.2) can qualify a shadow to be a causal process. There is a need to specify what kinds of properties can count as the appropriate characteristics for marking. It is not sufficient to say that the mark has to be introduced by a single local interaction, for as the above discussion suggests it is always possible to identify a single local interaction.
The difficulty lies in the type of characteristic allowed. A less informal approach to the subject could have provided, for example, a restriction of ‘property’ to ‘non-relational property’, thereby avoiding this particular problem.
There are a number of possible ways to provide a more precise account of ‘characteristic’, either in philosophical terms such as ‘property’; or in terms of precise scientific notions such as ‘molecular structure’, ‘energy’ or ‘information’. In physics and chemistry description of the structure of a molecule, or larger solid body is given in terms of geometrical arrangement as well as the constituent particles and bonding forces. In biology the structure of a cell refers to its geometry as well as its constituents. Clearly a specific definition such as ‘chemical structure’ is not broad enough for Salmon's purposes. Although he uses examples such as the drug which causes a person to lose consciousness because it retains its ‘chemical structure’ as it is absorbed into the blood stream (1984, p. 155) it is nevertheless clear that the ‘structure’ of a car, a golf ball, a shadow, or a pulse of light is not simply ‘chemical structure.’ But perhaps this suggests a general characterisation in terms of constituent material, bonding forces and geometrical shape. I believe such an account has a lot of potential. For example, a chalk mark on a ball is a change in constituent material, a dent in a car is a change in geometrical shape, etc.
A different approach would be to link ‘characteristic’ to ‘property’ of which there are precise philosophical accounts available. (For example, (Armstrong, 1978) ). Rogers takes this approach, defining the state of a process as the set of properties of the process at a given time. (Rogers, 1981, p. 203). A ‘law of non-interactive evolution’ gives the probability of the possible states at a later time, conditional on the actual state.
However, even if that approach were successful, there are further difficulties of a different kind. Firstly, there are cases of "derivative marks" (Kitcher, 1989, p. 463) where a pseudo process displays a modification in a characteristic on account of a change in the causal processes on which it depends. This change could either be in the source, or in the causal background. A change at the source would include cases where the spotlight spot is ‘marked’ by a coloured filter at the source (Salmon, 1984, p. 142) or a car's shadow is marked when a passenger's arm holds up a flag. (Kitcher, 1989, p. 463).
The clause ‘by means of a single local interaction’ is intended to exclude this type of example: but it is not clear that this works, for does not the shadow intersect with the modified sunlight pattern locally? It is true that the ‘modified sunlight pattern’ originated, or was caused by, the passenger raising his arm with the flag, but the fact that the marking interaction is the result of a chain of causes cannot be held to exclude those interactions, for genuine marking interactions are always the result of a chain of causal processes and interactions. (Kitcher, 1989, p. 464) Similarly, there is a local spacetime intersection of the spotlight spot and the red beam.
However, even if the ‘local’ requirement did exclude these cases, there are other cases where pseudo processes can be marked by changes in the causal background which are local. For example, imagine that there is a long stretch of road where the side of the road is flat, then farther along there is a long fence close to the road. The shadow of the car will change its shape abruptly as the car reaches the fence. We can say that there is a local interaction between the shadow and the beginning of the fence which produces a permanent modification to the shadow. A similar case is where a person runs around an astrodome holding up a red filter which modifies the spot. The clause ‘by means of a single local interaction’ is intended to block these cases: but if this is employed too heavily it would exclude causal processes as well, such as Salmon's paradigm case where a red filter modifies the light beam. In this case the filter continues to act on the beam, just like the fence or the moving filter cases.
In any case it is possible to modify a pseudo process by a single interaction: take the case where a stationary car (a causal process) throws its shadow on a fence. Suddenly the fence falls over, producing a permanent modification in the shadow. Then the shadow has been marked by the single local action of the falling fence. Salmon's counterfactual requirement that the process would remain uniform (presumably in the absence of the marking interaction, all other things being equal) does not help in these cases: the shadow would have remained uniform had the fence not fallen. Indeed most of the above cases fulfil this counterfactual requirement. Further, these cases are not ruled out by attempts to restrict the kinds of admissible properties by admitting only those which can be detected by physically possible detectors, since the relevant property here is shape, which certainly is detectable by physical detectors. So there does not seem to be any obvious way of answering this difficulty. Thus there are two separate classes of pseudo processes (in Kitcher's terminology, derivative marks and pseudomarks) which qualify as causal according to the MT principle.
CQ1. A causal process is a world line of an object which possesses a conserved quantity.
CQ2. A causal interaction is an intersection of world lines which involves exchange of a conserved quantity.A process is the world line of an object, regardless of whether or not it possesses any conserved quantities. A process can be either causal or non-causal (pseudo). A world line is the collection of points on a space-time (Minkowski) diagram which represents the history of an object. This means that processes are determinate regions, or ‘worms’, in space time. Such processes, or worms in space time, will normally be time-like; that is, every point on its world line lies in the future lightcone of the process' starting point.
An object is anything found in the ontology of science (such as particles, waves or fields), or common sense (such as chairs, buildings, or people). This will include non-causal objects such as spots and shadows. It is important to appreciate the difference between an object and a process. Loosely speaking, a process is the development over time of an object. Processes are usually extended in time.
Worms in space time which are not processes Kitcher calls ‘spatiotemporal junk’ (1989). Thus a representation on a space time diagram represents either a process or a piece of spatiotemporal junk, and a process is either a causal or a pseudo process. In a sense what counts as an object is unimportant; any old gerrymandered thing qualifies (except time-wise gerrymanders) (Dowe, 1995). In the case of a causal process what matters is whether the object possesses the right type of quantity. A shadow is an object but it does not possess the right type of conserved quantities; for example, a shadow cannot possess energy or momentum. It has other properties, such as shape, velocity, and position but possesses no conserved quantities. (The theory could be formulated in terms of objects: there are causal objects and pseudo objects. Causal objects are those which possess conserved quantities, pseudo objects are those which do not. Then a causal process is the world line of a causal object.)
A conserved quantity is any quantity which is universally conserved, and current scientific theory is our best guide as to what these are. For example, we have good reason to believe that mass-energy, linear momentum, and charge are conserved quantities.
An intersection is simply the overlapping in space time of two or more processes. The intersection occurs at the location consisting of all the space time points which are common to both (or all) processes. An exchange occurs when at least one incoming, and at least one outgoing process undergoes a change in the value of the conserved quantity, where ‘outgoing’ and ‘incoming’ are delineated on the space-time diagram by the forward and backward light cones, but are essentially interchangeable. The exchange is governed by the conservation law, which guarantees that it is a genuine causal interaction. It follows that an interaction can be of the form X, Y, l, or of a more complicated form.
‘Possesses’ is to be understood in the sense of ‘instantiates’. We suppose an object possesses energy if science attributes that quantity to that body. It does not matter whether that process transmits the quantity or not, nor whether the object keeps a constant amount of the quantity. It must simply be that the quantity may be truly predicated of the object.
Dowe (1992a, p. 127) had argued as follows: a spot or moving patch of illumination does not possess conserved quantities. A moving spot has other properties: speed, size, shape etc; but not conserved quantities such as energy or momentum. What possesses the energy which is "regularly appearing" is not the spot but a series of different patches of the wall. The spot and the patch of wall are not the same object. The patch of wall does not move. It does possess conserved quantities, its world line does constitute a causal process, and it is not capable of moving faster than the speed of light. The spot does move, but does not possess energy and is capable of moving faster than the speed of light. Therefore "whether or not an object possesses a conserved quantity" is an adequate criterion for distinguishing causal from pseudo processes.
Salmon (1994, p. 308) provides an ingenious counterexample to this account. He asks us to consider "the worldline of the part of the wall surface that is absorbing energy as a result of being illuminated". (1994, p. 308). This "gerrymandered" object is the aggregate of all the patches of wall that are sequentially illuminated, taken only for the time that they are currently being illuminated. Salmon argues that this object does possess energy over the relevant interval, but does not transmit energy. The implication is that the world line of this object is not a causal process, yet the object possesses energy; therefore we need to invoke the notion of transmission- possession is not enough. Salmon himself proposes a new theory which combines elements of his earlier account with elements of the conserved quantity theory).
In response to Salmon's objection Dowe introduces a further
condition: that an object wholly exists at a time (1995;
forthcoming). This allows him to say that objects have a primitive
identity over time. But, while this does rule out what Dowe calls
‘timewise gerrymanders’ (1995), it is unlikely to satisfy critics such
as Salmon because it seems to introduce into the theory an element
which is irreducibly hidden to empirical investigation.