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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
In this entry I consider different types of behaviorism. I outline reasons for and against being a behaviorist. I consider contributions of behaviorism to the study of behavior. Special attention is given to the so-called "radical behaviorism" of B. F. Skinner (1904-90).
(1) Psychology is the science of behavior. Psychology is not the science of mind.The three sets of claims are logically distinct. Moreover, taken independently, each helps to form a type of behaviorism. "Methodological" behaviorism is committed to the truth of (1). "Psychological" behaviorism is committed to the truth of (2). "Analytical" behaviorism (also known as "philosophical" or "logical" behaviorism) is committed to the truth of the statement in (3) that mental terms or concepts can and should be translated into behavioral concepts.
(2) Behavior can be described and explained without making reference to mental events or to internal psychological processes. The sources of behavior are external (in the environment), not internal (in the mind).
(3) In the course of theory development in psychology, if, somehow, mental terms or concepts are deployed in describing or explaining behavior, then either (a) these terms or concepts should be eliminated and replaced by behavioral terms or (b) they can and should be translated or paraphrased into behavioral concepts.
Other nomenclature is sometimes used to classify behaviorisms. Georges Rey (1997, p. 96), for example, classifies behaviorisms as methodological, analytical, and radical, where "radical" is Rey's term for what I am classifying as psychological behaviorism. I reserve the term "radical" for the psychological behaviorism of B. F. Skinner. Skinner employs the expression "radical behaviorism" to describe his brand of behaviorism or his philosophy of behaviorism (see Skinner 1976, p. 18). In my classification scheme, radical behaviorism is a sub-type of psychological behaviorism, primarily, although it combines all three types of behaviorism (methodological, analytical, and psychological).
Psychological behaviorism is a research program within psychology. It purports to explain human and animal behavior in terms of external physical stimuli, responses, learning histories, and (for certain types of behavior) reinforcements. Psychological behaviorism is present in the work of Ivan Pavlov (1849-1936), Edward Thorndike (1874-1949), as well as Watson. Its fullest and most influential expression is B. F. Skinner's (1904-90) work on schedules of reinforcement.
To illustrate, consider a food-deprived rat in an experimental chamber. If a particular movement, such as pressing a lever when a light is on, is followed by the presentation of food, then the likelihood of the rat's pressing the lever when hungry, again, and the light is on, is increased. Such presentations are reinforcements, such lights are (discriminative) stimuli, such lever pressings are responses, and such trials or associations are learning histories.
Analytical behaviorism is a theory within philosophy about the meaning or semantics of mental terms or concepts. It says that the very notion of a mental state or condition is the notion of a behavioral disposition or family of behavioral tendencies. When we attribute a belief to someone, for example, we are not saying that he or she is in a particular internal state or condition. Instead, we are characterizing the person in terms of what he or she might do in particular situations. Analytical behaviorism may be found in the work of Gilbert Ryle (1900-76) and the later work of Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889-51).
Analytical behaviorism helps to avoid substance dualism. Substance dualism is the doctrine that mental states take place in a special, non-physical mental substance (the immaterial mind). By contrast, for analytical behaviorism the belief that I have in, for example, arriving on time for a 2pm dental appointment, believing that I have a 2pm appointment, is not the property of a mental substance. Believing is a family of tendencies of my body. We cannot identify the belief independently of my arrival or other members of the family. So, we cannot treat it as the cause of the arrival.
Psychological behaviorism's historical roots consist, in part, in the classical associationism of the British Empiricists, foremost John Locke (1632-1704) and David Hume (1711-76). According to classical associationism, intelligent behavior is the product of associative learning. As a result of associations or pairings between perceptual experiences or stimulations on the one hand, and ideas or thoughts on the other, persons and animals acquire knowledge of their environment and how to act. Associations enable creatures to discover the causal structure of the world. Association is most helpfully viewed as the acquisition of knowledge about relations between events. Intelligence in behavior is a mark of such knowledge.
Classical associationism relied on introspectible entities, such as perceptual experiences or stimulations as the first links in associations, and thoughts or ideas as the second links. Psychological behaviorism, motivated by experimental interests, claims that to understand the origins of behavior, reference to stimulations (experiences) should be replaced by reference to stimuli (physical events in the environment), and that reference to thoughts or ideas should be eliminated or displaced in favor of reference to responses (overt behavior). Psychological behaviorism is associationism without appeal to mental events.
Don't human beings talk of introspectible entities even if these are not recognized by behaviorism? Psychological behaviorists regard the practice of talking about one's own states of mind, and of introspectively reporting those states, as potentially useful data in psychological experiments, but as not presupposing the metaphysical subjectivity or non-physical presence of those states. There are different sorts of causes behind introspective reports, and psychological behaviorists take these to be amenable to behavioral analysis. (See, by comparison, Dennett's method of heterophenomenology; Dennett 1991, pp. 72-81).
The task of psychological behaviorism is to specify types of association, understand how environmental events control behavior, discover and elucidate causal regularities or laws which govern the formation of associations, and predict how behavior will change as the environment changes. The word "conditioning" is commonly used to specify the process involved in acquiring new associations. Animals in so-called "operant" conditioning experiments are not learning to, for example, press levers. Instead, they are learning about the relationship between events in their environment, for example, that a particular behavior, pressing the lever, causes food to appear.
In its historical foundations, methodological behaviorism shares with analytical behaviorism the influence of positivism. One of the goals of positivism was to unify psychology with natural science. Watson wrote that "psychology as a behaviorist views it is a purely objective experimental branch of natural science. Its theoretical goal is . . . prediction and control" (1913, p. 158). Watson also wrote of the purpose of psychology as follows: "To predict, given the stimulus, what reaction will take place; or, given the reaction, state what the situation or stimulus is that has caused the reaction" (1930, p. 11).
Though logically distinct, methodological, psychological, and analytical behaviorisms often are found in one behaviorism. Skinner's radical behaviorism combines all three forms of behaviorism. It follows analytical strictures (at least loosely) in paraphrasing mental terms behaviorally, when or if they cannot be eliminated from explanatory discourse. In Verbal Behavior (1957) and elsewhere, Skinner tries to show how mental terms can be given behavioral interpretations. In About Behaviorism (1976) he says that when mental terminology cannot be eliminated it can be "translated into behavior" (p. 18, Skinner brackets the expression with his own double quotes).
Radical behaviorism is concerned with the behavior of organisms, not with internal processing. So, it is a form of methodological behaviorism. Finally, radical behaviorism understands behavior as a reflection of frequency effects among stimuli, which means that it is a form of psychological behaviorism.
Among psychologists behaviorism was even more popular than among philosophers. In addition to Pavlov, Skinner, Thorndike, and Watson, the list of behaviorists among psychologists included, among others, E. C. Tolman (1886-1959), C. L. Hull (1884-52), and E. R. Guthrie (1886-1959). Tolman, for example, wrote that "everything important in psychology . . . can be investigated in essence through the continued experimental and theoretical analysis of the determiners of rat behavior at a choice point in a maze" (1938, p. 34).
Behaviorists created journals, organized societies, and founded psychology graduate programs reflective of behaviorism. Behaviorists organized themselves into different types of research clusters, whose differences stemmed from such factors as varying approaches to conditioning and experimentation. Some clusters were named as follows: "the experimental analysis of behavior", "behavior analysis", "functional analysis", and, of course, "radical behaviorism". These labels sometimes were responsible for the titles of behaviorism's leading societies and journals, including the Society for the Advancement of Behavior Analysis (SABA), and the Journal of the Experimental Analysis of Behavior (begun in 1958) as well as the Journal of Applied Behavior Analysis (begun in 1968).
Behaviorism generated a type of therapy, known as behavior therapy (see Rimm and Masters 1974; Erwin 1978). It developed behavior management techniques for autistic children (see Lovaas and Newsom 1976) and token economies for the management of chronic schizophrenics (see Stahl and Leitenberg 1976). It fueled discussions of how best to understand the behavior of nonhuman animals, the relevance of laboratory study to the natural environmental occurrence of behavior, and whether there is built-in associative bias in learning (see Schwartz and Lacey 1982).
Behaviorism stumbled upon various critical difficulties with its commitments. One difficulty is confusion about the effects of reinforcement (see Gallistel 1990). In its original sense, a stimulus is a reinforcer only if its presentation increases the frequency of a response in a type of associative conditioning known as operant conditioning. A problem with this definition is that it defines reinforcers as stimuli that change behavior. The presentation of food, however, may have no observable effect on response frequency. It may, instead, be associated with an animal's ability to identify and remember temporal or spatial properties of the circumstances in which reinforcement occurs. This and other difficulties prompted changes in behaviorism's commitments and new directions of research. One recent and fresh direction has been the study of the role of short term memory in contributing to reinforcement effects on the so-called trajectory of behavior (see Killeen 1994).
Another stumbling block, in the case of analytical behaviorism, is the fact that the behavioral sentences that are intended to offer the behavioral paraphrases of mental terms almost always use mental terms themselves (see Chisholm 1957). In the example of my belief that I have a 2pm dental appointment, one must also speak of my desire to arrive at 2pm, otherwise the behavior of arriving at 2pm could not count as believing that I have a 2pm appointment. The term "desire" is a mental term. Critics have charged that we can never escape from using mental terms in the characterization of the meaning of mental terms. This suggests that mental discourse cannot be displaced by behavioral discourse. At least it cannot be displaced term-by-term. Perhaps analytical behaviorists need to paraphrase a whole swarm of mental terms at once (see Rey 1997, p. 154-5).
The first is epistemic. Warrant or evidence for saying that an animal or person is in a certain mental state, for example, possesses a certain belief, is grounded in behavior, understood as observable behavior. Moreover, the conceptual space between the claim that behavior warrants the attribution of belief and the claim that believing consists in behavior is a short and in some ways appealing step. If we look, for example, at how people are taught to use mental concepts and terms -- terms like "believe", "desire", and so on -- the conditions of use appear inseparably connected with behavioral tendencies in certain circumstances.
The second reason can be expressed as follows: One major difference between mentalistic (mental states in-the-head) and associationist or conditioning accounts of behavior is that mentalistic accounts tend to have a strong nativist bent. This is true even though there may be nothing inherently nativist about mentalistic accounts (see Cowie 1998).
Mentalistic accounts tend to assume, and sometimes even explicitly to embrace (see Fodor 1981), the hypothesis that the mind possesses at birth or innately a set of procedures or internally represented processing rules which are deployed when learning or acquiring new responses. Behaviorism, by contrast, is anti-nativist. Behaviorism, therefore, appeals to theorists who deny that there are innate rules by which organisms learn. To Skinner and Watson organisms learn without being innately or pre-experientially provided with explicit procedures by which to learn. Learning does not consist in rule-governed behavior. Learning is what organisms do in response to stimuli. A behaviorist organism learns, as it were, from its successes and mistakes. (See Dennett 1978).
Much contemporary work in cognitive science on the set of models known as connectionist or parallel distributed processing (PDP) models seems to share behaviorism's anti-nativism about learning. PDP takes an approach to learning which is response oriented rather than rule-governed and this is because, like behaviorism, it has roots in associationism (see Bechtel 1985; compare Graham 1991 with Maloney 1991). Whether PDP models ultimately are or must be anti-nativist depends upon what counts as native or innate rules (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 1991, pp. 103-105).
The third reason for behaviorism's appeal, popular at least historically, is related to its disdain for reference to inner mental or information processing as a means to explain behavior. The disdain is most vigorously exemplified in the work of Skinner. Skinner's skepticism about explanatory references to mental innerness may be expressed as follows.
Behavior must be explained in terms which do not themselves presuppose the very thing that is explained. This is behavior. The outside (public) behavior of a person is not accounted for by referring to the inside (inner processing) behavior of the person (say, his or her internal problem solving or thinking) if, therein, the behavior of the person is unexplained. "The objection," wrote Skinner, "to inner states is not that they do not exist, but that they are not relevant in a functional analysis" (Skinner 1953, p. 35). ‘Not relevant’ means, for Skinner, explanatorily circular or regressive.
Skinner charges that since mental activity is a form of behavior (albeit inner), the only non-regressive, non-circular way to explain behavior is to appeal to something non-behavioral. This non-behavioral something is environmental stimuli and an organism's interactions with, and reinforcement from, the environment.
So, the third reason for behaviorism's appeal is that it tries to avoid circular, regressive explanations of behavior. It aims to refrain from accounting for one type of behavior (overt) in terms of another type of behavior (covert), all the while, in some sense, leaving behavior unexplained.
It should be noted that Skinner's views about explanation are particularly extreme (scientifically naive?), and that many who called themselves behaviorists including Guthrie, Tolman, and Hull, or continue to work within the tradition, broadly understood, including Killeen (1987) and Rescorla (1990), take exception to much that Skinner has said about explanatory references to innerness. It should also be noted that Skinner's derisive attitude towards explanatory references to mental innerness stems, in part, from his conviction that if the language of psychology is permitted to refer to internal processing in its explanations of behavior, this goes some way towards permitting talk of immaterial mental substances, agents endowed with contra-causal free will, and little persons (homunculi) within bodies, each of which Skinner takes to be incompatible with a scientific worldview (see Skinner 1971). Finally, it must be emphasized that Skinner's aversion to explanatory references to innerness is not an aversion to inner states or processes per se. Skinner countenances talk of inner events provided that they are treated in the same manner as public responses. "An adequate science of behavior," he wrote, "must consider events taking place within the skin of the organism . . . as part of behavior itself" (1984, p. 617).
This last point is worth additional discussion, since the failure to appreciate Skinner's willingness to talk of inner events has helped to produce confusion in understanding his attitude towards the mental. Skinner does not deny the existence of events such as thinking and perceiving or various other events which he sometimes classifies as mental or inner. True, it is hard to know what Skinner counts as inner, or mental, and why, especially given that he sometimes uses terms like ‘inner’ and ‘mental’ as epithets of dismissal. However, set against Skinner's derision of the mental is his persistent reminder that people think, perceive and therein respond beneath their skin. So, Skinner pictures inner events as follows.
Inner events are those about which we may make introspective reports (and thus they are private, observationally), but their causal explanatory force is idle. Because inner events are private observationally, their patterns of reinforcement are more elusive, less easy to deliberately regulate, than overt behavior. However, inner events are responses, ultimately, to environmental stimuli.
One remarkable feature of human behavior which Skinner deliberately rejects is that people creatively make their own environments (see Chomsky 1971, Black 1973). The world is as it is, in part, because we make it that way. Skinner protests that "it is in the nature of an experimental analysis of human behavior that it should strip away the functions previously assigned to autonomous man and transfer them one by one to the controlling environment" (1971, p. 198).
Critics have raised several objections to the Skinnerian social picture. One of the most persuasive, and certainly one of the most frequent, adverts to Skinner's vision of the ideal human society. It is a question asked of the fictional founder of Walden Two, Frazier, by the philosopher Castle. It is the question of what is the best social mode of existence for a human being. Frazier's, and therein Skinner's, response to this question is both too general and incomplete. Frazier/Skinner speaks of the values of health, friendship, relaxation, rest, and so forth. However, these values are hardly the detailed basis of a social system.
There is a notorious problem in social theory of specifying the appropriate level of detail at which a blueprint for a new and ideal society must be presented (see Arnold 1990, pp. 4-10). Skinner identifies the behavioristic principles and learning incentives that he hopes will reduce systematic injustices in social systems. He also describes a few practices (concerning child rearing and the like) that are intended to contribute to human happiness. However he offers only the haziest descriptions of the daily lives of Walden Two citizens and no suggestions for how best to resolve disputes about alternative ways of life that are prima facie consistent with behaviorist principles (see Kane 1996, p. 203). He gives little or no serious attention to the crucial general problem of inter-personal conflict resolution and to the role of institutional arrangements in resolving conflicts.
In an essay which appeared in The Behavior Analyst (1985), nearly forty years after the publication of Walden Two, Skinner, in the guise of Frazier, tried to clarify his characterization of ideal human circumstances. He wrote that in the ideal human society "people just naturally do the things they need to do to maintain themselves . . . and treat each other well, and they just naturally do a hundred other things they enjoy doing because they do not have to do them" (p. 9). However, of course, doing a hundred things humans enjoy doing means only that Walden Two is vaguely defined, not that its culturally instituted habits and the character of its institutions merit emulation.
The incompleteness of Skinner's description of the ideal human society or life is so widely acknowledged that one might wonder if actual experiments in Walden Two living could lend useful detail to his blueprint. At least two such experiments have been and are being conducted, one in Virginia, the other in Mexico. Both can be indirectly explored via the Internet (see Other Internet Resources).
Remnants of behaviorism survive in both behavior therapy and laboratory-based animal learning theory. In the metaphysics of mind, too, behavioristic themes survive in the approach to mind known as functionalism. Functionalism defines states of mind as states that play particular causal-functional roles in animals or systems in which they occur. Paul Churchland writes of functionalism as follows: "The essential or defining feature of any type of mental states is the set of causal relations it bears to . . . bodily behavior (1984, p. 36). This functionalist notion is similiar to the behaviorist idea that reference to behavior and to stimulus/response relations enters centrally and essentially into any account of what it means for a creature to behave or to be subject, in the scheme of analytical behaviorism, to the attribution of mental states.
Remnants, however, are remnants. Behaviorism has lost strength and influence. Why?
The deepest and most complex reason for behaviorism's demise is its commitment to the thesis that behavior can be explained without reference to mental activity. Many philosophers and psychologists find this thesis hopelessly restrictive. They reject behaviorism because of it. At the lunch table, for instance, I recognize a situation in which I am presented with apples as a situation in which I am presented with apples and I form concepts of apples, sort apples into classes (e.g. ripe and unripe), and draw upon those classifications as the situation permits, eating a ripe apple and avoiding unripe apples. Recognizing, conceptually sorting, and drawing upon are information processing activities which take place inside my head -- in my mind. These events are not (overt) behavior, although they may be revealed or expressed in behavior and reference to them helps to explain behavior.
To illustrate the explanatory counter-intuitiveness of restricting psychology to outside-the-head environmental histories, suppose that one morning Mother Nature throws a lightening bolt at a swamp and that, in the consequent chemical reaction, a creature appears in the swamp that is a molecule-for-molecule duplicate of some actual human being -- me, say. Should Swamp Me step out of the swamp, as I would step out of the swamp?
Since Swamp Me is an exact physical duplicate of me, whatever physical stimulus is applied, we may think, he should react to the stimulus in the same manner that I would, and produce exactly the same response. We should picture him as possessing my behavioral tendencies before his first behavioral response. Is this picture compatible with behaviorism?
At the very least, the expectation that Swamp Me behaves just as I would is prima facie incompatible with behaviorism. This is because Swamp Me has no environmental history. He has not been reinforced for anything.
Alternatively, one might reply that Swamp Me shares in my behavioral tendencies by virtue of being my physical duplicate. For an organism to have a behavioral disposition, it shouldn't be necessary for the organism to have its own learning history. What is at least equally sufficient is what is encoded or stored in its head. It must have a record of a learning history embedded in its brain or central nervous system. One need not insist that this is the organism's own history. Swamp Me may act just as I would act, however this is only because it ‘remembers’ certain behaviors and reinforcement for those behaviors.
This sort of reply seems pretty obvious. However, one might wonder whether it is compatible with behaviorism. Here's why.
The memory-in-the-head model of Swamp Me seems not be a behaviorist theory, as behaviorists have expressed their theories. Instead, it is close to a non-behaviorist account of the significance of having a reinforcement history, where what matters is the internal record, and not what occurs in the world (the history).
The critical question is what counts as a record of a reinforcement history. Many psychologists despair of describing what counts as a record without postulating internal memory states and internal processing over those states (see Roediger and Goff 1998). Because memory states serve to record past experiences and reinforcements, and serve referentially to stand for stimulus conditions which the organism remembers, they are commonly described as internal mental representations. Talk of internal mental representation, however, is a perspective from which behaviorism -- at least of Skinner and other traditional behaviorists -- has wished to depart.
One defining feature of traditional behaviorism is that it tried to free psychology from having to theorize about how animals and persons represent their environment. This was important, historically, because it seemed that behavior/environment connections are a lot clearer and more manageable experimentally than internal representations. Unfortunately, for behaviorism, it's hard to imagine a more restrictive rule for psychology than a rule which prohibits hypotheses about representational storage and processing. Stich, for example, complains against Skinner that "we now have an enormous collection of experimental data which, it would seem, simply cannot be made sense of unless we postulate something like" information processing mechanisms in the heads of organisms (1998, p. 649).
A second reason for rejecting behaviorism is that some features of mentality -- some elements in the inner processing of persons -- have characteristic ‘feels’ or sensory or phenomenal qualities. To be in pain, for example, is not merely to produce appropriate pain behavior under the right environmental circumstances, it is to experience a ‘like-thisness’ to the pain (as something dull or sharp, perhaps). Behaviorist creatures may engage in pain behavior, including beneath the skin pain responses, yet completely lack whatever is qualitatively definitive of pain (its feel). (See also Graham 1998, pp. 47-51.; Graham and Horgan 2000).
Feels, or qualia, as they also are called, are difficult for behaviorism because feels subjectively are present in experience, but resist behavioral analysis or description. The philosopher-psychologist U. T. Place (2000), although otherwise sympathetic to applications of behaviorism to matters of mind, argued that qualia cannot be analyzed in behaviorist terms. He noted that qualia are not behavior or dispositions to behave. "They make themselves felt," he said, "from the very moment that the experience of whose qualia they are" comes into existence (p. 191). They are bearers of dispositions to behave rather than dispositions or forms of behavior itself. (See also Place 1999.) Indeed, it is tempting to postulate that feels affect non-qualitative elements of internal processing, and that they, for example, contribute to arousal, attention, and receptivity to associative conditioning.
The third reason for rejecting behaviorism is connected with Noam Chomsky. Chomsky has been one of behaviorism's most successful and damaging critics. In a review of Skinner's book on verbal behavior (see above), Chomsky (1959) argued that some behavior (linguistic behavior, in particular) has to be understood in terms of internally represented rules. These rules are not products of learned associations. They are part of our native psychological endowment as human beings. Chomsky charged that behaviorist models of language learning cannot explain various facts about language acquisition, such as the rapid acquisition of language by young children, which is sometimes referred to as the phenomenon of "lexical explosion". A child's linguistic abilities appear to be radically under-determined by the evidence of verbal behavior offered to the child in the short period in which he or she acquires those abilities. By the age of four or five (normal) children have an almost limitless capacity to understand and produce sentences which they have never heard before. The basic rules or principles of grammar, therefore, argues Chomsky, must be innate.
The problem to which Chomsky refers, which is the problem of behavioral capacities outstripping individual learning histories, seems to go beyond merely the issue of linguistic behavior in young children. It appears to be a fundamental fact about human beings that our sensitivities and behavioral capacities often surpass the limitations of our individual learning histories. Our history of reinforcement often is too impoverished to determine uniquely our behavior. Much learning, therefore, seems to require pre-existing or innate representational structures within which learning occurs. (See also Brewer 1974, but compare with Bates et al. 1998 and Cowie 1998).
More than a decade earlier, in 1966 Hempel announced his defection from behaviorism:
In order to characterize . . . behavioral patterns, propensities, or capacities . . . we need not only a suitable behavioristic vocabulary, but psychological terms as well. (p. 110)Hempel had come to believe that it is a mistake to imagine that human behavior can be understood exclusively in non-mental, behavioristic terms.
Contemporary philosophy and psychology largely share Hempel's conviction that the explanation of behavior cannot omit invoking a creature's representation of its world. Psychology must use psychological terms. Behavior without representation is blind. Psychological theorizing without reference to internal processing is explanatorily impaired. Behaviorism, not cognitive science or psychology, offers a misleading account of what is inside the head.