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Aristotle's logic, especially his theory of the syllogism, has had an
unparalleled influence on the history of Western thought. It did not
always hold this position: in the Hellenistic period, Stoic logic,
and in particular the work of Chrysippus, was much more celebrated.
However, in later antiquity, following the work of Aristotelian
Commentators, Aristotle's logic became dominant, and Aristotelian
logic was what was transmitted to the Arabic and the Latin medieval
traditions, while the works of Chrysippus have not survived.
This unique historical position has not always contributed to the
understanding of Aristotle's logical works. Kant thought that
Aristotle had discovered everything there was to know about logic,
and the historian of logic Prantl drew the corollary that any
logician after Aristotle who said anything new was confused, stupid,
or perverse. During the rise of modern formal logic following Frege
and Peirce, adherents of Traditional Logic (seen as the descendant of
Aristotelian Logic) and the new mathematical logic tended to see one
another as rivals, with incompatible notions of logic. More recent
scholarship has often applied the very techniques of mathematical
logic to Aristotle's theories, revealing (in the opinion of many) a
number of similarities of approach and interest between Aristotle and
This article is written from the latter perspective. As such, it is
about Aristotle's logic, which is not always the same thing as what
has been called "Aristotelian" logic.
[A More Detailed Table of Contents]
Aristotle's logical works contain the earliest formal study of logic
that we have. It is therefore all the more remarkable that together
they comprise a highly developed logical theory, one that was able to
command immense respect for many centuries: Kant, who was ten times
more distant from Aristotle than we are from him, even held that
nothing significant had been added to Aristotle's views in the
intervening two millennia.
In the last century, Aristotle's reputation as a logician has
undergone two remarkable reversals. The rise of modern formal logic
following the work of Frege and Russell brought with it a recognition
of the many serious limitations of Aristotle's logic; today, very few
would try to maintain that it is adequate as a basis for
understanding science, mathematics, or even everyday reasoning. At
the same time, scholars trained in modern formal techniques have come
to view Aristotle with new respect, not so much for the correctness
of his results as for the remarkable similarity in spirit between
much of his work and modern logic. As Jonathan Lear has put it,
"Aristotle shares with modern logicians a fundamental interest
in metatheory": his primary goal is not to offer a practical
guide to argumentation but to study the properties of inferential
The ancient commentators grouped together several of Aristotle's
treatises under the title Organon ("Instrument")
and regarded them as comprising his logical works:
In fact, the title Organon reflects a much later controversy
about whether logic is a part of philosophy (as the Stoics
maintained) or merely a tool used by philosophy (as the later
Peripatetics thought); calling the logical works "The
Instrument" is a way of taking sides on this point. Aristotle
himself never uses this term, nor does he give much indication that
these particular treatises form some kind of group, though there are
frequent cross-references between the Topics and the
Analytics. On the other hand, Aristotle treats the
Prior and Posterior Analytics as one work, and On
Sophistical Refutations is a final section, or an appendix, to
the Topics). To these works should be added the
Rhetoric, which explicitly declares its reliance on the
All Aristotle's logic revolves around one notion: the
deduction (sullogismos). A thorough explanation of what a
deduction is, and what they are composed of, will
necessarily lead us through the whole of his theory. What, then, is
a deduction? Aristotle says:
- On Interpretation
- Prior Analytics
- Posterior Analytics
- On Sophistical Refutations
A deduction is speech (logos) in which,
certain things having been supposed, something different
from those supposed
results of necessity because of their being so.
(Prior Analytics I.2, 24b18-20)
Each of the "things supposed" is a premise
(protasis) of the argument, and what "results of
necessity" is the conclusion (sumperasma).
The core of this definition is the notion of "resulting of
necessity" (ex anankês sumbainein). This
corresponds to a modern notion of logical consequence: X results of
necessity from Y and Z if it would be impossible for X to be false when Y and Z
are true. We could therefore take this to be a general definition of
Deductions are one of two species of argument recognized by
Aristotle. The other species is induction
(epagôgê). He has far less to say about this than
deduction, doing little more than characterize it as "argument
from the particular to the universal". However, induction (or
something very much like it) plays a crucial role in the theory of
scientific knowledge in the Posterior Analytics: it is
induction, or at any rate a cognitive process that moves from
particulars to their generalizations, that is the basis of knowledge
of the indemonstrable first principles of sciences.
Despite its wide generality, Aristotle's definition of deduction is
not a precise match for a modern definition of validity. Some of the
differences may have important consequences:
Of these three possible restrictions, the most interesting would be
the third. This could be (and has been) interpreted as committing
Aristotle to something like a
relevance logic. In fact, there
are passages that appear to confirm this. However, this is too
complex a matter to discuss here.
Aristotle explicitly says that what results of necessity must be
different from what is supposed. This would rule out arguments in
which the conclusion is identical to one of the premises. Modern
notions of validity regard such arguments as valid, though
The plural "certain things having been supposed" was
taken by some ancient commentators to rule out arguments with only
The force of the qualification "because of their being
so" has sometimes been seen as ruling out arguments in
which the conclusion is not ‘relevant’ to the premises,
e.g., arguments in which the premises are inconsistent, arguments
with conclusions that would follow from any premises whatsoever,
or arguments with superfluous premises.
However the definition is interpreted, it is clear that Aristotle
does not mean to restrict it only to a subset of the valid arguments.
This is why I have translated sullogismos with ‘deduction’
rather than its English cognate. In modern usage,
‘syllogism’ means an argument of a very specific form.
Moreover, modern usage distinguishes between valid syllogisms (the
conclusions of which follow from their premises) and invalid
syllogisms (the conclusions of which do not follow from their
premises). The second of these is inconsistent with Aristotle's use:
since he defines a sullogismos as an argument in which the
conclusion results of necessity from the premises, "invalid
sullogismos" is a contradiction in terms. The first is
also at least highly misleading, since Aristotle does not appear to
think that the sullogismoi are simply an interesting subset of
the valid arguments. Moreover (see below), Aristotle expends great
efforts to argue that every valid argument, in a broad sense, can be
"reduced" to an argument, or series of arguments, in
something like one of the forms traditionally called a syllogism. If
we translate sullogismos as "syllogism, ", this
becomes the trivial claim "Every syllogism is a syllogism",
Syllogisms are structures of sentences each of which can meaningfully
be called true or false: assertions (apophanseis), in
Aristotle's terminology. According to Aristotle, every such sentence
must have the same structure: it must contain a subject
(hupokeimenon) and a predicate and must either affirm
or deny the predicate of the subject. Thus, every assertion is
either the affirmation kataphasis or the denial
(apophasis) of a single predicate of a single subject.
In On Interpretation, Aristotle argues that a single
assertion must always either affirm or deny a single predicate of a
single subject. Thus, he does not recognize sentential compounds,
such as conjunctions and disjunctions, as single assertions. This
appears to be a deliberate choice on his part: he argues, for
instance, that a conjunction is simply a collection of assertions,
with no more intrinsic unity than the sequence of sentences in a
lengthy account (e.g. the entire Iliad, to take Aristotle's
own example). Since he also treats denials as one of the two basic
species of assertion, he does not view negations as sentential
compounds. His treatment of conditional sentences and disjunctions is
more difficult to appraise, but it is at any rate clear that
Aristotle made no efforts to develop a sentential logic. Some of the
consequences of this for his theory of demonstration are important.
Subjects and predicates of assertions are terms. A term
(horos) can be either individual, e.g. Socrates,
Plato or universal, e.g. human, horse,
animal, white. Subjects may be either individual or
universal, but predicates can only be universals: Socrates is
human, Plato is not a horse, horses are animals,
humans are not horses.
The word universal (katholou)appears to be an
Aristotelian coinage. Literally, it means "of a whole"; its
opposite is therefore "of a particular" (kath'
hekaston). Universal terms are those which can properly serve as
predicates, while particular terms are those which cannot.
This distinction is not simply a matter of grammatical function. We
can readily enough construct a sentence with "Socrates" as
its grammatical predicate: "The person sitting down is
Socrates". Aristotle, however, does not consider this a genuine
predication. He calls it instead a merely accidental or
incidental (kata sumbebêkos) predication. Such
sentences are, for him, dependent for their truth values on other
genuine predications (in this case, "Socrates is sitting
Consequently, predication for Aristotle is as much a matter of
metaphysics as a matter of grammar. The reason that the term
Socrates is an individual term and not a universal is that the
entity which it designates is an individual, not a universal. What
makes white and human universal terms is that they
Further discussion of these issues can be found in the entry on
Aristotle takes some pains in On Interpretation to argue that
to every affirmation there corresponds exactly one denial such that
that denial denies exactly what that affirmation affirms. The pair
consisting of an affirmation and its corresponding denial is a
contradiction (antiphasis). In general, Aristotle
holds, exactly one member of any contradiction is true and one false:
they cannot both be true, and they cannot both be false. However, he
appears to make an exception for propositions about future events,
though interpreters have debated extensively what this exception
might be (see further discussion below).
The principle that contradictories cannot both be true has
fundamental importance in Aristotle's metaphysics (see
further discussion below).
One major difference between Aristotle's understanding of predication
and modern (i.e. post-Fregean) logic is that Aristotle treats
individual predications and general predications as similar in
logical form: he gives the same analysis to "Socrates is an
animal" and "Humans are animals". However, he notes
that when the subject is a universal, predication takes on two forms:
it can be either universal or particular. These
expressions are parallel to those with which Aristotle distinguishes
universal and particular terms, and Aristotle is aware of that,
explicitly distinguishing between a term being a universal and a term
being universally predicated of another.
Whatever is affirmed or denied of a universal subject may be
affirmed or denied of it it universally (katholou or
"of all", kata pantos), in part (kata
meros, en merei). or indefinitely
In On Interpretation, Aristotle spells out the relationships of
contradiction for sentences with universal subjects as follows:
||P affirmed of all of S
||Every S is P, All S is (are) P
||P denied of all of S
||No S is P
||P affirmed of some of S
||Some S is (are) P
||P denied of some of S
||Some S is not P, Not every S is P
||P affirmed of S
||S is P
||P denied of S
||S is not P
Simple as it appears, this table raises important difficulties of
interpretation (for a thorough discussion, see the entry on the
Square of Opposition).
||Every A is B
||No A is B
||Some A is B
||Not every A is B
In the Prior Analytics, Aristotle adopts a somewhat
artificial way of expressing predications: instead of saying "X
is predicated of Y" he says "Y belongs (huparchei)
to X". This should really be regarded as a technical
expression. The verb huparchein usually means either
"begin" or "exist, be present", and Aristotle's
usage appears to be a development of this latter use.
For clarity and brevity, I will use the following semi-traditional
abbreviations for Aristotelian categorical sentences (note that the
predicate term comes first and the subject term
Aristotle's most famous achievement as logician is his theory of
inference, traditionally called the syllogistic (though not by
Aristotle). That theory is in fact the theory of inferences of a
very specific sort: inferences with two premises, each of which is a
categorical sentence, having exactly one term in common, and having
as conclusion a categorical sentence the terms of which are just
those two terms not shared by the premises. Aristotle calls the term
shared by the premises the middle term (meson) and each
of the other two terms in the premises an extreme
(akron). The middle term must be either subject or predicate
of each premise, and this can occur in three ways: the middle term
can be the subject of one premise and the predicate of the other, the
predicate of both premises, or the subject of both premises.
Aristotle refers to these term arrangements as figures
|Aab||a belongs to all b (Every b is a)
|Eab||a belongs to no b (No b is a)
|Iab||a belongs to some b (Some b is a)
|Oab||a does not belong to all b (Some b is not a)
Aristotle calls the term which is the predicate of the conclusion
the major term and the term which is the subject of the
conclusion the minor term. The premise containing the major
term is the major premise, and the premise containing the
minor term is the minor premise.
Aristotle's procedure is then a systematic investigation of the
possible combinations of premises in each of the three figures. For
each combination, he seeks either to demonstrate that some conclusion
necessarily follows or to demonstrate that no conclusion follows.
The results he states are exactly correct.
Aristotle shows each valid form to be valid by showing how to
construct a deduction of its conclusion from its premises. These
deductions, in turn, can take one of two forms: direct or
probative (deiktikos) deductions and deductions
through the impossible (dia to adunaton).
A direct deduction is a series of steps leading from the premises to
the conclusion, each of which is either a conversion of a
previous step or an inference from two previous steps relying on a
first-figure deduction. Conversion, in turn, is inferring from a
proposition another which has the subject and predicate interchanged.
Specifically, Aristotle argues that three such conversions are sound:
He undertakes to justify these in An. Pr. I.2. From a modern
standpoint, the third is sometimes regarded with suspicion. Using it
we can get Some monsters are chimeras from the apparently true
All chimeras are monsters; but the former is often construed
as implying in turn There is something which is a monster and a
chimera, and thus that there are monsters and there are chimeras.
In fact, this simply points up something about Aristotle's system:
Aristotle in effect supposes that all terms in syllogisms are
non-empty. (For further discussion of this point, see the entry on the
Square of Opposition).
- Eab → Eba
- Iab → Iba
- Aab → Iba
As an example of the procedure, we may take Aristotle's proof of
Camestres. He says:
If M belongs to every N but to no X, then neither will N belong to
any X. For if M belongs to no X, then neither does X belong to any
M; but M belonged to every N; therefore, N will belong to no M (for
the first figure has come about). And since the privative converts,
neither will N belong to any X. (An. Pr. I.5, 27a9-12)
From this text, we can extract an exact formal proof, as follows:
Aristotle proves invalidity by constructing counterexamples. This is
very much in the spirit of modern logical theory: all that it takes
to show that a certain form is invalid is a single
instance of that form with true premises and a false
conclusion. However, Aristotle states his results not by saying that
certain premise-conclusion combinations are invalid but by saying
that certain premise pairs do not "syllogize": that is,
that, given the pair in question, examples can be constructed in
which premises of that form are true and a conclusion of any of the
four possible forms is false.
||If M belongs to every N
||but to no X,
|To prove: NeX
||then neither will N belong to any X.
||For if M belongs to no X,
||(3, conversion of e)
||then neither does X belong to any M;
||but M belonged to every N;
||(4, 5, Celarent)
||therefore, X will belong to no N (for the
first figure has come about).
||(6, conversion of e)
||And since the privative converts, neither will
N belong to any X.
When possible, he does this by a clever and economical method: he
gives two triplets of terms, one of which makes the premises true and
a universal affirmative "conclusion" true, and the other of
which makes the premises true and a universal negative
"conclusion" true. The first is a counterexample for an
argument with either an E or an O conclusion, and the second is a
counterexample for an argument with either an A or an I conclusion.
In Prior Analytics I.4-6, Aristotle shows that the premise
combinations given in the following table yield deductions and that
all other premise combinations fail to yield a deduction. in the
terminology traditional since the middle ages, each of these
combinations is known as a mood (from Latin modus,
"way", which in turn is a translation of Greek
tropos). Aristotle, however, does not use this expression and
instead refers to "the arguments in the figures".
In this table,
separates premises from conclusion; it may be read
"therefore". The second column lists the medieval mnemonic
name associated with the inference (these are still widely used, and
each is actually a mnemonic for Aristotle's proof of the mood in
question). The third column briefly summarizes Aristotle's procedure
for demonstrating the deduction.
Table of the Deductions in the Figures
Having established which deductions in the figures are possible,
Aristotle draws a number of metatheoretical conclusions, including:
|Aab, Abc Aac
|Eab, Abc Eac
|Aab, Ibc Iac
||Perfect; also by impossibility, from Camestres
|Eab, Ibc Oac
||Perfect; also by impossibility, from Cesare
|Eab, Aac Ebc
||(Eab, Aac)→(Eba, Aac)CelEbc
|Aab, Eac Ebc
||(Aab, Eac)→(Aab, Eca)=(Eca, Aab)CelEcb→Ebc
|Eab, Iac Obc
||(Eab, Iac)→(Eba, Iac)FerObc
|Aab, Oac Obc
||(Aab, Oac +Abc)Bar(Aac, Oac)ImpObc
|Aac, Abc Iab
||(Aac, Abc)→(Aac, Icb)DarIab
|Eac, Abc Oab
||(Eac, Abc)→(Eac, Icb)FerOab
|Iac, Abc Iab
||(Iac, Abc)→(Ica, Abc)=(Abc, Ica)DarIba→Iab
|Aac, Ibc Iab
||(Aac, Ibc)→(Aac, Icb)DarIab
|Oac, Abc Oab
||(Oac, +Aab, Abc)Bar(Aac, Oac)ImpOab
|Eac, Ibc Oab
||(Eac, Ibc)→(Eac, Icb)FerOab
He also proves the following metatheorem:
- No deduction has two negative premises
- No deduction has two particular premises
- A deduction with an affirmative conclusion must have two
- A deduction with a negative conclusion must have one negative
- A deduction with a universal conclusion must have two universal
All deductions can be reduced to the two universal deductions in
the first figure.
His proof of this is elegant. First, he shows that the two
particular deductions of the first figure can be reduced, by proof
through impossibility, to the universal deductions in the second
He then observes that since he has already shown how to reduce all
the particular deductions in the other figures except Baroco and
Bocardo to Darii and Ferio, these deductions can thus
be reduced to Barbara and Celarent. This proof is
strikingly similar both in structure and in subject to modern proofs
of the redundancy of axioms in a system.
Many more metatheoretical results, some of them quite
sophisticated, are proved in Prior Analytics I.45 and in
Prior Analytics II. As noted below, some of Aristotle's
metatheoretical results are appealed to in the epistemological
arguments of the Posterior Analytics.
Aristotle follows his treatment of "arguments in the
figures" with a much longer, and much more problematic,
discussion of what happens to these figured arguments when we add the
qualifications "necessarily" and "possibly" to
their premises in various ways. In contrast to the syllogistic
itself (or, as commentators like to call it, the assertoric
syllogistic), this modal syllogistic appears to be much less
satisfactory and is certainly far more difficult to interpret. Here,
I only outline Aristotle's treatment of this subject and note some of
the principal points of interpretive controversy.
The Definitions of the Modalities
Modern modal logic treats necessity and possibility as
interdefinable: "necessarily P" is equivalent to "not
possibly not P", and "possibly P" to "not
necessarily not P". Aristotle gives these same equivalences in
On Interpretation. However, in Prior Analytics, he
makes a distinction between two notions of possibility. On the first,
which he takes as his preferred notion, "possibly P" is
equivalent to "not necessarily P and not necessarily not
P". He then acknowledges an alternative definition of
possibility according to the modern equivalence, but this plays only
a secondary role in his system.
Aristotle's General Approach
Aristotle builds his treatment of modal syllogisms on his account of
non-modal (assertoric) syllogisms: he works his way through
the syllogisms he has already proved and considers the consequences
of adding a modal qualification to one or both premises. Most often,
then, the questions he explores have the form: "Here is an
assertoric syllogism; if I add these modal qualifications to the
premises, then what modally qualified form of the conclusion (if any)
follows?". A premise can have one of three modalities: it can
be necessary, possible, or assertoric. Aristotle works through the
combinations of these in order:
Though he generally considers only premise combinations which
syllogize in their assertoric forms, he does sometimes extend this;
similarly, he sometimes considers conclusions in addition to those
which would follow from purely assertoric premises.
- Two necessary premises
- One necessary and one assertoric premise
- Two possible premises
- One assertoric and one possible premise
- One necessary and one possible premise
Since this is his procedure, it is convenient to describe modal
syllogisms in terms of the corresponding non-modal syllogism plus a
triplet of letters indicating the modalities of premises and
conclusion: N = "necessary", P = "possible", A =
"assertoric". Thus, "Barbara NAN" would mean
"The form Barbara with necessary major premise,
assertoric minor premise, and necessary conclusion". I use the
letters "N" and "P" as prefixes for premises as
well; a premise with no prefix is assertoric. Thus, Barbara
NAN would be NAab, Abc,
As in the case of assertoric syllogisms, Aristotle makes use of
conversion rules to prove validity. The conversion rules for
necessary premises are exactly analogous to those for assertoric
Possible premises behave differently, however. Since he defines
"possible" as "neither necessary nor impossible",
it turns out that x is possibly F entails, and is entailed by,
x is possibly not F. Aristotle generalizes this to the case
of categorical sentences as follows:
In addition, Aristotle uses the intermodal principle
N→A: that is, a necessary premise
entails the corresponding assertoric one. However, because of his
definition of possibility, the principle
does not generally hold: if it did, then
N→P would hold, but on his definition
"necessarily P" and "possibly P" are actually
inconsistent ("possibly P" entails "possibly not
This leads to a further complication. The denial of "possibly
P" for Aristotle is "either necessarily P or necessarily
not P". The denial of "necessarily P" is still more
difficult to express in terms of a combination of modalities:
"either possibly P (and thus possibly not P) or necessarily not
P" This is important because of Aristotle's proof procedures,
which include proof through impossibility. If we give a proof
through impossibility in which we assume a necessary premise, then
the conclusion we ultimately establish is simply the denial of that
necessary premise, not a "possible" conclusion in
Aristotle's sense. Such propositions do occur in his system, but
only in exactly this way, i.e. as conclusions established by proof
through impossiblity from necessary assumptions. Somewhat
confusingly, Aristotle calls such propositions "possible"
but immediately adds " not in the sense defined": in this
sense, "possibly Oab" is simply the denial of
"necessarily Aab". Such propositions appear only as
premises, never as conclusions.
Syllogisms with Necessary Premises
Aristotle holds that an assertoric syllogism remains valid if
"necessarily" is added to its premises and its conclusion:
the modal pattern NNN is always valid. He does not treat this as a
trivial consequence but instead offers proofs; in all but two cases,
these are parallel to those offered for the assertoric case. The
exceptions are Baroco and Bocardo, which he proved in
the assertoric case through impossibility: attempting to use that
method here would require him to take the denial of a necessary O
proposition as hypothesis, raising the complication noted above, and he
must resort to a different form of proof instead.
NA/AN Combinations: The Problem of the "Two Barbaras" and Other Difficulties
Since a necessary premise entails an assertoric premise, every AN or
NA combination of premises will entail the corresponding AA pair, and
thus the corresponding A conclusion. Thus, ANA and NAA syllogisms
are always valid. However, Aristotle holds that some, but not all,
ANN and NAN combinations are valid. Specifically, he accepts
Barbara NAN but rejects Barbara ANN. Almost from
Aristotle's own time, interpreters have found his reasons for this
distinction obscure, or unpersuasive, or both. Theophrastus, for
instance, adopted the simpler rule that the modality of the
conclusion of a syllogism was always the "weakest" modality
found in either premise, where N is stronger than A and A is stronger
than P (and where P probably has to be defined as "not
necessarily not"). Other difficulties follow from the problem
of the "Two Barbaras", as it is often called, and it has
often been maintained that the modal syllogistic is inconsistent.
This subject quickly becomes too complex for summarizing in this
brief article. For further discussion, see Becker, McCall,
Patterson, van Rijen, Striker, Nortmann, Thom, and Thomason.
A demonstration (apodeixis) is "a deduction that
produces knowledge". Aristotle's Posterior Analytics
contains his account of demonstrations and their role in
knowledge. From a modern perspective, we might think that this
subject moves outside of logic to epistemology. From Aristotle's
perspective, however, the connection of the theory of
sullogismoi with the theory of knowledge is especially close.
The subject of the Posterior Analytics is
epistêmê. This is one of several Greek words that
can reasonably be translated "knowledge", but
Aristotle is concerned only with knowledge of a certain type (as will
be explained below). There is a long tradition of
translating epistêmê in this technical sense as
science, and I shall follow that tradition here. However,
readers should not be misled by the use of that word. In particular,
Aristotle's theory of science cannot be considered a counterpart to
modern philosophy of science, at least not without substantial
We have scientific knowledge, according to Aristotle, when we know:
the cause why the thing is, that it is the cause of this,
and that this cannot be otherwise. (Posterior Analytics I.2)
This implies two
strong conditions on what can be the object of scientific knowledge:
He then proceeds to consider what science so defined
will consist in, beginning with the observation that at any rate one
form of science consists in the possession of a demonstration
(apodeixis), which he defines as a "scientific
- Only what is necessarily the case can be known scientifically
- Scientific knowledge is knowledge of causes
(epistêmonikon), I mean that in virtue of possessing it,
we have knowledge.
remainder of Posterior Analytics I is largely concerned with
two tasks: spelling out the nature of demonstration and demonstrative
science and answering an important challenge to its very possibility.
Aristotle first tells us that a demonstration
is a deduction in which the premises are:
The interpretation of all these conditions except the first has been
the subject of much controversy. Aristotle clearly thinks that
science is knowledge of causes and that in a demonstration, knowledge
of the premises is what brings about knowledge of the conclusion.
The fourth condition shows that the knower of a demonstration must be
in some better epistemic condition towards them, and so modern
interpreters often suppose that Aristotle has defined a kind of
epistemic justification here. However, as noted above, Aristotle is
defining a special variety of knowledge. Comparisons with
discussions of justification in modern epistemology may therefore be
- primary (prota)
- immediate (amesa, "without a middle")
- better known or more familiar
(gnôrimôtera) than the conclusion
- prior to the conclusion
- causes (aitia) of the conclusion
The same can be said of the terms "primary",
"immediate" and "better known". Modern
interpreters sometimes take "immediate" to mean
"self-evident"; Aristotle does say that an immediate
proposition is one "to which no other is prior", but (as I
suggest in the next section) the notion of priority involved is
likely a notion of logical priority that it is hard to detach from
Aristotle's own logical theories. "Better known" has
sometimes been interpreted simply as "previously known to the
knower of the demonstration" (i.e. already known in advance of
the demonstration). However, Aristotle explicitly distinguishes
between what is "better known for us" with what is
"better known in itself" or "in nature" and says
that he means the latter in his definition. In fact, he says that
the process of acquiring scientific knowledge is a process of
changing what is better known "for us", until we
arrive at that condition in which what is better known in itself is
also better known for us.
In Posterior Analytics I.2, Aristotle considers two
challenges to the possibility of science. One party (dubbed the
"agnostics" by Jonathan Barnes) began with the following
They then argued that demonstration is impossible with the following
- Whatever is scientifically known must be demonstrated.
- The premises of a demonstration must be scientifically known.
A second group accepted the agnostics' view that scientific
knowledge comes only from demonstration but rejected their conclusion
by rejecting the dilemma. Instead, they maintained:
- If the premises of a demonstration are scientifically known,
then they must be demonstrated.
- The premises from which each premise are demonstrated must be
- Either this process continues forever, creating an infinite
regress of premises, or it comes to a stop at some point.
- If it continues forever, then there are no first premises from
which the subsequent ones are demonstrated, and so nothing is
- On the other hand, if it comes to a stop at some point, then the
premises at which it comes to a stop are undemonstrated and
therefore not scientifically known; consequently, neither are
any of the others deduced from them.
- Therefore, nothing can be demonstrated.
Aristotle does not give us much information about how circular
demonstration was supposed to work, but the most plausible
interpretation would be supposing that at least for some set of
fundamental principles, each principle could be deduced from the
others. (Some modern interpreters have compared this position to a
coherence theory of knowledge.)
However their position worked, the circular demonstrators claimed to
have a third alternative avoiding the agnostics' dilemma, since
circular demonstration gives us a regress that is both unending (in
the sense that we never reach premises at which it comes to a stop)
and finite (because it works its way round the finite circle of
Aristotle rejects circular demonstration as an incoherent notion on
the grounds that the premises of any demonstration must be prior (in
an appropriate sense) to the conclusion, whereas a circular
demonstration would make the same premises both prior and posterior
to one another (and indeed every premise prior and posterior to
itself). He agrees with the agnostics' analysis of the regress
problem: the only plausible options are that it continues
indefinitely or that it "comes to a stop" at some point.
However, he thinks both the agnostics and the circular demosntrators
are wrong in maintaining that scientific knowledge is only possible
by demonstration from premises scientifically known: instead, he
claims, there is another form of knowledge possible for the first
premises, and this provides the starting points for demonstrations.
- Demonstration "in a circle" is possible, so that it is
possible for all premises also to be conclusions and therefore
To solve this problem, Aristotle needs to do something quite
specific. It will not be enough for him to establish that we can
have knowledge of some propositions without demonstrating
them: unless it is in turn possible to deduce all the other
propositions of a science from them, we shall not have solved the
regress problem. Moreover (and obviously), it is no solution to this
problem for Aristotle simply to assert that we have knowledge
without demonstration of some appropriate starting points. He does
indeed say that it is his position that we have such knowledge
(An. Post. I.2,), but he owes us an account of why that should
Aristotle's account of knowledge of the indemonstrable first premises
of sciences is found in Posterior Analytics II.19, long
regarded as a difficult text to interpret. Briefly, what he says
there is that it is another cognitive state, nous (translated
variously as "insight", "intuition",
"intelligence"), which knows them. There is wide
disagreement among commentators about the interpretation of his
account of how this state is reached; I will offer one possible
interpretation. First, Aristotle identifies his problem as
explaining how the principles can "become familiar to us",
using the same term "familiar" (gnôrimos) that
he used in presenting the regress problem. What he is presenting,
then, is not a method of discovery but a process of becoming wise.
Second, he says that in order for knowledge of immediate premises to
be possible, we must have a kind of knowledge of them without having
learned it, but this knowledge must not be as "precise" as
the knowledge that a possessor of science must have. The kind of
knowledge in question turns out to be a capacity or power
(dunamis) which Aristotle compares to the the capacity for
sense-perception: since our senses are innate, i.e. develop
naturally, it is in a way correct to say that we know what e.g. all
the colors look like before we have seen them: we have the capacity
to see them by nature, and when we first see a color we exercise this
capacity without having to learn how to do so first. Likewise,
Aristotle holds, our minds have by nature the capacity to recognize
the starting points of the sciences.
In the case of sensation, the capacity for perception in the sense
organ is actualized by the operation on it of the perceptible object.
Similarly, Aristotle holds that coming to know first premises is a
matter of a potentiality in the mind being actualized by experience
of its proper objects: "The soul is of such a nature as to be
capable of undergoing this". So, although we cannot come to
know the first premises without the necessary experience, just as we
cannot see colors without the presence of colored objects, our minds
are already so constituted as to be able to recognize the right
objects, just as our eyes are already so constituted as to be able to
perceive the colors that exist.
It is considerably less clear what these objects are and how it is
that experience actualizes the relevant potentialities in the soul.
Aristotle describes a series of stages of cognition. First is what
is common to all animals: perception of what is present. Next is
memory, which he regards as a retention of a sensation: only some
animals have this capacity. Even fewer have the next capacity, the
capacity to form a single experience (empeiria) from many
repetitions of the same memory. Finally, many experiences repeated
give rise to knowledge of a single universal (katholou). This
last capacity is present only in humans.
See the article on Aristotle's psychology
for more on his views about mind.
The definition (horos, horismos) was an
important matter for Plato and for the Early Academy. Concern with
answering the question "What is so-and-so?" are at the center of the
majority of Plato's dialogues, some of which (most elaborately the
Sophist) propound methods for finding definitions. External
sources (sometimes the satirical remarks of comedians) also reflect
this Academic concern with definitions. Aristotle himself traces the
quest for definitions back to Socrates.
For Aristotle, a definition is "an account which signifies what it
is to be for something" (logos ho to ti ên einai
sêmainei). The phrase "what it is to be" and its
variants are crucial: giving a definition is saying, of some existent
thing, what it is, not simply specifying the meaning of a word (Aristotle
does recognize definitions of the latter sort, but he has little
interest in them).
The notion of "what it is to be" for a thing is so
pervasive in Aristotle that it becomes formulaic: what a definition
expresses is "the what-it-is-to-be" (to ti ên
einai). Roman translators, vexed by this odd Greek phrase,
devised a word for it, essentia, from which our
"essence" descends. So, an Aristotelian definition is an
account of the essence of something.
Since a definition defines an essence, only what has an essence can
be defined. What has an essence, then? That is one of the central
questions of Aristotle's metaphysics; once again, we must leave the
details to another article. In general, however, it is not
individuals but rather species (eidos: the word is one
of those Plato uses for "Form") that have essences. A
species is defined by giving its genus (genos) and its
differentia (diaphora): the genus is the kind under
which the species falls, and the differentia tells what characterizes
the species within that genus. As an example, human might be
defined as animal (the genus) having the capacity to
reason (the differentia).
Essential Predication and the Predicables
Underlying Aristotle's concept of a definition is the concept of
essential predication (katêgoreisthai en tôi ti
esti, predication in the what it is). In any true affirmative
predication, the predicate either does or does not "say what the
subject is", i.e., the predicate either is or is not an
acceptable answer to the question "What is it?" asked of
the subject. Bucephalus is a horse, and a horse is an animal; so,
"Bucephalus is a horse" and "Bucephalus is an
animal" are essential predications. However, "Bucephalus
is brown", though true, does not state what Bucephalus us but
only says something about him.
Since a thing's definition says what it is, definitions are
essentially predicated. However, not everything essentially
predicated is a definition. Since Bucephalus is a horse, and horses
are a kind of mammal, and mammals are a kind of animal,
"horse" "mammal" and "animal" are all
essential predicates of Bucephalus. Moreover, since what a horse is
is a kind of mammal, "mammal" is an essential predicate of
horse. When predicate X is an essential predicate of Y but also of
other things, then X is a genus (genos) of Y.
A definition of X must not only be essentially predicated of it but
must also be predicated only of it: to use a term from Aristotle's
Topics, a definition and what it defines must
"counterpredicate" (antikatêgoreisthai) with
one another. X counterpredicates with Y if X applies to what Y
applies to and conversely. Though X's definition must
counterpredicate with X, not everything that counterpredicates with X
is its definition. "Capable of laughing", for example,
counterpredicates with "human" but fails to be its
definition. Such a predicate (non-essential but counterpredicating)
is a peculiar property or proprium (idion).
Finally, if X is predicated of Y but is neither essential nor
counterpredicates, then X is an accident
(sumbebêkos) of Y.
Aristotle sometimes treats genus, peculiar property, definition, and
accident as including all possible predications (e.g. Topics
I). Later commentators listed these four and the differentia as the
five predicables, and as such they were of great importance to
late ancient and to medieval philosophy (e.g., Porphyry).
The notion of essential predication is connected to
what are traditionally called the categories
(katêgoriai). In a word, Aristotle is famous
for having held a "doctrine of categories". Just what that
doctrine was, and indeed just what a category is, are considerably
more vexing questions. They also quickly take us outside his
logic and into his metaphysics. Here, I will try to give a
very general overview, beginning with the somewhat simpler question
"What categories are there?"
We can answer this question by listing the categories. Here are two
passages containing such lists:
We should distinguish the kinds of predication (ta genê
in which the four predications mentioned are found. These are
ten in number: what-it-is, quantity, quality, relative,
where, when, being-in-a-position, having, doing, undergoing. An accident, a
genus, a peculiar property and a definition will always be in one of
these categories. (Topics I.9, 103b20-25)
These two passages give ten-item lists, identical except for their first
members. What are they lists of? Here are three ways they
might be interpreted:
Of things said without any combination, each signifies either
substance or quantity or quality or a relative or where or when
or being-in-a-position or having or doing or undergoing. To give
a rough idea, examples of substance are man, horse; of quantity:
four-foot, five-foot; of quality: white, literate; of a
relative: double, half, larger; of where: in the Lyceum, in the
market-place; of when: yesterday, last year; of being-in-a-position:
is-lying, is-sitting; of having: has-shoes-on, has-armor-on; of
doing: cutting, burning; of undergoing: being-cut, being-burned.
(Categories 4, 1b25-2a4, tr. Ackrill, slightly modified)
The word "category"
(katêgoria) means "predication". Aristotle
holds that predications and predicates can be grouped into several
largest "kinds of predication" (genê tôn
katêgoriôn). He refers to this classification
frequently, often calling the "kinds of predication" simply
"the predications", and this (by way of Latin) leads to our
Which of these interpretations fits best with the two passages above?
The answer appears to be different in the two cases. This is most
evident if we take note of point in which they differ: the
Categories lists substance (ousia) in first
place, while the Topics list what-it-is (ti
esti). A substance, for Aristotle, is a type of entity, suggesting
that the Categories list is a list of types of entity.
First, the categories may be kinds of predicate: predicates (or, more
precisely, predicate expressions) can be
divided into ten separate classes, with each expression belonging to
just one class. This comports well with the root meaning of the word katêgoria
On this interpretation, the categories arise out of
considering the most general types of question that can be asked
about something: "What is it?"; "How much
is it?"; "What sort is it?"; "Where
is it?"; "What is it doing?" Answers
appropriate to one of these questions are nonsensical in response to
another ("When is it?" "A horse"). Thus, the
categories may rule out certain kinds of question as ill-formed or
confused. This plays an important role in Aristotle's metaphysics.
Second, the categories may be seen as classifications of
predications, that is, kinds of relation that may hold between
the predicate and the subject of a predication. To say of Socrates
that he is human is to say what he is, whereas to say that he
is literate is not to say what he is but rather to give a quality that
he has. For Aristotle, the relation of predicate to subject in
these two sentences is quite different (in this respect he differs
both from Plato and from modern logicians). The categories may be
interpreted as ten different ways in which a predicate may be related
to its subject. This last division has importance for
Aristotle's logic as well as his metaphysics.
Third, the categories may be seen as kinds of entity, as
highest genera or kinds of thing that are. A given thing can be
classified under a series of progressively wider genera: Socrates is
a human, a mammal, an animal, a living being. The categories are the
highest such genera. Each falls under no other genus, and each is
completely separate from the others. This distinction is of critical
importance to Aristotle's metaphysics.
On the other hand, the expression "what-it-is" suggests
most strongly a type of predication. Indeed, the Topics
confirms this by telling us that we can "say what it is" of
an entity falling under any of the categories:
expression signifying what-it-is will sometimes signify a substance,
sometimes a quantity, sometimes a quality, and sometimes one of the
other categories. As Aristotle explains, if I say that
Socrates is a man, then I have said what Socrates is and signified a
substance; if I say that white is a color, then I have said what white
is and signified a quality; if I say that some length is a foot long,
then I have said what it is and signified a quantity; and so on for
the other categories. What-it-is, then, here designates a kind of
predication, not a kind of entity.
This might lead us to conclude that the categories in the
Topics are only to be interpreted as kinds of predicate or
predication, those in the Categories as kinds of being. Even
so, we would still want to ask what the relationship is between these
two nearly-identical lists of terms, given these distinct
interpretations. However, the situation is much more complicated.
First, there are dozens of other passages in which the categories
appear. Nowhere else do we find a list of ten, but we do find shorter
lists containing eight, or six, or five, or four of them (with
substance/what-it-is, quality, quantity, and relative the most
common). Aristotle describes what these lists are lists of in
different ways: they tell us "how being is divided", or
"how many ways being is said", or "the figures of
predication" (ta schêmata tês katêgorias).
The designation of the first category also varies: we find not only
"substance" and "what it is" but also the
expressions "this" or "the this" (tode ti,
to tode, to ti). These latter expressions are closely
associated with, but not synonymous with, substance. He even combines
the latter with "what-it-is" (Metaphysics Z 1,
1028a10: "… one sense signifies what it is and the this,
one signifies quality …").
Moreover, substances are for Aristotle fundamental for predication as
well as metaphysically fundamental. He tells us that everything
that exists exists because substances exist: if there were no substances,
there would not be anything else. He also conceives of predication as
reflecting a metaphysical relationship (or perhaps more than one, depending
on the type of predication). The sentence "Socrates is pale"
gets its truth from a state of affairs consisting of a substance (Socrates)
and a quality (whiteness) which is in that substance. At this point
we have gone far outside the realm of Aristotle's logic into his
metaphysics, the fundamental question of which, according to Aristotle,
is "What is a substance?". (For further discussion of
this topic, see the entry on
and in particular,
on the categories.)
See Frede 1981, Ebert 1985 for additional discussion of Aristotle's lists of
For convenience of reference, I include a table of the categories,
along with Aristotle's examples and the traditional names
often used for them. For reasons explained above, I have treated the
first item in the list quite differently, since an example of a substance
and an example of a what-it-is are necessarily (as one might put it)
in different categories.
In the Sophist, Plato introduces a procedure of
"Division" as a method for discovering definitions. To
find a definition of X, first locate the largest kind of thing under
which X falls; then, divide that kind into two parts, and decide
which of the two X falls into. Repeat this method with the part
until X has been fully located.
"Socrates is a man"
||related to what
||double, half, greater
||in the Lyceum, in the marketplace
||yesterday, last year
||is shod, is armed
||is cut, is burned
This method is part of Aristotle's Platonic legacy. His attitude
towards it, however, is complex. He adopts a view of the proper
structure of definitions that is closely allied to it: a correct
definition of X should give the genus (genos: kind or
family) of X, which tells what kind of thing X is, and the
differentia (diaphora: difference) which uniquely
identifies X within that genus. Something defined in this way is a
species (eidos: the term is one of Plato's terms for
"Form"), and the differentia is thus the "difference
that makes a species" (eidopoios diaphora, "specific
difference"). In Posterior Analytics II.13, he gives his
own account of the use of Division in finding definitions.
However, Aristotle is strongly critical of the Platonic view of
Division as a method for establishing definitions. In
Prior Analytics I.31, he contrasts Division with the
syllogistic method he has just presented, arguing that Division
cannot actually prove anything but rather assumes the very thing it
is supposed to be proving. He also charges that the partisans of
Division failed to understand what their own method was capable of
Closely related to this is the discussion, in Posterior
Analytics II.3-10, of the question whether there can be both
definition and demonstration of the same thing. Since the
definitions Aristotle is interested in are statements of essences,
knowing a definition is knowing, of some existing thing, what it is.
Consequently, Aristotle's question amounts to a question whether
defining and demonstrating can be alternative ways of acquiring the
same knowledge. His reply is complex:
As an example of case 3, Aristotle considers the definition
"Thunder is the extinction of fire in the clouds". He sees
this as a compressed and rearranged form of this demonstration:
- Not everything demonstrable can be known by finding definitions,
since all definitions are universal and affirmative whereas some
demonstrable propositions are negative.
- If a thing is demonstrable, then to know it just is to possess its
demonstration; therefore, it cannot be known just by definition.
- Nevertheless, some definitions can be understood as demonstrations
We can see the connection by considering the answers to two
questions: "What is thunder?" "The extinction of fire
in the clouds" (definition). "Why does it thunder?"
"Because fire is extinguished in the clouds"
- Sound accompanies the extinguishing of fire.
- Fire is extinguished in the clouds.
- Therefore, a sound occurs in the clouds.
As with his criticisms of Division, Aristotle is arguing for the
superiority of his own concept of science to the Platonic concept.
Knowledge is composed of demonstrations, even if it may also include
definitions; the method of science is demonstrative, even if it may
also include the process of defining.
Aristotle often contrasts dialectical arguments with
demonstrations. The difference, he tells us, is in the character of
their premises, not in their logical structure: whether an argument
is a sullogismos is only a matter of whether its conclusion
results of necessity from its premises. The premises of
demonstrations must be true and primary, that is, not only
true but also prior to their conclusions in the way explained in the
Posterior Analytics. The premises of dialectical deductions,
by contrast, must be accepted (endoxos).
Recent scholars have proposed different interpretations of the term
endoxos. Aristotle often uses this adjective as a substantive:
ta endoxa, "accepted things", "accepted opinions".
On one understanding, descended from the work of
G. E. L. Owen and developed more fully by Jonathan Barnes and
especially Terence Irwin, the endoxa are a compilation of
views held by various people with some form or other of standing:
"the views of fairly reflective people after some
reflection", in Irwin's phrase. Dialectic is then simply
"a method of argument from [the] common beliefs [held by these
people]". For Irwin, then, endoxa are "common beliefs".
Jonathan Barnes, noting that endoxa are opinions with a certain
standing, translates with "reputable".
My own view is that Aristotle's texts support a somewhat different
understanding. He also tells us that dialectical premises differ
from demonstrative ones in that the former are questions,
whereas the latter are assumptions or assertions:
"the demonstrator does not ask, but takes", he says. This
fits most naturally with a view of dialectic as argument directed at
another person by question and answer and consequently taking as
premises that other person's concessions. Anyone arguing in this
manner will, in order to be successful, have to ask for premises
which the interlocutor is liable to accept, and the best way to be
successful at that is to have an inventory of acceptable premises,
i.e. premises that are in fact acceptable to people of different
In fact, we can discern in the Topics (and the
Rhetoric, which Aristotle says depends on the art explained in
the Topics) an art of dialectic for use in such arguments. My
reconstruction of this art (which would not be accepted by all
scholars) is as follows.
Given the above picture of dialectical argument, the dialectical art
will consist of two elements. One will be a method for discovering
premises from which a given conclusion follows, while the other will
be a method for determining which premises a given interlocutor will
be likely to concede. The first task is accomplished by developing a
system for classifying premises according to their logical structure.
We might expect Aristotle to avail himself here of the syllogistic,
but in fact he develops quite another approach, one that seems less
systematic and rests on various "common" terms. The second
task is accomplished by developing lists of the premises which are
acceptable to various types of interlocutor. Then, once one knows
what sort of person one is dealing with, one can choose premises
accordingly. Aristotle stresses that, as in all arts, the
dialectician must study, not what is acceptable to this or that
specific person, but what is acceptable to this or that type of
person, just as the doctor studies what is healthful for different
types of person: "art is of the universal".
The method presented in the Topics for classifying arguments
relies on the presence in the conclusion of certain "common" terms
(koina) -- common in the sense that they are not peculiar to
any subject matter but may play a role in arguments about anything
whatever. We find enumerations of arguments involving these terms in
a similar order several times. Typically, they include:
The four types of opposites are the best represented. Each
designates a type of term pair, i.e. a way two terms can be opposed
to one another. Contraries are polar opposites or opposed
extremes such as hot and cold, dry and wet, good and bad. A pair of
contradictories consists of a term and its negation: good, not
good. A possession (or condition) and privation are
illustrated by sight and blindness.Relatives are relative
terms in the modern sense: a pair consists of a term and its
correlative, e.g. large and small, parent and child.
- Opposites (antikeimena, antitheseis)
- Contraries (enantia)
- Contradictories (apophaseis)
- Possession and Privation (hexis kai sterêsis)
- Relatives (pros ti)
- Cases (ptôseis)
- "More and Less and Likewise"
The argumentative patterns Aristotle associated with cases
generally involve inferring a sentence contaning adverbial or
declined forms from another sentence containing different forms of
the same word stem: "if what is useful is good, then what is
done usefully is done well and the useful person is good". In
Hellenistic grammatical usage, ptôsis meant
"case" (e.g. nominative, dative, accusative); Aristotle's
use here is obviously an early form of that.
Under the heading more and less and likewise, Aristotle
groups a somewhat motley assortment of argument patterns all
involving, in some way or other, the terms "more",
"less", and "likewise". Examples: "If
whatever is A is B, then whatever is more (less) A is more (less)
B"; "If A is more likely B than C is, and A is not B, then
neither is C"; "If A is more likely than B and B is the
case, then A is the case".
At the heart of the Topics is a collection of what Aristotle
calls topoi, "places" or "locations".
Unfortunately, though it is clear that he intends most of the
Topics (Books II-VI) as a collection of these, he never
explicitly defines this term. Interpreters have consequently
disagreed considerably about just what a topos is. A
discussion may be found in Brunschwig 1967, Slomkowski 1996,
Primavesi 1997, and Smith 1997.
An art of dialectic will be useful wherever dialectical
argument is useful. Aristotle mentions three such uses; each merits
First, there appears to have been a form of stylized argumentative
exchange practiced in the Academy in Aristotle's time. The main
evidence for this is simply Aristotle's Topics, especially
Book VIII, which makes frequent reference to rule-governed
procedures, apparently taking it for granted that the audience will
understand them. In these exchanges, one participant took the role
of answerer, the other the role of questioner. The answerer began by
asserting some proposition (a thesis: "position" or
"acceptance"). The questioner then asked questions of the
answerer in an attempt to secure concessions from which a
contradiction could be deduced: that is, to refute
(elenchein) the answerer's position. The questioner was
limited to questions that could be answered by yes or no; generally,
the answerer could only respond with yes or no, though in some cases
answeres could object to the form of a question. Answerers might
undertake to answer in accordance with the views of a particular type
of person or a particular person (e.g. a famous philosopher), or they
might answer according to their own beliefs. There appear to have
been judges or scorekeepers for the process. Gymnastic dialectical
contests were sometimes, as the name suggests, for the sake of
exercise in developing argumentative skill, but they may also have
been pursued as a part of a process of inquiry.
Aristotle also mentions an "art of making trial", or a
variety of dialectical argument that "puts to the test"
(the Greek word is the adjective peirastikê, in the
feminine: such expressions often designate arts or skills,
e.g. rhêtorikê, "the art of rhetoric").
Its function is to examine the claims of those who say they have some
knowledge, and it can practiced by someone who does not possess the
knowledge in question. The examination is a matter of refutation,
based on the principle that whoever knows a subject must have
consistent beliefs about it: so, if you can show me that my beliefs
about something lead to a contradiction, then you have shown that I
do not have knowledge about it.
This is strongly reminiscent of Socrates' style of interrogation,
from which it is almost certainly descended. In fact, Aristotle
often indicates that dialectical argument is by nature refutative.
Dialectical refutation cannot of itself establish any proposition
(except perhaps the proposition that some set of propositions is
inconsistent). More to the point, though deducing a contradiction
from my beliefs may show that they do not constitute knowledge,
failure to deduce a contradiction from them is no proof that they are
true. Not surprisingly, then, Aristotle often insists that
"dialectic does not prove anything" and that the
dialectical art is not some sort of universal knowledge.
In Topics I.2, however, Aristotle says that the art of
dialectic is useful in connection with "the philosophical
sciences". One reason he gives for this follows closely on the
refutative function: if we have subjected our opinions (and the
opinions of our fellows, and of the wise) to a thorough refutative
examination, we will be in a much better position to judge what is
most likely true and false. In fact, we find just such a procedure
at the start of many of Aristotle's treatises: an enumeration of the
opinions current about the subject together with a compilation of
"puzzles" raised by these opinions. Aristotle has a
special term for this kind of review: a diaporia, a
He adds a second use that is both more difficult to understand and
more intriguing. The Posterior Analytics argues that if
anything can be proved, then not everything that is known is known as
a result of proof. What alternative means is there whereby the first
principles of sciences are known? Aristotle's own answer as found in
Posterior Analytics II.19 is difficult to interpret, and
recent philosophers have often found it unsatisfying since (as often
construed) it appears to commit Aristotle to a form of apriorism or
rationalism both indefensible in itself and not consonant with his
own insistence on the indispensability of empirical inquiry in
Against this background, the following passage in Topics I.2
may have special importance:
It is also useful in connection with the first things concerning
each of the sciences. For it is impossible to say anything about the
science under consideration on the basis of its own principles, since
the principles are first of all, and we must work our way through
about these by means of what is generally accepted about each. But
this is peculiar, or most proper, to dialectic: for since it is
examinative with respect to the principles of all the sciences, it
has a way to proceed.
A number of interpreters (beginning with Owen 1961) have built on
this passage and others to find dialectic at the heart of Aristotle's
philosophical method. Further discussion of this issue would take us
far beyond the subject of this article (the fullest development is in
Irwin 1988; see also Nussbaum 1986 and, for criticism, Hamlyn 1990,
Aristotle says that rhetoric, i.e. the study of persuasive speech, is
a "counterpart" (antistrophos) of dialectic and that
the rhetorical art is a kind of "outgrowth" (paraphues
ti) of dialectic and the study of character types. The
correspondence with dialectical method is straightforward: rhetorical
speeches, like dialectical arguments, seek to persuade others to
accept certain conclusions on the basis of premises they already
accept. Therefore, the same measures useful in dialectical contexts
will, mutatis mutandis, be useful here: knowing what premises an
audience of a given type is likely to believe, and knowing how to
find premises from which the desired conclusion follows.
The Rhetoric does fit this general description: Aristotle
includes both discussions of types of person or audience (with
generalizations about what each type tends to believe) and a summary
version (in II.23) of the argument patterns discussed in the
Topics. For further discussion of his rhetoric see
Demonstrations and dialectical arguments are both forms of valid
argument, for Aristotle. However, he also studies what he calls
contentious (eristikos) or sophistical
arguments: these he defines as arguments which only apparently
establish their conclusions. In fact, Aristotle defines these as
apparent (but not genuine) dialectical sullogismoi.
They may have this appearance in either of two ways:
Arguments of the first type in modern terms, appear to be valid but
are really invalid. Arguments of the second type are at first
more perplexing: given that acceptability is a matter of what people
believe, it might seem that whatever appears to be endoxos
must actually be endoxos. However, Aristotle probably has in
mind arguments with premises that may at first glance seem to
be acceptable but which, upon a moment's reflection, we immediately
realize we don not actually accept. Consider this example from
- Arguments in which the conclusion only appears to follow
of necessity from the premises (apparent, but not genuine,
- Genuine sullogismois the premises of which are merely
apparently, but not genuinely, acceptable.
This is transparently bad, but the problem is not that it is
invalid: the problem is rather that the first premise, though
superficially plausible, is false. In fact, anyone with a little
ability to follow an argument will realize that at once upon seeing
this very argument.
- Whatever you have not lost, you still have.
- You have not lost horns.
- Therefore, you still have horns
Aristotle's study of sophistical arguments is contained in On
Sophistical Refutations, which is actually a sort of appendix to
To a remarkable extent, contemporary discussions of fallacies
reproduce Aristotle's own classifications. See Dorion 1995 for
Two frequent themes of Aristotle's account of science are (1) that
the first principles of sciences are not demonstrable and (2) that
there is no single universal science including all other sciences as
its parts. "All things are not in a single genus", he says,
if they were, all beings could not fall under the same principles"
(On Sophistical Refutations 11). Thus,
it is exactly the universal applicability of dialectic that leads him to
deny it the status of a science.
In Metaphysics IV (Γ), however, Aristotle takes what
appears to be a different view. First, he argues that there is, in a
way, a science that takes being as its genus (his name for it is
"first philosophy"). Second, he argues that the principles of this
science will be, in a way, the first principles of all (though he does
not claim that the principles of other sciences can be demonstrated
from them). Third, he identifies one of its first principles as the
"most secure" of all principles: the principle of non-contradiction.
As he states it,
It is impossible for the same thing to belong and not belong
simultaneously to the same thing in the same respect (Met. )
This is the most secure of all principles, Aristotle tells us,
because "it is impossible to be in error about it". Since
it is a first principle, it cannot be demonstrated; those who think
otherwise are "uneducated in analytics". However,
Aristotle then proceeds to give what he calls a "refutative
demonstration" (apodeixai elenktikôs) of this
Further discussion of this principle and Aristotle's arguments
concerning it belong to a treatment of his metaphysics (see
However, it should be noted that: (1) these arguments draw on
Aristotle's views about logic to a greater extent than any treatise
outside the logical works themselves; (2) in the logical works, the
principle of non-contradiction is one of Aristotle's favorite
illustrations of the "common principles" (koinai
archai) that underlie the art of dialectic.
See Aristotle's Metaphysics,
Dancy 1975, Code 1986 for further discussion.
The passage in Aristotle's logical works which has received perhaps
the most intense discussion in recent decades is On
Interpretation 9, where Aristotle discusses the question whether
every proposition about the future must be either true or false.
Though something of a side issue in its context, the passage raises a
problem of great importance to Aristotle's near contemporaries (and
A contradiction (antiphasis) is a pair of propositions
one of which asserts what the other denies. A major goal of On
Interpretation is to discuss the thesis that, of every such
contradiction, one member must be true and the other false. In the
course of his discussion, Aristotle allows for some exceptions. One
case is what he calls indefinite propositions such as "A
man is walking": nothing prevents both this proposition and
"A man is not walking" being simultaneously true. This
exception can be explained on relatively simple grounds.
A different exception arises for more complex reasons. Consider
these two propositions:
It seems that exactly one of these must be true and the other false.
But if (1) is now true, then there must be a sea-battle
tomorrow, and there cannot fail to be a sea-battle tomorrow.
The result, according to this puzzle, is that nothing is possible
except what actually happens: there are no unactualized
- There will be a sea-battle tomorrow
- There will not be a sea-battle tomorrow
Such a conclusion is, as Aristotle is quick to note, a problem both
for his own metaphysical views about potentialities and for the
commonsense notion that some things are up to us. He therefore
proposes another exception to the general thesis concerning
This much would probably be accepted by most interpreters. What the
restriction is, however, and just what motivates it are matters of
wide disagreement. It has been proposed, for instance, that
Aristotle adopted, or at least flirted with, a three-valued logic for
future propositions, or that he countenanced truth-value gaps, or
that his solution includes still more abstruse reasoning. The
literature is much too complex to summarize: see Anscombe, Hintikka,
D. Frede, Whitaker, Waterlow.
Historically, at least, it is likely that Aristotle is responding to
an argument originating in the Megarian School. He ascribes the view
that only that which happens is possible to the Megarians in
Metaphysics IX (Θ). The puzzle with which he is concerned
strongly recalls the "Master Argument" of Diodorus Cronus, especially
in certain further details. For instance, Aristotle imagines the
statement about tomorrow's sea battle having been uttered ten thousand
years ago. If it was true, then its truth was a fact about the past;
if the past is now unchangeable, then so is the truth value of that
past utterance. This recalls the Master Argument's premise that "what
is past is necessary". Diodorus Cronus was active a little after
Aristotle, and he was a Megarian (see Dorion 1995 for criticism of
David Sedley's attempt to reject this). It seems to me reasonable to
conclude that Aristotle's target here is some Megarian argument,
perhaps an earlier version of the Master.
- Accept: tithenai (in a dialectical argument)
- Accepted: endoxos (also ‘reputable’ ‘common belief’)
- Accident: sumbebêkos (see incidental)
- Accidental: kata sumbebêkos
- Affirmation: kataphasis
- Affirmative: kataphatikos
- Assertion: apophansis (sentence with a truth value,
- Assumption: hupothesis
- Belong: huparchein
- Category: katêgoria See the discussion in §C.
- Contradict: antiphanai
- Contradiction: antiphasis (in the sense "contradictory
pair of propositions" and also in the sense "denial of a
- Contrary: enantion
- Deduction: sullogismos
- Definition: horos, horismos
- Demonstration: apodeixis
- Denial (of a proposition): apophasis
- Dialectic: dialektikê (the art of dialectic)
- Differentia: diaphora; specific difference, eidopoios
- Direct: deiktikos (of proofs; opposed to "through
- Essence: to ti esti, to ti ên einai
- Essential: en tôi ti esti (of predications)
- Extreme: akron (of the major and minor terms of a deduction)
- Figure: schêma
- Form: eidos (see also Species)
- Genus: genos
- Immediate: amesos ("without a middle")
- Impossible: adunaton; "through the impossible"
(dia tou adunatou), of some proofs.
- Incidental: see Accidental
- Induction: epagôgê
- Middle, middle term (of a deduction): meson
- Negation (of a term): apophasis
- Objection: enstasis
- Particular: en merei, epi meros (of a
proposition); kath'hekaston (of individuals)
- Peculiar, Peculiar Property: idios, idion
- Possible: dunaton, endechomenon;
endechesthai(verb: "be possible")
- Predicate: katêgorein (verb);
katêegoroumenon("what is predicated")
- Predication: katêgoria (act or instance of
predicating, type of predication)
- Primary: prôton
- Principle: archê (starting point of a
- Quality: poion
- Reduce, Reduction: anagein, anagôgê
- Refute: elenchein; refutation, elenchos
- Science: epistêmê
- Species: eidos
- Specific: eidopoios (of a differentia that "makes a
- Subject: hupokeimenon
- Substance: ousia
- Term: horos
- Universal: katholou (both of propositions and of
[Please contact the author with suggestions.]
Aristotle: mathematics |
Aristotle: metaphysics |
Aristotle: poetics |
Aristotle: rhetoric |
Diodorus Cronus |
future contingents |
logic: ancient |
logic: relevance |
Megarian School |
square of opposition |
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I am indebted to Alan Code, Marc Cohen, and Theodor Ebert for helpful
criticisms of earlier versions of this article
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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy