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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
What is a judgment of taste? Kant isolated two fundamental necessary conditions for a judgment to be a judgment of taste -- subjectivity and universality (Kant 1928). Other conditions may also contribute to what it is to be a judgment of taste, but they are consequential on, or predicated on, the two fundamental conditions. In this respect Kant was following the lead of Hume and other writers in the British sentimentalist tradition (Hume 1985).
The first necessary condition of a judgment of taste is that it is essentially subjective. What this means is that the judgment of taste is based on a feeling of pleasure or displeasure. It is this that distinguishes a judgment of taste from an empirical judgment. Central examples of judgments of taste are judgments of beauty and ugliness. (Judgments if taste can be about art or nature.)
This subjectivist thesis would be over harsh if it were interpreted in an ‘atomistic’ fashion, so that some subjective response corresponds to every judgment of taste, and vice versa. Sometimes one makes a judgment of taste on inductive grounds or on the basis of authority. A more holistic picture of the relation between response and judgment preserves the spirit of the subjectivist doctrine while fitting our actual lives more accurately. The subjectivist doctrine needs to be refined in order to deal with the cases of induction and authority. But it must not be abandoned. The doctrine is basically right.
However, it is not obvious what to make of the subjectivity of the judgment of taste. We need an account of the nature of the pleasure on which judgments of beauty are based.
Beyond a certain point, this issue cannot be pursued independently of metaphysical issues about realism. For the metaphysics we favour is bound to affect our view of the nature of the pleasure we take in beauty. In particular, we need to know whether or not pleasure in beauty represents properties of beauty and ugliness? If not, does it involve our cognitive faculties in some other way, as Kant thought? Or is it not at all a matter of the faculties that we deploy for understanding the world, but a matter of sentimental reactions, which are schooled in various ways, as Hume thought? These are very hard questions. But there are some things we can say about the pleasure involved in finding something beautiful without raising the temperature too high.
Kant makes various points about pleasure in the beautiful, which fall short of what we might call his “deep” account of the nature of pleasure in beauty, according to which it is the harmonious free play of imagination and understanding. According to Kant's “surface” account of pleasure in beauty, it is not mere sensuous gratification, as in the pleasure of sensation, or of eating and drinking. Unlike such pleasures, pleasure in beauty is occasioned by the perceptual representation of a thing. (These days, we might feel more comfortable putting this by saying that pleasure in beauty has an intentional content.) Moreover, unlike other sorts of intentional pleasures, pleasure in beauty is “disinterested”. This means, very roughly, that it is a pleasure which does not involve desire -- pleasure in beauty is desire-free. That is, the pleasure is neither based on desire nor does it produce one by itself. In this respect, pleasure in beauty is unlike pleasure in the agreeable, unlike pleasure in what is good for me, and unlike pleasure in what is morally good. According to Kant, all such pleasures are “interested” -- they are bound up with desire.
This is all important as far as it goes; but it is all negative. We need to know what pleasure in beauty is, as well as what it isn't. What can be said of a more positive nature?
In order to see what is special about pleasure in beauty, we must shift the focus back to consider what is special about the judgment of taste. For Kant, the judgment of taste claims “universal validity”, which he describes as follows:
… when [a man] puts a thing on a pedestal and calls it beautiful, he demands the same delight from others. He judges not merely for himself, but for all men, and then speaks of beauty as if it were a property of things. Thus he says that the thing is beautiful; and it is not as if he counts on others agreeing with him in his judgment of liking owing to his having found them in such agreement on a number of occasions, but he demands this agreement of them. He blames them if they judge differently, and denies them taste, which he still requires of them as something they ought to have; and to this extent it is not open to men to say: Every one has his own taste. This would be equivalent to saying that there is no such thing as taste, i.e. no aesthetic judgment capable of making a rightful claim upon the assent of all men. (Kant 1928, p. 52; see also pp. 136-139.)
Kant's idea is that in a judgment of taste, we demand or require agreement from others in a way we do not in our judgments about the niceness of Canary-wine, which is just a question of individual preference. In matters of taste and beauty, we think that others ought to share our judgment. That's why we blame them if they don't. It is because the judgment of taste has such an aspiration to universal validity that it seems “as if [beauty] were a property of things.”
Now, if the above quotation were all that Kant had to say by way of elucidating the judgment of taste, then he would not have said enough. For the following question is left hanging: why do we require that others share our judgment? We might want others to share our judgment for all sorts of strange reasons. Maybe we will feel more comfortable. Maybe we will win a bet. And if we say that they ought to judge a certain way, we need to say more. In what sense is this true? What if someone cannot appreciate some excellent work of art because they are grief-stricken? What if it would distract someone from some socially worthy project? Of what nature is this ‘ought’?
We can recast the point about how we ought to judge in austere terms by saying that there is a certain normative constraint on our judgments of taste which is absent in our judgments about the niceness of Canary-wine. The most primitive expression of this normativity is this: some are correct, others incorrect. Or perhaps, even more cautiously: some judgments are better than others. We do not think that something is beautiful merely to me, in the way that we might say that some things just happen to give me sensuous pleasure. Of course, we might well say “I think X is beautiful,” because we wish to express uncertainty; but where we judge confidently, we think of our judgment as being correct. And that means that we think that the opposite judgment would be incorrect. We assume that not all judgments of beauty are equally appropriate. “Each to their own taste” only applies to judgments of niceness and nastiness, which Kant calls “judgments of agreeableness” (see Kant 1928, pp. 51-53, p. 149).
Of course, some people just know about food (especially in France and Italy). There are experts and authorities on making delicious food and in knowing what will taste good (Kant 1928, pp. 52-53). But what these people know is what will taste pleasurable to a certain kind of palate. In a sense, some things just do taste better than others; and some judgments of excellence in food are better than others. There is a sense in which some are even correct and others incorrect. But still, this is only relative to “normal” human beings. There is no idea of correctness according to which someone with very unusual pleasures and displeasure is at fault, or according to which the majority of human beings can be wrong. (Kant says that judgments of agreeableness have “general” but not “universal” validity (Kant 1928, p. 53.) But in the case of judgments of taste or beauty, correctness is not hostage to what most people like or judge.
To say that a judgment of taste makes a claim to correctness this might seem merely to shift from the problematic ‘ought’ that is involved in a judgment of taste to a problematic ‘correctness’ or ‘betterness’. This may be inevitable. We are dealing with a normative notion, and while some normative notions may be explainable in terms of others, we cannot express normative notions in non-normative terms.
In some cases the correctness of a judgment of taste may be impossibly difficult to decide. We may even think that there is no right answer to be had if we are asked to compare two very different things. But in many other cases, we think that there is a right and a wrong answer at which we are aiming, and that our judgments can be erroneous. If we don't think this, in at least some cases, then we are not making a judgment of taste -- we are doing something else.
Before we move on, it may be worth saying something about “relativism”, according to which no judgments of taste are really better than others. It is common for people to say “There is no right and wrong about matters of taste.” Or people will express the same thought by saying that beauty is “relative” to individual judgment, or even that it is “socially relative.” Such relativism about value of all sorts is part of the Zeitgeist of a certain recent Western cultural tradition. It is part of the intellectual air, in certain quarters. And in particular, many intellectuals have expressed a dislike of the idea that judgments of taste really have any normative claim, as if that would be uncouth or oppressive. However, if we are describing our thought as it is, not how some think it ought to be, then it is important that philosophers should be persistent and insist -- in the face of the Zeitgeist -- that normativity is a necessary condition of the judgment of taste. Two points ought to embarrass the relativist. Firstly, people who say this kind of thing are merely theorizing. In the case of judgments of beauty, relativist theory is wildly out of step with practice. As with moral relativism, one can virtually always catch the professed relativist about judgments of beauty making and acting on non-relative judgments of beauty -- for example, in their judgments about music, nature and everyday household objects. Relativists do not practice what they preach. Secondly, what is it that drives people to this implausible relativism, which is so out of line with their practice? What do they see as attractive in it? One thing is perhaps a perceived connection with tolerance or anti-authoritarianism. But this is upside-down. For if ‘it's all relative’ and no judgment is better than any other, then relativists put their judgments wholly beyond criticism, and they cannot err. Only those who think that there is a right and wrong in judgment can modestly admit that they might be wrong. What looks like an ideology of tolerance is, in fact, the very opposite. Thus relativism is hypocritical and it is intolerant. The time has come when the Zeitgeist should give up the ghost. Move over geist, your zeit is up!
As I formulated the normative claim of judgments of taste, other people do not figure in the account. I gave an austere explanation of what Kant meant, or perhaps of what he ought to have meant, when he said that the judgment of taste claims “universal validity”, by contrast with judgments about the niceness of Canary-wine. Given this account, we can explain the fact that we think that others ought to share our judgment. They ought to share it on pain of making a judgment which is incorrect or inappropriate. And this would be why we do in fact look to others to share our judgment; we don't want them to make incorrect judgments. Kant's reference to other people in characterizing the normativity of judgments of taste has dropped out of the picture as inessential.
However, Kant would probably not go along with this; for he characterizes the normativity in a way that ties in with his eventual explanation of its possibility. Kant expresses the normative idea in a very particular way. He writes:
[we] insist on others agreeing with our taste (Kant 1928,pp. 53.)
And Kant says that the judgment of taste involves
a claim to validity for all men… (Kant 1928, p. 51.)
By contrast, Kant thinks that although we sometimes speak as if our judgments of the agreeable are universally valid (“Lamb tastes better with garlic”), in fact they are not: judgments of the agreeable appeal only to most but not to all men (Kant 1928, pp. 52-53).
However, in my austere characterization, I hope to catch a more basic idea of normativity -- one that might serve as the target of rival explanations. As far as explaining how subjectively universal judgments are possible, Kant has a complicated story about the harmonious interplay of the cognitive faculties -- imagination and understanding -- which he thinks constitutes pleasure in beauty (Kant 1928, p. 60). This “deep” account of pleasure in beauty is highly controversial and not particularly plausible (see Budd 2001). But we can see why Kant gives it. For Kant, the normative claim of a judgment of taste has its roots in the more general workings of our cognitive faculties, which Kant thinks we can assume others share. Thus we have the beginnings of an explanation of how such a pleasure can ground a judgment that makes a universal claim. However, Kant does not have very much to say about the nature of the “universality” or normativity that is being explained by such a speculative account of pleasure in beauty. It is no accident that Kant phrases the obligation in interpersonal terms, considering where he is going. And it may be no great fault on his part that he does so. But for our purposes, we need to separate what is being explained from its explanation. For if Kant's explanation does not work, we want to be left with a characterization of the normativity he was trying to explain. We need to separate Kant's problem from his solution, so that the former is left if the latter fails. Maybe there is an alternative solution to his problem.
As I have described it, normativity attaches to judgments of taste themselves. What does this bode for pleasure in beauty? Since judgments of taste are based on a response of pleasure, it would make little sense if our judgments were more or less appropriate but our responses were not. The normative claim of our judgments of taste must derive from the fact that we think that some responses are better or more appropriate to their object than others. Responses only license judgments which can be more or less appropriate because responses themselves can be more or less appropriate. If I get pleasure from drinking Canary-wine, and you don't, neither of us will think of the other as being mistaken. But if you don't get pleasure from Shakespeare's Sonnets, I will think of you as being in error -- not just your judgment, but your liking. I think that I am right to have my response, and that your response is defective. Someone who thinks that there is, in Hume's words, “an equality of genius” between some inferior composer, on the one hand, and Bach, on the other, has a defective sensibility (Hume 1985, p. 230). Roger Scruton puts the point well when he says:
When we study [the Einstein Tower and the Giotto campanile] … our attitude is not simply one of curiosity, accompanied by some indefinable pleasure or satisfaction. Inwardly, we affirm our preference as valid… (Scruton 1979, p. 105).
This is the reason why we demand the same feeling from others, even if we don't expect it. We think that our response is more appropriate to its object than its opposite. And, in turn, this is why we think that our judgment about that object is more correct than its opposite. The normativity of judgment derives from the normativity of feeling.
But how can some feelings be better or worse than others? To answer this question, we need to ask: how far does the normativity of judgments of taste inhere in the feeling itself? The realist about beauty will say that the feeling has normativity built into it in virtue of its representational content; the feelings themselves can be more or less veridical. Pleasure in beauty, for example, has as its object the genuine property of beauty: we find the beauty pleasurable. A Humean sentimentalist will probably say that normativity is something we somehow construct or foist upon our pleasures and displeasures, which have no such content. And Kant has his own account, which appeals to cognitive states that are not beliefs. The issue is controversial. However, what we can say for sure is that it is definitive of pleasure in beauty that it licenses judgments that make claim to correctness. Beyond this, there will be theoretical divergence.
This normativity is definitive of the judgment of taste, and is its second defining characteristic, which we should add to the fact that it is based on subjective grounds of pleasure or displeasure.
We can sum things up like this: judgments of taste occupy a mid-point between judgments of niceness and nastiness, and empirical judgments about the external world. Judgments of taste are like empirical judgments in that they have universal validity; but, they are unlike empirical judgment in that they are made on the basis of an inner response. Conversely, judgments of taste are like judgments of niceness or nastiness in that they are made on the basis of an inner subjective response or experience; but they are unlike judgments of niceness and nastiness which makess no claim to universal validity. To cut the distinctions the other way: in respect of normativity, judgments of taste are like empirical judgments and unlike judgments of niceness or nastiness; but in respect of subjectivity, judgments of taste are unlike empirical judgments and like judgments of niceness or nastiness. So we have three-fold division: empirical judgments, judgments of taste, and judgments of niceness or nastiness. And judgments of taste have the two points of similarity and dissimilarity on each side just noted.
As Kant recognized (more or less following Hume), all this is a point from which to theorize. The hard question is whether, and if so how, such a subjectively universal judgment is possible. On the face of it, the two characteristics are in tension with each other. Our puzzle is this: what must be the nature of pleasure in beauty if the judgments we base on it can make claim to correctness? This is the Big Question in aesthetics. Kant set the right agenda for aesthetics. His problem was the right one, even if his solution was not.
However, our hope thus far has been merely to get a little clearer about what it is that is under scrutiny in this debate. Once we are armed with a modest account of what a judgment of taste is, we can then proceed to more ambitious questions about whether or not judgments of taste represent real properties of beauty and ugliness. We can even consider whether or not our whole practice of making judgments of taste is defective and should be jettisoned. But first things first.
The predicate “aesthetic” can qualify many different kinds of things: judgments, experiences, concepts, properties, or words. It is probably best to take aesthetic judgments as central. We can understand other aesthetic kinds of things in terms of aesthetic judgments: aesthetic properties are those that are ascribed in aesthetic judgments; aesthetic experiences are those that ground aesthetic judgments; aesthetic concepts are those that are deployed in aesthetic judgments; and aesthetic words are those that are typically used in the linguistic expression of aesthetic judgments.
The most common contemporary notion of an aesthetic judgment would take judgments of beauty and ugliness as paradigms -- what I called “judgments of taste” in part 1. And it excludes judgments about physical properties, such as shape and size, and judgments about sensory properties, such as colors and sounds. However, in addition to judgments of beauty and ugliness, the contemporary notion of an aesthetic judgment is typically used to characterize a class of judgments that also includes judgments of daintiness, dumpiness, delicacy and elegance. In this respect, the contemporary notion seems to be broader than Kant's, since he focused just on judgments of beauty and ugliness. However, there is also a respect in which the contemporary notion seems to be narrower than Kant's notion. For Kant used the notion to include both judgments of beauty (or of taste) as well as judgments of the agreeable -- for instance, the judgment that Canary-wine is nice (Kant 1928, pp. 41-42 and p. 54). But the modern notion, unlike Kant's, excludes judgments of the agreeable. The contemporary notion also excludes judgments about pictorial and semantic content. For example, although the judgment that a painting represents a flower might be “relevant” to an aesthetic judgment about it, it is not itself an aesthetic judgment.
The question is: is the contemporary classification arbitrary? What is it that distinguishes these judgments as aesthetic? What do they have in common? And how do they differ from other kinds of judgment? Do these judgments form a well-behaved kind?
Incidentally, it may be worth mentioning that the notion of an aesthetic judgment should obviously not be elucidated in terms in terms of the idea of a work of art: we make aesthetic judgments about nature and we make nonaesthetic judgments about works of art.
The articulation and defence of the notion of the aesthetic in modern times is associated with Monroe Beardsley (1958, 1982) and Frank Sibley (1959, 1965). But their work was attacked by George Dickie, Ted Cohen and Peter Kivy among others (Dickie 1965, Cohen 1973, Kivy 1975).
Beardsley claimed, somewhat heroically, that aesthetic experience is distinguished by its unity, intensity and complexity. Dickie argued, in reply, that such characeristics were either not plausibly necessary conditions of aesthetic experience, or else that Beardsley's description of them was inadequate. Part of Dickie's attack was completely beside the point, since he confused aesthetic experiences with the experiences of works of art; the fact that some experiences of works of art are not as Beardsley describes is, or should be, irrelevant. But it cannot be denied that Dickie was right that even if the problems of characterizing the three features were resolved, it would still not be remotely plausible that the three Beardsleyian features are necessary (or sufficient) conditions of aesthetic experience. Nevertheless, all that would show would be that Beardsley's account of the aesthetic is inadequate. That Beardsley's extraordinary and heroic Trinitarian doctrine cannot be maintained does not mean that the notion of the aesthetic should be abandoned. That would be a flawed induction from a single instance.
Sibley claimed that the discernment of aesthetic properties requires a special sensitivity, whereas the discernment of nonaesthetic properties could be achieved by anyone with normal eyes and ears. Furthermore Sibley claimed that it was distinctive of aesthetic terms or concepts that they were not “condition-governed”, in the sense that they had no nonaesthetic positive criteria for their application. He thought of the faculty of taste as special mental faculty, possessed by people with a special sensitivity. This account of the aesthetic was inadvisable, since it allowed critics like Cohen and Kivy to argue that ascribing aesthetic properties did not in fact require a special faculty, since anyone can distinguish and graceful line from an ungraceful line. Moreover, some aesthetic ascriptions do seem to be nonaesthetically condition-governed, in Sibley's sense. Nevertheless -- once again -- that Sibley's positive account of the aesthetic is implausible should not lead us to despair about the aesthetic. On the other hand, the pessimistic induction, now with two instances under its belt, is perhaps looking a little less unhealthy -- especially given two such distinguished exponents.
Despite this, Sibley was surely minimally right to think that ascribing aesthetic properties to a thing requires more than merely knowing its nonaesthetic properties. Whether or not it is distinctively difficult, erudite, sophisticated or non-condition-governed, aesthetic understanding is something over and above nonaesthetic understanding. So perhaps we should keep on trying to articulate the notion of the aesthetic, or at least a useful notion of the aesthetic.
Let us pursue the following strategy. Begin with the account of what it is to be a judgment of taste, or of beauty and ugliness, that was outlined in part 1, and then use that to elucidate the broader notion of an aesthetic judgment. To recall, it was argued that Kant was right, with qualifications, to think that the crucial thing about the judgment of taste is that it has what he calls “subjective universality”: judgments of taste are those that are (a) based on aesthetic responses, and (b) claim universal validity, where that can be minimally interpreted as a normative aspiration. The present strategy is to use this Kantian account in order to ground a wider category of the aesthetic, which includes judgments of taste along with judgments of daintiness, dumpiness, delicacy, elegance, and the rest.
Let us call judgments of taste, or judgments of beauty and ugliness, “verdictive aesthetic judgments,” and let us call the other aesthetic judgments (of daintiness, dumpiness, elegance, delicacy etc) “substantive aesthetic judgments.” The idea is that these substantive judgments are aesthetic in virtue of a special close relation to verdictive judgments of taste, which are subjectively universal. (We can assume that judgments of beauty and ugliness coincide with judgments of aesthetic merit and demerit. However, even if beauty were taken to be a substantive aesthetic notion, like elegance, delicacy or daintiness, there would remain some other overarching notion of aesthetic merit or excellence, and we could take that notion as central.)
On this approach -- which is unashamedly traditional -- judgments of daintiness, dumpiness, delicacy and elegance stand in a special and intimate relation to judgments of beauty and ugliness (or aesthetic merit and demerit), and it is only in virtue of this intimate relation that we can think of all these judgments as belonging to the same category.
Now, what exactly is this special intimate relation between verdictive and substantive aesthetic judgments? The proposal is this. Firstly, substantive judgments describe ways of being beautiful or ugly (Burton 1992, Zangwill 1995). It is part of what it is for a thing to be elegant, delicate or dainty that it is beautiful in a particular way. And secondly, it is part of the meaning of substantive aesthetic judgments that they imply verdictive aesthetic judgments. This is the hierarchical proposal.
[Remark: this may not be true of words like “dainty” and “delicate,” but it is true of the particular substantive judgments that we linguistically express in such words on particular occasions. Both Beardsley and Sibley, seem to have made the mistake of casting these issues at the linguistic level rather than at the level of thought; they should have focused not on aesthetic words but on aesthetic judgments and responses. (Sibley did say in footnote 1 of Sibley 1959 that he was concerned with “uses” of aesthetic words; but he and everyone else ignored that qualification.)]
Now, let us now see how this hierachical proposal works. Consider an abstract pattern of curving lines, which is elegant. It might be necessary that that pattern is beautiful. This is because the beauty depends on or is determined by that specific pattern. But it is not part of what it is to be that pattern that it is beautiful. That is, the pattern is necessarily beautiful but it is not essentially beautiful. (On the general distinction between necessity and essence, see Fine 1994.) Furthermore, we can think of that pattern without thinking of it as beautiful.
By contrast, it is both necessary and essential that something that is elegant is beautiful. And this is reflected in our concepts and judgments. We can think of the pattern without thereby thinking of it as beautiful, but to think of the pattern as elegant is to think of it as beautiful, at least in certain respects. Hence elegance is an aesthetic concept.
Are representational properties aesthetic properties? Suppose that a painting represents a tree and is a beautiful representation of a tree. It is not merely beautiful and a tree representation but beautiful as a tree representation (Zangwill 1999). Of course, that the painting represents a tree is “relevant” to whether it is beautiful because it is part of what determines its beauty. But being beautiful is not part of what it is to be a representation of a tree. Moreover, to think that the painting represents a tree is not thereby to think that it is beautiful. Being beautiful is not an essential property of the representation, and thinking of the representation does not mean thinking of it as beautiful, even though it is may be necessary that it is beautiful. Hence representational properties are not aesthetic properties.
The hierachical proposal thus seems to characterise a non-arbitrary and useful notion of the aesthetic. The contemporary notion can be vindicated.
Substantive aesthetic judgments have attracted much attention in the latter half of the twentieth century. But to some extent this may have been a mistake, since the role of such judgments is to serve verdictive aesthetic judgments of beauty and ugliness. Beauty and ugliness are the primary aesthetic notions, which give sense to the wider class that contemporary aestheticians include as “aesthetic”. We need a hierarchical rather than an egalitarian conception of aesthetic notions. The broad notion of the aesthetic can be fixed by what it is to judge that something is beautiful or ugly, or that it has aesthetic merit or demerit. Only by seeing beauty and ugliness as the pre-eminent aesthetic notions can we make sense of a unitary category of the aesthetic, which includes the dainty and the dumpy, and which excludes physical, sensory and representational properties of things, as well as their agreeableness. The hierarchical proposal allows us to make the aesthetic/nonaesthetic distinction in a useful way and answer Beardsley and Sibley's critics. Thus the notion of the aesthetic can be defended. That leaves open the deep question of how aesthetic judgments are possible -- a matter not addressed here.