This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Fall 2002 Edition

Entry Content: Guidelines and Policies

In this document, we develop guidelines and policies concerning the content of entries written for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Entry Substance, Style, and Length

The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy is intended to serve as an authoritative reference work suitable for use by professionals and students in the field of philosophy, as well as by all others interested in authoritative discussions on philosophical topics. Entries should therefore be written with the highest of professional standards, and be of interest to as wide an audience as possible. Entries should focus on the philosophical issues and arguments rather than on sociology and individuals, particularly in discussions of topics in contemporary philosophy. In other words, entries should be "idea-driven" and not "people-driven". Bibliographic entries should be critical and not hagiographical. Authors should strive to minimize the use of jargon.

All entries should provide objective, neutral analyses or surveys of particular topics, rather than promoting idiosyncratic or controversial points of view. Authors should see their task as one of offering a broad or insightful perspective which introduces both the topic and the literature and which puts the reader into position to read the primary and secondary sources cited in the entry. (To this end, the sources of all quotations should be clearly identified.) Clarity of substance and style should also be one of the most important goals.

Encyclopedia entries should therefore not be polemical. Controversial claims should be identified as such. Authors should not use the first person pronoun "I", and should avoid such constructions as "as I have argued elsewhere/previously...". In addition, authors should not cite or refer to unpublished or inaccessible materials, and in particular, to unpublished dissertations or talks. Authors should also be circumspect in the number of references to their own work, though obviously, since they are experts on the topic and typically will have written widely on it, occasional references will be in order and appropriate. The editors of the Encyclopedia will ensure that entries do not overstep the bounds of propriety in this regard.

The length of entries should depend on the topic. Entries will typically range from 7,000-8,000 words, but may be anywhere from half this long to twice this long depending on the how broadly the topic is focused and how much literature there is to introduce and explain. We encourage authors to organize longer entries by writing a set of nested, cross-linked documents rather than by writing a single, linear document. By this we mean that overly detailed, highly technical, or highly scholarly material should be put into separate HTML ("supplementary") documents and linked into the main entry. (See below.) This way, the main entry should become readable by an intelligent undergraduate in a sitting of about an hour or two. More advanced readers can follow the links to the highly technical, detailed or scholarly material. Such a cross-linked set of documents will therefore be accessible to a wide audience. However, authors should create such "nested" entries only if it seems unlikely that a separate entry in the Encyclopedia will be created to discuss the supplementary material.

Writing Your Entry in HTML

Because the Encyclopedia is being served over the World Wide Web, all entries must be written in HTML (HyperText Markup Language). This is the formatting language that controls the way text, graphics, and links are displayed in Web browsers. There are now available numerous software programs known as "HTML-editors" or "web authoring tools" and these allow the authors to format text and graphics in HTML easily, without learning any arcane commands. These programs are now as easy to use as Microsoft Word.

To begin writing an entry, authors should follow our instructions for downloading the sourcefile of the "Entry Template". Once the template is downloaded, the author may simply "Open" that file using an HTML-editor. This Entry Template will ensure that there is a uniform entry style, which is described below, in the section on "Entry Format".

For those authors who prefer to create an HTML sourcefile directly, without the assistance of an HTML-editor, we've indicated, in our instructions, how to obtain the "Annotated Sourcefile". After downloading the sourcefile, authors can replace the sample text in this file with their own content. This will minimize the number of HTML commands authors will need to learn.

Note that it is easy to create a link from your main entry to supplementary documents containing overly technical or scholarly material that would interfere with the presentation of the main ideas. To create a link from the main document to a supplementary document, suppose that the main document is entitled "index.html" and the supplementary document is entitled "supplement.html". Now suppose that at the end of a paragraph, you wish place a labeled link to the supplementary document. Here is what the link might be displayed as:

... . We discuss this last point in further detail in the following supplementary document:
Supplement on [Title of Supplement]
Authors using an HTML-editor (such as Netscape Composer, Adobe Page Mill, Front Page Express, etc.) will have to use the functions provided by their software to create such a link. However, authors who can edit their HTML sourcefiles directly would insert the following HTML code in order to produce this link to the supplementary document: the following supplementary document.
<a href="supplement.html" name="return-1">Supplement on [Title of Supplement]</a>
Note that this can be done in other places in your main document, if you have more than one supplementary document. (You will have to name your supplements as "supplement1.html", "supplement2.html", etc.) You can find the sourcefile for the supplement template here (use the View Source function of your browser after following this link).

Entry Format

The Entry Template and Annotated Sourcefile are formatted in HTML so that the following divisions are preserved in every entry: These are discussed in turn.

Introduction. The Introduction should contain a brief definition of the subject. This may take one or two paragraphs, and if possible, these paragraphs should contain some statement of the subject's interest and significance. The main topics to be covered in the body of the entry may be mentioned here, so that the reader will get some idea of what is to follow.

Internal Links. The internal links should be a list of the main sections of the entry, and each item in the list should be a link to that section. The HTML commands needed to do this are included in the template and in the annotated sourcefile.

Main Sections. The sectioning of the entry is at the discretion of the author. However, we encourage authors to include a Chronology or "Life" section in Biographical entries. Moreover, a "History" section is called for in the discussion of many topics.

Bibliography. Please use the following bibliographic format:

With this style of Bibliography, you can then cite these sources in your main text with the indication "(Dodson 1885, 32-33)".

Please note: (1) The Bibliography section may be divided into subsections such as Primary Literature and Secondary Literature, or References Cited and Other Important Works, etc. and (2) he Bibliography is reserved primarily for refereed material, whether print-based or on the web. Books, journal articles, e-journal articles, etc., which have undergone the normal referee process of legitimate presses should be included. Whenever a cited article or book is available online, a link may be included to the URL.

Other Internet Resources. The author should cite material on the web that is of excellent value but which may not have undergone a referee process. The author serves as referee for these materials (and our subject editors will referee these choices). To complete this section, authors are encouraged to conduct an on-line search of the Web for websites with high-quality, academic content on the topic in question. Such websites should be written and maintained by qualified individuals having a clear expertise on the topic. The task of finding such external websites is made considerably simpler by using the Limited Area Search Engines for philosophy, such as Hippias and Noesis. They can be found at the URLs:
If this doesn't yield any results, you should try one of the wider area search engines, such as Google or Alta Vista, which can be found at:
Other search engines include and Please do not create links to websites that are not maintained by qualified individuals.

Related Entries. Please list the names of the most important concepts and philosophers that occur in your entry. You may list keywords that do not appear as topics in our Table of Contents if you feel that they are important. We are running software which will notice the discrepancy and alert the Editor. A decision will be made whether or not to include a new entry on that topic. If we decide that the topic is too specialized or otherwise inappropriate for the Encyclopedia, we will eliminate this keyword from your list in the Related Entries section.

Entry Revision

Because the Encyclopedia is designed to be a dynamic reference work, authors are responsible for maintaining and periodically updating their entries. Specifically, authors are expected: (1) to update their entries regularly, especially in response to important new research on the topic of the entry, and (2) to revise their entries in a timely way in light of any valid criticism they receive, whether it comes from the subject editors on our Editorial Board, other members of the profession, or interested readers. In connection with (1), authors should update the Bibliography and the Other Internet Resources sections of their entries regularly, to keep pace with significant new publications, both in print and on the web. In connection with (2), the validity of criticism shall be determined by the Editor, typically in consultation with the relevant members of the Editorial Board. The length of time required for a "timely" revision will be negotiable and will both respect the author's current commitments and reflect the seriousness of the criticism. However, entries which require revision but which are not revised within the negotiated timetable may be retired from the active portion of the Encyclopedia and left in the Encyclopedia Archives until such time as the entry is revised so as to engage the valid criticisms in question.

Making Modifications: There is a preferred, recommended, and easy to use protocol for making changes to your entry. If you would like to add/revise a paragraph, add an item to the Bibliography, fix a typo, etc., the the proper procedure to follow is to log in to our Author Area:
and initiate the action "Revise Entry on Server". This will allow you to directly edit a copy of your entry on our machine (from whichever browser you are using). There is an Instructions/Help file for using this software. However, as you will see, when you use the Revise Entry function, you will be prompted to select the file you wish to edit. In most cases, you will select the main document, which is called "index.html" (some entries have multiple files, e.g., a main document "index.html" and supplementary documents). Once you have made your selection, a new window will open on your browser and you will be presented with a page on which the file you wanted to edit is divided up into segments, each containing a "View" box and an "Edit" box. You will find the material you wish to edit in the View box, since the text in this box is rendered, or formatted, HTML. Then you edit in the corresponding "Edit" box, which contains the HTML sourcefile (which is plain text with markup tags). It should be clear how add content in the Edit box. Every so often, you should SAVE your work, using the Save buttons at the left or at the top of the page. You may SAVE your work without submitting it for review, but when you believe you have completed the revisions you need to make, use the Save/Submit option, or return to the authors main menu page and use the Submit/Resubmit Privates Files to Editor function.

Making Major Modifications: There are only two conditions under which it is acceptable to follow a somewhat different procedure. (1) If you know the difference between a simple text editor and an HTML-editor, and you know that your simple text editor can be used to edit an HTML sourcefile without damaging or rewriting the HTML, then you may use the Download Existing Entry File function, edit the file using your simple text editor in plain text mode, save as plain text, and then reupload the file. (2) If you need to make major modifications to your entry, such as a structural reorganization, then it may be inappropriate to use the Revise Entry on Server function. In this case, you would use the Download Existing File function and edit it locally on your computer. However, before you begin to make major modifications to your entry (e.g., by downloading and editing locally), please note that many HTML-editors (Word, Netscape Composer, Dreamweaver, Adobe Page Mill, etc.) do not follow international standards for producing correct HTML. Some add special control characters to the file; others make changes to the HTML, following their own conception of how HTML should be written. So, if you can, please make major modifications to your entry by using a simple text editor and by saving the file as plain text (an HTML file is a plain text file in which special pieces of plain text, e.g., "tags" such as <em>, are used to "markup the text" in a way that gives formatting instructions to the web browser). Though a simple text editor will show you all the HTML markup tags, it should be easy to find your way around the file and edit the portions you are interested in. By using a simple text editor, you save us the trouble of having to reprocess (sometimes by hand) the HTML produced by these unfriendly HTML-editors.

After after editing your file, it should then be uploaded back to the Encyclopedia by using our Author Area and the "Upload Single File" action.

The Use of Footnotes

Footnotes may be included. Then can often help to shorten the main page of the entry, to make it more readable. The footnotes themselves should be put into a separate html file called "notes.html" and these should be placed into the same directory on as the entry. If you are using an HTML-editor to create your entry, then you will need to use the functions provided by your software in order to create foonotes as links to a footnote file.

However, for those authors who wish to edit their HTML sourcefile directly in order to create links from the text to the footnotes, here are some guidelines to follow. Suppose you want to add footnote number x at a point in the text:

...some text.[x]

To produce this in your HTML sourcefile, use the following HTML code at the point in the text where the footnote should occur:

...some text.<sup>[<a href="notes.html#x" name="note-x">x</a>]</sup>

This will place "[x]" as a superscript in the text, with "x" a link to the place in the notes.html file identified as name="x" (see below). The name="note-x" marks the spot in the current file to which a "Return" link from the notes.html file will return (again, see below). Then, create another HTML file named "notes.html" and in that file you will try to produce something that looks like this:

x. Begin the body of the footnote here.

To produce this line in the notes.html file, you would add the following HTML code:

<a href="index.html#note-x" name="x">x.</a> Begin the body of the footnote.

This will start a new paragraph, start the footnote with the symbols "x." ("x." will be a link back to name="note-x" in the main index.html file; the name="x" identifies the place in the notes.html file to which the footnote in the main text will be linked). Note: Users of the Encyclopedia can always use the "Back" or "Return" button on their browsers to get back to the text.

The Use of Special Symbols

Although the specifications for the HTML4.0 language does include support for a variety of special symbols, including Greek, logic and math symbols, there is little support for arranging these symbols on the page in the variety of ways needed by mathematicians and logicians. A new standard for typesetting mathematical and logical formulas is developing, namely, MathML. See W3C Math: MathML puts Math on the Web. However, it will be sometime before web browsers are reprogrammed to meet this standard. So, for now, we would ask you not to employ the MathML standard or the symbols that are supported in HTML4.0.

In the meantime, if the special symbol you need is not on this list of special HTML characters which is widely supported, we have created a wide variety of small graphics of the Greek, logic, and math symbols that logicians and others typically use. These symbols are located at the URL:

Table of Symbols
For example, we have produced the following graphic of the symbol for the "set membership" relation:
This symbol can be found at the URL displayed above and you can download it onto your machine from there. Follow the link to "element.gif" in the table for Math symbols. You can then save that graphic onto the drive of your local computer.

If you are using an HTML-editor to create your entry, then you simply use your software's "add image" ("add graphic") function to place this graphic in your entry. However, those authors who are editing their HTML sourcefiles directly should use the following guidelines. To produce the formatted line:

x y
place the file "element.gif" into the directory containing your HTML entry and use the following HTML code in your entry:
<em>x</em> <img src="element.gif"> <em>y</em>
Note that you will not need to transfer the graphics to the same directory on plato when you transfer your entry to us -- the first time you view your file on our server after uploading it, our software will recognize the links to our graphics and it will automatically install copies of the needed graphic files into your upload directory.

You may use any graphic found in our symbols directory in this way. If you need a symbol not found in that directory, write to the editor---they are easily constructed.