Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Teleological Notions in Biology
Teleological terms such as "function" and "design" appear frequently
in the biological sciences. Examples of teleological claims include:
- A (biological) function of stotting by antelopes is to
communicate to predators that they have been detected.
- Eagles' wings are (naturally) designed for soaring.
Teleological notions were commonly associated with the
pre-Darwinian view that the biological realm provides evidence of
conscious design by a supernatural creator. Even after creationist
viewpoints were rejected by most biologists there remained various
grounds for concern about the role of teleology in biology, including
whether such terms are:
Opinions divide over whether Darwin's theory of evolution provides a
means of eliminating teleology from biology, or whether it provides a
naturalistic account of the role of teleological notions in the
science. Many contemporary biologists and philosophers of biology
believe that teleological notions are a distinctive and ineliminable
feature of biological explanations but that it is possible to provide
a naturalistic account of their role that avoids the concerns above.
Terminological issues sometimes serve to obscure some widely-accepted
- vitalistic (positing some special "life-force");
- requiring backwards causation (because future outcomes explain
- incompatible with mechanistic explanation (because of 1 and 2);
- mentalistic (attributing the action of mind where there is none);
- empirically untestable (for all the above reasons).
Teleomentalists regard the teleology of psychological
intentions, goals, and purposes as the primary model for understanding
teleology in biology. Aside from creationism, the most common form of
teleomentalist view is that teleological claims in biology are mere
metaphor---describing and explaining biological phenomena on the basis
of more or less loose comparisons to psychological teleology. Those
who hold teleology in biology to be metaphorical in nature typically
regard it as eliminable; i.e., they believe that the science of biology would not be essentially altered if all references to teleology were eschewed.
Those who reject teleomentalism typically seek naturalistic truth
conditions for teleological claims in biology that do not refer to the
intentions, goals, or purposes of psychological agents. Some
teleonaturalists seek to reduce teleological language to forms
of description and explanation that are found in other parts of
science. One class of such views defines teleological notions
cybernetically and maintains that teleology in biology is appropriate
insofar as biological systems are cybernetic systems. Another, more
widely-accepted approach treats functional claims in biology as part
of the analysis of the capacities of a complex system into various
Other forms of teleonaturalism regard the teleological aspects of
biology as unique and ineliminable. One class of such views maintains
that teleological claims in biology depend on natural values that
apply to biological entities (such as what is good for an organism or
species). A different approach, that avoids normative notions, is to
define biological teleology explicitly in terms of natural selection
and the theory of evolution.
Several theorists have argued for the pluralistic idea that biology
may incorporate two notions of function, one to explain the presence
of traits and the other to explain how those traits contribute to the
complex capacities of organisms. Others have argued that these two
apparently distinct notions of function can be unified by regarding
the target of explanation as the biological fitness of a whole
organism. Nonetheless, the mainstream view among philosophers of
biology is that natural selection accounts best explain the majority
of uses of teleological notions in biology.
Accounts of biological function which refer to natural selection
typically have the form that a trait's function or functions
causally explain the existence or maintenance of that trait in a given
population via the mechanism of natural selection. Three
components of this view can be usefully separated:
Variations on this account mostly center on the first two points.
- Functional claims in biology are intended to explain
the existence or maintenance of a trait in a given
- Biological functions are causally relevant to the
existence or maintenance of traits via the mechanism
of natural selection;
- Functional claims in biology are fully grounded in
natural selection and are not derivative of
psychological uses of notions such as design,
intention, and purpose.
In the debate about biological teleology, relatively little attention
has been paid to the notion of natural design. It is common for
authors to slide between claims about function and design as if they
accept this principle:
- Some theorists maintain a distinction between the initial spread
of a new phenotypic trait in a population from the maintenance of
traits in populations.
- Some theorists adopt an etiological or backward-looking
approach that analyzes the function of a trait only in terms of
those effects of the trait which have in the past contributed to
the selection of organisms with that trait. Others adopt
a dispositional or forward-looking approach that analyzes
function in terms of those effects it is disposed to produce that
tend to contribute to the present or future maintenance of the
trait in a population of organisms.
A trait T is naturally designed for
X if and only if X is a biological function of T.
Collapsing the notions of design and function in this manner has
the advantage that if the notion of biological function is
successfully naturalized then so is the notion of natural design.
The biological notion of design seems, however, to imply more than
mere usefulness. Female turtles use their flippers to dig nests in
sand, and doing so surely accounts for the maintenance of the trait in
the population. So, on an etiological account, digging in sand is a
function of the flippers. Yet it seems wrong to say that they are
designed for that purpose. This suggests that function and design
should be analyzed separately. One way to do this is as follows:
Trait T is naturally designed to do X means that
With respect to this analysis, to say that an eagle's wings are
designed for soaring is to claim, first, that the ability to soar (as
opposed to other kinds of flying) explains why some ancestral eagles
had higher reproductive fitness than others and, second, that eagles'
wings are better adapted for soaring than were ancestral versions of
the wings. This second part is an historical claim that might be
checked against the fossil record.
The notion of adaptation is controversial among biologists because
it suggests the Panglossian belief that this is the best of all
possible worlds. However comparative judgments about traits of
organisms, e.g., that the traits of present organisms are better at
producing some effect than the corresponding traits of ancestral
organisms, do not require the Panglossian assumption. This is because
the claim that A is more optimal or better adapted than B with respect
to some function does not entail that A is optimal or even good with
respect to that function.
- X is a biological function of T and
- T is the result of a process of change of (anatomical
or behavioral) structure due to natural selection that
has resulted in T being more optimal (or better adapted)
for X than ancestral versions of T.
Gould & Vrba (1982) would deny that sand-digging is a function
of turtle flippers and prefer instead to label it an "exaptation".
They recommend the use of "function" only when natural selection has
"shaped" a trait for some use -- i.e. the trait has undergone some
modification in form that makes it more suited to the use. This
recommendation, however, seeks to change ordinary biological usage
rather than to elucidate it. Because it conflates the notions of
design and function, it becomes necessary to mark the distinction
between cases of selection with modification (function/design) and
cases where a trait of an organism is coopted for a use for which it
is not modified (exaptation). Even if the flippers of turtles are not
specially modified for burying eggs in sand, the fact that they were
so used helps to explain why turtles with flippers were selected over
those without. Whether one prefers to call this a function or an
exaptation is a terminological issue perhaps to be settled by one's
taste for neologisms.
- Allen, C. and Bekoff, M. "Function, natural design, and animal
behavior: philosophical and ethological considerations," in
N.S. Thompson (ed.) Perspectives in Ethology, Volume 11: Behavioral
Design. (1995) NY: Plenum Press, pp.1-47.
- Allen, C. and Bekoff, M. "Biological function, adaptation, and
natural design," Philosophy of Science: 62 (1995): 609-622.
- Gould, S.J. and Vrba, E.S. "Exaptation - a missing term in the
science of form," Paleobiology 8 (1982): 4-15.
- Mayr, E. "The multiple meanings of teleological," in Towards a
New Philosophy of Biology. Harvard University Press (1988),
Cambridge, MA: 38-66.
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First published: March 20, 1996
Content last modified: June 17, 1999