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Notes to The Hole Argument

In general, the class of theories in which the hole argument is
mounted are "local spacetime theories." These are theories whose
models consist of n+1 tuples

2.
The distinction at issue here is between the passive and active
reading of general covariance. Passive general covariance allows use
of all coordinate charts of the differential manifold and is conferred
automatically on theories formulated by modern methods. Active general
covariance considers the dual point transformations induced by
coordinate transformations. These amount to diffeomorphisms on the
manifold M and the transformations of the fields correspond to maps
that associate an object field O with its carry along h^{*}O
under diffeomorphism h.

The need to convert Einstein's original analysis from passive to active transformations is awkward. I have argued that the distinction between them was not so clear cut when Einstein originally formulated the hole argument because of the more impoverished mathematical environment in which he worked and that this is responsible for much of the present confusion in interpreting Einstein's pronouncements on coordinate systems. See Norton (1989, 1992).

3. That is, a hole transformation is a diffeomorphism on M that is the identity outside some arbitrarily selected neighborhood but comes smoothly to differ from the identity within that neighborhood. For an explicit construction of such a transformation, see Muller (1995).

4. More generally, manifold substantivalism asserts that the manifold M of local spacetime theories is the mathematical structure that represents spacetime.

5.
For any spacetime model (M, O_{1}, ..., O_{n}) and
any diffeomorphism on M, Leibniz equivalence asserts that the two
models

6. The general form of the argument is essentially identical. The first sentence is generalized to read:

1.If one has two models of a local spacetime theory (M, O_{1}, ..., O_{n}) and (hM, h^{*}O_{1}, ..., h^{*}O_{n}) related by a hole transformation h, manifold substantivalists must maintain that the two systems represent two distinct physical systems.

Note also that statements 1 and 2 are premises. Statement 3 is the
conclusion drawn from them. There is a suppressed premise that it is
inadmissible to load up a physical theory with hidden properties that
outstrip both observation and the determining power of the theory.

John D. Norton

*First published: February 1, 1999*

*Content last modified: February 15, 1999*