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- The Conventionality Thesis
- Phenomenological Counterarguments
- Transport of Clocks
- Malament's Theorem
- Other Considerations
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

The thesis that the choice of standard synchrony is a convention,
rather than one necessitated by facts about the physical universe
(within the framework of the special theory of relativity), has been
argued particularly by Reichenbach (see, for example, Reichenbach,
1958, pp. 123-135) and Grünbaum (see, for example,
Grünbaum, 1973, pp. 342-368). They argue that the only
nonconventional basis for claiming that two distinct events are not
simultaneous would be the possibility of a causal influence
connecting the events. In the pre-Einsteinian view of the universe,
there was no reason to rule out the possibility of arbitrarily fast
causal influences, which would then be able to single out a unique
event at A that would be simultaneous with E. In an Einsteinian
universe, however, no causal influence can travel faster than the
speed of light in vacuum, so from the point of view of Reichenbach
and Grünbaum, any event at A whose time of occurrence is in the
open interval between t_{1} and t_{2} could be
defined to be simultaneous with E. In terms of the
-notation introduced by
Reichenbach, any event at A occurring at a time t_{1} +
(t_{2} - t_{1}), where
0 <
< 1, could be
simultaneous with E. That is, the conventionality thesis asserts that
any particular choice of
within
its stated range is a matter of convention, including the choice
=1/2 (which corresponds to standard
synchrony). If
differs from 1/2, the one-way speeds of a light ray would differ (in an
-dependent
fashion) on the two segments of its round-trip journey between A and
B. If, more generally, we consider light traveling on an arbitrary
closed path in three-dimensional space, then (as shown by Minguzzi,
2002, pp.155-156) the freedom of choice in the one-way speeds of
light amounts to the choice of an arbitrary scalar field (although
two scalar fields that differ only by an additive constant would give
the same assignment of one-way speeds).

It might be argued that the definition of standard synchrony makes use only of the relation of equality (of the one-way speeds of light in different directions), so that simplicity dictates its choice rather than a choice that requires the specification of a particular value for a parameter. Grünbaum (1973, p. 356) rejects this argument on the grounds that, since the equality of the one-way speeds of light is a convention, this choice does not simplify the postulational basis of the theory but only gives a symbolically simpler representation.

It has been argued (see, for example, Janis, 1983, pp. 103-105, and Norton, 1986, p. 119) that all such schemes for establishing convention-free synchrony must fail. The argument can be summarized as follows: Suppose that clocks are set in standard synchrony, and consider the detailed space-time description of the proposed synchronization procedure that would be obtained with the use of such clocks. Next suppose that the clocks are reset in some nonstandard fashion (consistent with the causal order of events), and consider the description of the same sequence of events that would be obtained with the use of the reset clocks. In such a description, familiar laws may take unfamiliar forms, as in the case of the law of conservation of momentum in the example mentioned above. Indeed, all of special relativity has been reformulated (in an unfamiliar form) in terms of nonstandard synchronies (Winnie, 1970a and 1970b). Since the proposed synchronization procedure can itself be described in terms of a nonstandard synchrony, the scheme cannot describe a sequence of events that is incompatible with nonstandard synchrony. A comparison of the two descriptions makes clear what hidden assumptions in the scheme are equivalent to standard synchrony.

One objection to the use of the slow-transport scheme to synchronize clocks is that, until the clocks are synchronized, there is no way of measuring the one-way velocity of the transported clock. Bridgman (1962, p. 26) uses the "self-measured" velocity, determined by using the transported clock to measure the time interval, to avoid this problem. Using this meaning of velocity, he suggests (1962, pp. 64-67) a modified procedure that is equivalent to Eddington's, but does not require having started in the infinite past. Bridgman would transport a number of clocks from A to B at various velocities; the readings of these clocks at B would differ. He would then pick one clock, say the one whose velocity was the smallest, and find the differences between its reading and the readings of the other clocks. Finally, he would plot these differences against the velocities of the corresponding clocks, and extrapolate to zero velocity. Like Eddington, Bridgman does not see this scheme as contradicting the conventionality thesis. He says (1962, p.66), "What becomes of Einstein's insistence that his method for setting distant clocks -- that is, choosing the value 1/2 for -- constituted a ‘definition’ of distant simultaneity? It seems to me that Einstein's remark is by no means invalidated."

Ellis and Bowman (1967) take a different point of view. Their means of synchronizing clocks by slow transport (1967, pp. 129-130) is again somewhat different from, but equivalent to, those already mentioned. They would place clocks at A and B with arbitrary settings. They would then place a third clock at A and synchronize it with the one already there. Next they would move this third clock to B with a velocity they refer to as the "intervening ‘velocity’", determined by using the clocks in place at A and B to measure the time interval. They would repeat this procedure with decreasing velocities and extrapolate to find the zero-velocity limit of the difference between the readings of the clock at B and the transported clock. Finally, they would set the clock at B back by this limiting amount. On the basis of their analysis of this procedure, they argue that, although consistent nonstandard synchronization appears to be possible, there are good physical reasons (assuming the correctness of empirical predictions of the special theory of relativity) for preferring standard synchrony. Their conclusion (as summarized in the abstract of their 1967, p. 116) is, "The thesis of the conventionality of distant simultaneity espoused particularly by Reichenbach and Grünbaum is thus either trivialized or refuted."

A number of responses to these views of Ellis and Bowman (see, for
example, Grünbaum et al., 1969; Winnie, 1970b, pp. 223-228; and
Redhead, 1993, pp. 111-113) argue that nontrivial conventions are
implicit in the choice to synchronize clocks by the slow-transport
method. For example, Grünbaum (Grünbaum et al., 1969, pp.
5-43) argues that it is a nontrivial convention to equate the time
interval measured by the infinitely slowly moving clock traveling
from A to B with the interval measured by the clock remaining at A
and in standard synchrony with that at B, and the conclusion of van
Fraassen (Grünbaum et al., 1969, p. 73) is, "Ellis and Bowman
have not proved that the standard simultaneity relation is
nonconventional, which it is not, but have succeeded in exhibiting
some *alternative conventions* which also yield that
simultaneity relation." Winnie (1970b), using his reformulation of
special relativity in terms of arbitrary synchrony, shows explicitly
that synchrony by slow-clock transport agrees with synchrony by the
standard light-signal method when both are described in terms of an
arbitrary value of
within the range 0 <
< 1, and argues that Ellis and
Bowman err in having assumed the
=1/2 form of
the time-dilation formula in their arguments. He concludes (Winnie,
1970b, p. 228) that "it is not possible that the method of
slow-transport, or any other synchrony method, could, within the
framework of the *nonconventional* ingredients of the Special
Theory, result in fixing *any* particular value of
to the exclusion of any other
particular values." Redhead (1993) also argues that slow transport of
clocks fails to give a convention-free definition of simultaneity. He
says (1993, p. 112), "There is no absolute factual sense in the term
‘slow.’ If we estimate ‘slow’ relative to a
moving frame K', then slow-clock-transport will pick out
standard synchrony in K', but this ... corresponds to
nonstandard synchrony in K."

An alternative clock-transport scheme, which avoids the issue of
slowness, is to have the clock move from A to B and back again (along
straight paths in each direction) with the same self-measured speed
throughout the round trip (Mamone Capria, 2001, pp. 812-813; as
Mamone Capria notes, his scheme is similar to those propoosed by
Brehme, 1985, pp. 57-58, and 1988, pp. 811-812). If the moving clock
leaves A at time t_{1} (as measured by a clock at rest
there), arrives at B coincident with the event E at B, and arrives
back at A at the time t_{2}, then standard synchrony is
obtained by saying that E is simultaneous with the event at A that
occurred at the time (t_{1} + t_{2})/2. It would seem
that this transport scheme is sufficiently similar to the
slow-transport scheme that it could engender much the same debate,
apart from those aspects of the debate that focussed specifically on
the issue of slowness.

Some commentators have taken Malament's theorem to have settled
the debate on the side of nonconventionality. For example, Torretti
(1983, p. 229) says, "Malament proved that simultaneity by standard
synchronism in an inertial frame F is the *only* non-universal
equivalence between events at different points of F that is definable
(‘in any sense of "definable" no matter how weak’) in terms
of causal connectibility alone, for a given F"; and Norton (Salmon et
al., 1992, p. 222) says, "Contrary to most expectations, [Malament]
was able to prove that the central claim about simultaneity of the
causal theorists of time was false. He showed that the standard
simultaneity relation was the only nontrivial simultaneity relation
definable in terms of the causal structure of a Minkowski spacetime
of special relativity."

Other commentators disagree with such arguments, however. Grünbaum (as reported by Norton in Salmon et al., 1992, p. 226) and Redhead (1993, p.114) cite Malament's need to postulate that S is an equivalence relation as a weakness in the argument. Havas (1987, p. 444) says, "What Malament has shown, in fact, is that in Minkowski space-time ... one can always introduce time-orthogonal coordinates ..., an obvious and well-known result which implies =1/2." Janis (1983, pp. 107-109) argues that Malament's theorem leads to a unique (but different) synchrony relative to any inertial observer, that this latitude is the same as that in introducing Reichenbach's , and thus Malament's theorem should carry neither more nor less weight against the conventionality thesis than the argument (mentioned above in the last paragraph of the first section of this article) that standard synchrony is the simplest choice. Similarly, Redhead (1993, p. 114) says that "we can use the same argument as we did for slow-clock-transport to demonstrate that we are faced with a conventional choice betweeen standard synchronies defined à la Malament in all possible inertial frames." In a comprehensive review of the problem of the conventionality of simultaneity, Anderson, Vetharaniam, and Stedman (1998, pp. 124-125) claim that Malament's proof is erroneous. Although they appear to be wrong in this claim, the nature of their error highlights the fact that Malament's proof, which uses the time-symmetric relation , would not be valid if a temporal orientation were introduced into space-time (see, for example, Spirtes, 1981, Ch. VI, Sec. F; and Stein, 1991, p. 153n).

Sarkar and Stachel (1999) argue that there is no physical warrant for the requirement that a simultaneity relation be invariant under temporal reflections. Dropping that requirement, they show that Malament's other criteria for a simultaneity relation are then also satisfied if we fix some arbitrary event in space-time and say either that any pair of events on its backward null cone are simultaneous or, alternatively, that any pair of events on its forward null cone are simultaneous. They show further that, among the relations satisfying these requirements, standard synchrony is the unique such relation that is independent of the position of an observer and the half-null-cone relations are the unique such relations that are independent of the motion of an observer. If the backward-cone relation were chosen, then simultaneous events would be those seen simultaneously by an observer at the cone's vertex. As Sarkar and Stachel (1999, p. 209) note, Einstein (1905, p. 39 of the Dover translation or p. 126 of the Princeton translation) considered this possibility and rejected it because of its dependence on the position of the observer. Since the half-null-cone relations define causally connectible events to be simultaneous, it would seem that they would also be rejected by adherents of the views of Reichenbach and Grünbaum.

Giulini (2001, p.653) argues that it is too strong a requirement to
ask that a simultaneity relation be invariant under causal
transformations (such as scale transformations) that are not physical
symmetries, which Malament as well as Sarkar and Stachel do. Using
"Aut" to refer to the appropriate invariance group and "nontrivial"
to refer to an equivalence relation on spacetime that is neither one
in which all points are in the same equivalence class nor one in
which each point is in a different equivalence class, Giulini (2001,
pp. 657-658) defines two types of simultaneity: Absolute simultaneity
is a nontrivial Aut-invariant equivalence relation on spacetime such
that each equivalence class intersects any physically realizable
timelike trajectory in at most one point, and simultaneity relative
to some structure X in spacetime (for Malament, X is the world line
of an inertial observer) is a nontrivial Aut_{X}-invariant
equivalence relation on spacetime such that each equivalence class
intersects any physically realizable timelike trajectory in at most
one point, where Aut_{X} is the subgroup of Aut that
preserves X. First taking Aut to be the inhomogeneous (i.e.,
including translations) Galilean transformations, Giulini (2001,
pp. 660-662) shows that standard Galilean (i.e., pre-relativistic)
simultaneity is the unique absolute simultaneity relation. Then
taking Aut to be the inhomogeneous Lorentz tansformations (also known
as the Poincaré transformations), Giulini (2001, pp. 664-666)
shows that there is no absolute simultaneity relation and that
standard Einsteinian synchrony is the unique relative simultaneity
when X is taken to be a foliation of spacetime by straight lines
(thus, like Malament, singling out a specific inertial frame, but in
a way that is different from Malament's choice of X).

A claim that no value of other than 1/2 is mathematically possible has been put forward by Zangari (1994). He argues that spin-1/2 particles (e.g., electrons) must be represented mathematically by what are known as complex spinors, and that the transformation properties of these spinors are not consistent with the introduction of nonstandard coordinates (corresponding to values of other than 1/2). Gunn and Vetharaniam (1995), however, present a derivation of the Dirac equation (the fundamental equation describing spin-1/2 particles) using coordinates that are consistent with arbitrary synchrony. They argue that Zangari mistakenly required a particular representation of space-time points as the only one consistent with the spinorial description of spin-1/2 particles.

The debate about conventionality of simultaneity seems far from settled, although some proponents on both sides of the argument might disagree with that statement. The reader wishing to pursue the matter further should consult the sources listed below as well as additional references cited in those sources.

- Anderson, R., Vetharaniam, I., and Stedman, G. 1998.
"Conventionality of Synchronisation, Gauge Dependence and Test Theories
of Relativity,"
*Physics Reports***295**, 93-180. - Brehme, R. 1985. "Response to ‘The Conventionality of
Synchronization’,"
*American Journal of Physics***53**, 56-59. - Brehme, R. 1988. "On the Physical Reality of the Isotropic Speed
of Light,"
*American Journal of Physics***56**, 811-813. - Bridgman, P. 1962.
*A Sophisticate's Primer of Relativity*. Middletown: Wesleyan University Press. - Eddington, A. 1924.
*The Mathematical Theory of Relativity*, 2nd ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Einstein, A. 1905. "Zur Elektrodynamik bewegter Körper,"
*Annalen der Physik***17**, 891-921. English translations in*The Principle of Relativity*, pp. 35-65. New York: Dover, 1952; and in J. Stachel, ed.,*Einstein's Miraculous Year*, pp. 123-160. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1998. - Ellis, B. and Bowman, P. 1967. "Conventionality in Distant
Simultaneity,"
*Philosophy of Science***34**, 116-136. - Feinberg, G. 1967. "Possibility of Faster-Than-Light Particles,"
*Physical Review***159**, 1089-1105. - Giulini, D. 2001. "Uniqueness of Simultaneity,"
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science***52**, 651-670. - Grünbaum, A. 1973.
*Philosophical Problems of Space and Time*, 2nd, enlarged ed. (*Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science*, vol. 12). Dordrecht/Boston: D. Reidel. - Grünbaum, A., Salmon, W., van Fraassen, B., and Janis, A.
1969. "A Panel Discussion of Simultaneity by Slow Clock Transport in
the Special and General Theories of Relativity,"
*Philosophy of Science***36**, 1-81. - Gunn, D. and Vetharaniam, I. 1995. "Relativistic Quantum Mechanics
and the Conventionality of Simultaneity,"
*Philosophy of Science***62**, 599-608. - Havas, P. 1987. "Simultaneity, Conventionalism, General Covariance,
and the Special Theory of Relativity,"
*General Relativity and Gravitation***19**, 435-453. - Janis, A. 1983. "Simultaneity and Conventionality," in R. Cohen and
L. Laudan, eds.,
*Physics, Philosophy and Psychoanalysis*(*Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science*, vol. 76), pp. 101-110. Dordrecht/Boston: D. Reidel. - Malament, D. 1977. "Causal Theories of Time and the Conventionality
of Simultaniety,"
*Noûs***11**, 293-300. - Mamone Capria, M. 2001. "On the Conventionality of Simultaneity
in Special Relativity,"
*Foundations of Physics***31**, 775-818. - Minguzzi, E. 2002. "On the Conventionality of Simultaneity,"
*Foundations of Physics Letters***15**, 153-169. - Norton, J. 1986. "The Quest for the One Way Velocity of Light,"
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science***37**, 118-120. - Pirani, F. 1970. "Noncausal Behavior of Classical Tachyons,"
*Physical Review***D1**, 3224-3225. - Redhead M. 1993. "The Conventionality of Simultaneity," in J.
Earman, A. Janis, G. Massey, and N. Rescher, eds.,
*Philosophical Problems of the Internal and External Worlds*, pp. 103-128. Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press; Konstanz: Universitätsverlag Konstanz. - Reichenbach H. 1958.
*The Philosophy of Space & Time*. New York: Dover. - Salmon, M., Earman, J., Glymour, C., Lennox, J., Machamer, P.,
McGuire, J., Norton, J., Salmon, W., and Schaffner, K. 1992.
*Introduction to the Philosophy of Science*. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall. - Salmon, W. 1977. "The Philosophical Significance of the One-Way
Speed of Light,"
*Noûs***11**, 253-292. - Sarkar, S. and Stachel, J. 1999. "Did Malament Prove the
Non-Conventionality of Simultaneity in the Special Theory of
Relativity?"
*Philosophy of Science***66**, 208-220. - Scribner, C. 1963. "Mistranslation of a Passage in Einstein's
Original Paper on Relativity,"
*American Journal of Physics***31**, 398. - Spirtes, P. 1981.
*Conventionalism and the Philosophy of Henri Poincaré*. Ph. D. Dissertation, University of Pittsburgh. - Stein, H. 1991. "On Relativity Theory and Openness of the Future,"
*Philosophy of Science***58**, 147-167. - Torretti, R. 1983.
*Relativity and Geometry*. Oxford/New York: Pergamon. - Winnie, J. 1970a. "Special Relativity Without One-Way Velocity
Assumptions: Part I,"
*Philosophy of Science***37**, 81-99. - Winnie, J. 1970b. "Special Relativity Without One-Way Velocity
Assumptions: Part II,"
*Philosophy of Science***37**, 223-238. - Zangari, M. 1994. "A New Twist in the Conventionality of
Simultaneity Debate,"
*Philosophy of Science***61**, 267-275.

aij@pitt.edu

*First published: August 31, 1998*

*Content last modified: July 23, 2002*