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Notes to Being and Becoming in Modern Physics

1. As translated in Wheelwright (1960). The quote by Parmenides in what follows is also from this volume.

2. Many recent papers on these issues are collected in Oaklander and Smith (1994). Gale (1967) has some good older papers and a useful bibliography.

3. There are many excellent non-technical introductions to the special theory. Two fine books that are currently available are Mermin (1968) and Born (1962). A more demanding introduction mathematically is Taylor and Wheeler (1963). An excellent philosophical discussion is Chapter IV of Friedman (1983).

All the concepts needed for the present discussion are outlined briefly in the opening paragraphs of section 4 of Shimony (1993), but there is no substitute for working through in detail at least one presentation of the special theory at whatever level of mathematical sophistication one is equipped to handle.

4. While most popular presentations of special relativity explicitly employ only these two assumptions, Friedman (1983) points out that another assumption of a more technical nature, the flatness of Minkowski spacetime, is needed in order to derive all the characteristic results of the theory. We will ignore this refinement here.

One should note, however, that the two assumptions explicitly made
are assumptions concerning *invariance*--the invariance of the
speed of light and the laws of physics. That certain other quantities
classically thought to be invariant turn out not to be so in special
relativity has sometimes obscured the fact that there is a
fundamental invariant special relativisic four-dimensional quantity
called *the spacetime interval* that will enter our
considerations in due course.

5. Hans Reichenbach indicated the same view in 1925. See Grünbaum (1973, p. 318).

6. Whether this suggested distinction overlaps or is independent of the distinction between tensed and tenseless uses of ‘is’ invoked above in the section on Newtonian Spacetime is an open question. Questions about the viability of this distinction are connected to deep questions in ontology and philosophy of language on which Carnap, Quine, and Sellars differed. See the discussion in Jay Rosenberg's entry in this Encyclopedia, Wilfrid Sellars.

7. Minkowski
spacetime is a *time orientable* manifold. If one chooses one
of the two lobes of the light cone at a point **O** to
be, say, future, that choice can be extended smoothly throughout the
whole of the spacetime. We say nothing as to how this choice is to
be made in this entry, but we assume that it has been, somehow,
made.

8. The three are free to
choose **O** as the origin of each of their coordinate
systems and to assign it spatial coordinate (0,0,0) and temporal
coordinate 0. But what position and time values are assigned by each
of them to other spacetime points now follows rigorously from the
rules, the Lorentz transformations, of special relativity.

9. It is the fact the
Rietdijk-Putnam-Penrose argument for the fixity of the future does
not rely on features of natural laws or causation that leads me to
call the thesis chronogeometric *fatalism* rather than
chronogeometric *determinism.* Determinist and fatalist
arguments have the same conclusion, that the future is somehow fixed
and not within our control, but the former do so from causal or
nomological considerations while the later do not.

10. Briefly, *Rxy*
iff (*y* < *x* or *y* << *x*).
Clifton and Hogarth (1995) point out the relation betwen *x*
and each point in (but not on) its past light cone also satisfies
all the criteria of adequacy specified in the text.

11. This result is implicit in the proofs offered by Stein and by Clifton and Hogarth. It is made explicitly in Callender (2000).

Steven Savitt

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*First published: July 11, 2001*

*Content last modified: July 11, 2001*