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Ancient Skepticism

Used in its most specific sense, the expression "ancient skepticism" refers to two movements in ancient philosophy. One is Pyrrhonism, which claims Pyrrho of Elis (4th-3rd c. B.C.) as its founder but was especially prominent during and after the 1st c. B.C. The other is Academic Skepticism, which encompasses a skeptical phase in the history of Plato's Academy (3rd to early 1st c. B.C.).

Used more broadly and more loosely, the term "skepticism" is sometimes used in conjunction with a great many ancient thinkers who are not tied to these two movements, but are characterized by significant skeptical inclinations. The most important of these are Protagoras and Socrates, but one might also include Gorgias, Democritus, Aristippus and Diogenes of Sinope (the "Cynic"). While the views of these figures are sometimes mentioned in the present article, it focuses on the narrow notion of "ancient skepticism" and the figures and schools that it encompasses.

An Overview

Following Sextus Empiricus, we can say that the ancient "skeptic" (from a Greek verb meaning "to examine carefully") was an "investigator." He was someone who investigated the questions of philosophy but "suspended judgment" because he was unable to resolve the contrary attitudes, opinions and arguments that characterized the debated topics of philosophy, hence unable to arrive at a definitive position of his own on any of them. Instead of adhering to some standard philosophical position, the skeptic therefore described himself as someone who continues to investigate -- a "zetetic."

Sextus (end 2nd c. A.D.) describes Pyrrhonian skepticism's relationship to other ancient philosophies in the opening passage of his Outlines of Pyrrhonism (PH).

When people search for something, the likely outcome is that either they find it or, not finding it, they accept that it cannot be found, or they continue to search. So also in the case of what is sought in philosophy, I think, some people have claimed to have found the truth, others have asserted that it cannot be apprehended, and others are still searching. Those who think that they have found it are the Dogmatists, properly so called -- for example, the followers of Aristotle and Epicurus, the Stoics, and certain others. The followers of Clitomachus and Carneades, as well as other Academics, have asserted that it cannot be apprehended. The Skeptics [skeptikoi] continue to search [i.e., investigate]. (PH 1.1-3, Mates)
Two aspects of these remarks warrant special comment. One is Sextus' suggestion that the Pyrrhonian leaves open the possibility of apprehending truth. While consistency forces him to speak this way -- for continuing to investigate makes no sense unless it might conceivably lead to the discovery of some definitive solution to the problems investigated -- one might reasonably wonder whether the ancient skeptic was genuinely open to this possibility. Certainly it must be said that the Pyrrhonian stance one finds in Sextus is an overwhelmingly negative one which functions primarily as a negative critique of any attempt to establish truth.

Sextus' comments on Carneades, Clitomachus and other Academic skeptics are also controversial. His suggestion that they maintain that truth cannot be apprehended (which might imply that they inconsistently maintain they have apprehended that this is true) is most plausibly interpreted as an attempt to drive a wedge between Pyrrhonism and what at Sextus' time was recognized as a competing school of skepticism. In the present context, it is enough to say that these Academics would be skeptics in the sense in which we use the term even if they did adopt the negative dogmatism which Sextus ascribes to them, for it still constitutes a comprehensive rejection of any claim to have apprehended what is true.

The conviction (or deep-seated suspicion) that philosophical claims to apprehend some truth are inherently uncertain is, therefore, the heart of ancient skepticism. The ancient skeptics propounded and defended this conviction by opposing any and all positions with contrary positions, each of which is said to demonstrate the other's uncertainty. Sextus describes the "method of antithesis" this implies when he explains later Pyrrhonism's practice of epoche (suspending judgment):

Broadly speaking, this [suspension of judgement about all things] comes about because of the setting of things in opposition. We oppose either appearances to appearances, or ideas to ideas, or appearances to ideas. We oppose appearances to appearances when we say "The same tower seems round from a distance but square from near by." We oppose ideas to ideas when someone establishes the existence of providence from the orderliness of the things in the heavens and we oppose to this the frequency with which the good fare badly and the bad prosper, thereby deducing the non-existence of providence. We oppose ideas to appearances in the way in which Anaxagoras opposed to snow's being white the consideration: snow is water, and water is black, therefore snow is black too. On a different scheme, we oppose sometimes present things to present things, but sometimes present things to past and future things... (PH 1.31-5, Long & Sedley)
Diogenes Laertius (1st half of 3rd c. A.D.) associates a similar method of antithesis with Academic skepticism when he writes that Arcesilaus (mid-3rd c. B.C.) "was the originator of the Middle Academy, being the first to suspend his assertions owing to the contrarieties of arguments, and the first to argue pro and contra" (4.28-44, Long & Sedley). The most famous of the Academic skeptics, Carneades (mid-2nd c. B.C.), is reported to have demonstrated his ability to argue for opposing views on a famous trip to Rome, where he is said to have argued impressively for justice on one day and on the next to have argued with equal force against it (Lactantius, Div. Ins., 5.16, 6.6). Judging by Cicero's account in De Finibus, the attitude of opposition which this reflects played an integral role in lessons in the skeptical Academy, where the teacher proceeded by opposing a thesis enunciated by a student (e.g., "The Chief Good in my opinion is pleasure"). In a more technical way, antithesis is evident in the Academics' argument against the Stoics' "cataleptic" impressions, which paired alleged examples of such impressions with equally forceful, but indistinguishable impressions which are false.

We might recognize the emphasis on opposition and antithesis which characterized ancient skepticism by describing it as a rejection of our ability to apprehend truth which was founded on the attempt to oppose other philosophies, both by opposing their arguments and positions, and by devising general strategies of opposition.

The Historical Context

It is sometimes said that skeptical doubts characterize times of social upheaval (not only in ancient times but also in the fourteenth century and in contemporary philosophy). Whether these kinds of considerations can help explain the rise of ancient skepticism is very difficult to say, in part because the role which social influences play in determining any philosophical position is inherently complex and obscure. In view of this, it can best be said that ancient skepticism is a natural extension of many of the trends and movements that characterize mainstream ancient philosophy.

Skepticism's affinity to other ancient philosophies is most evident in the kinds of considerations that convince the skeptic that he should suspend judgment on the truth of any philosophical claim. For though skeptical conclusions (that on given issues the truth is uncertain) are at odds with the "dogmatist" philosophies the skeptics criticize, these philosophies were frequently founded on a similar concern with opposition, antithesis, and opposing points of view. One might, for example, easily compare the Pyrrhonian conviction that there are equally convincing arguments for and against any claim to the Protagorean conviction that one can argue convincingly on both sides of any question. This similarity reflects similar philosophical concerns even though Protagoras' conclusion (at least as it is reported by Plato in the Theaetetus) that opposing points of view are true is diametrically at odds with the skeptic's rejection of all claims to truth.

The situation is similar in many other cases. Opposing points of view played an important role in the development of Greek atomism, which can be seen as an attempt to explain such opposition by hypothesizing atoms which impact on different kinds of bodies in different kinds of ways. Opposites which include opposing points of view are also emphasized in Heracleitean and Platonic metaphysics. Even Aristotle recognized the possibility of arguing for conflicting points of view in his work on rhetoric.

In other cases, ancient philosophers anticipated skepticism by stressing the difficulties inherent in the search for truth. Xenophanes was known for his claim that no one can know clear truth. Democritus maintained that "bastard" knowledge gained through our senses exists only by convention. Plato rejected everyday opinions, comparing them to shadows in a cave. Diogenes of Sinope, Epictetus and similar moralists dismiss philosophical speculation on the grounds that practical demonstration is what matters. Such philosophers did not endorse a full fledged skepticism, but their views clearly added impetus to the skeptics' moves in this direction.

Much more generally, ancient skepticism flourished in an intellectual climate which was naturally conducive to skeptical conclusions. In marked contrast with modern science, ancient science did not, for example, boast the kinds of practical and theoretical successes we now take for granted. In part because of this, a bewildering array of opposing philosophical perspectives characterized ancient philosophical inquiry and important philosophers were famous for their ability to construct dazzling arguments for paradoxical conclusions (that motion is impossible, that nothing exists, that time is an illusion, etc.). An interest in foreign cultures drew attention to opposing customs and traditions, mysticism and irrationalism flourished as powerful cultural forces, and opposing interests and perspectives were manifest in war, political rivalries and a religion and mythology which pitted god against god, man against man and even god against man. In the midst of the opposing views that this implies, it cannot be judged surprising that radical skepticism in a variety of forms became a prominent philosophical perspective.

Pyrrho and Equanimity

The movements that make up ancient skepticism begin with Pyrrho (ca. 365-ca. 275 B.C.). In marked contrast to modern skeptics, he proposed skepticism as a way of life which functioned as a route to equanimity and contentment. He left no writings, and except for what has survived of his pupil Timon's exegetical writings ancient reports about him are heavily colored by anachronism drawn from the philosophical outlook of the Pyrrhonian "revival" in the 1st c. B.C. (see below, "The Arguments for Later Pyrrhonism"). Sextus is, for example, noticeably reticent when he declares that "Pyrrho appears to us to have applied himself to Skepticism [i.e. Pyrrhonian skepticism as Sextus knew it] more thoroughly and more conspicuously than his predecessors" (PH1.7, Bury). We find a less hedged view of Pyrrho and his views in the following fragment of Aristocles (Peripatetic of uncertain date, perhaps 1st c. B.C.-A.D., perhaps 2nd c. A.D.).
He [Pyrrho] himself has left nothing in writing, but this pupil Timon says that whoever wants to be happy must consider these three questions: first, how are things by nature? Secondly, what attitude should we adopt towards them? Thirdly, what will be the outcome for those who have such an attitude? According to Timon, Pyrrho declared that things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable. For this reason neither our sensations nor our opinions tell us truths or falsehoods. Therefore for this reason we should not put our trust in them one bit, but should be unopinionated, uncommitted and unwavering, saying concerning each individual thing that it no more is than is not, or both is and is not, or neither is nor is not. The outcome for those who actually adopt this attitude, says Timon, will be first speechlessness [aphasia], and then freedom from disturbance; and Aenesidemus says pleasure. (Eusebius, Prep. Ev. 14.18.2-5, Long & Sedley)
According to Diogenes Laertius (9.76), Timon explained Pyrrho's formula ou mallon ("no more is than is not") as a way of expressing a decision to suspend judgment and determine nothing. The practical result of the indifference to opinions and sensations which results is Pyrrho's "peace of mind" (D.L. 9.65).

The Life of Pyrrho which Diogenes Laertius includes in his Lives of Eminent Philosophers suggests that Pyrrho lived a life in accord with his own emphasis on equanimity and indifference. Among other things, he lived like a recluse, did not "so much as frown" when treated with disinfectants, surgery and cautery, voluntarily adopted a life of piety and poverty, and performed menial tasks to show his indifference. According to one anecdote, he was criticized when he failed to maintain his composure when a cur rushed at him and terrified him (Pyrrho answered that it is difficult to strip oneself of human nature). The citizens of his native Elis rewarded him with honors, making him a high priest, raising a statue in his honor (Pausanias 6.24.5), on his account passing a law which exempted philosophers from taxes (D.L. 9.64).

Flintoff locates the origins of Pyrrho's philosophy in India, where Pyrrho travelled with the court of Alexander the Great and was in this way exposed to Indian ascetics and their commitment to an enlightened state of mind. Certainly it is likely that Pyrrho was impressed with the indifference of India's gymno-sophists (the "Naked Philosophers"). This much being granted, it can still be said that his skepticism has Greek origins which are plausibly located in Democritean atomism.

Looked at from the point of view of earlier Greek philosophy, Pyrrho's skepticism is a natural evolution of Democritus' doubts about ordinary opinions, which Democritus rejected as purely "conventional" on the grounds that they are contradictory and truth resides in atoms and the void. It is in keeping with this that Pyrrho's teacher is the Democritean Anaxarchus (whom he followed to India); his formula ou mallon is borrowed from atomism (DeLacy); his goal of equanimity reflects Democritean practical ideals; and he is said to have admired Democritus above all others (D.L. 9.67). But Pyrrho takes skeptical inclinations one step further than Democritus and rejects atomism as well ordinary opinions, in the process giving up on philosophy and on all attempts to establish what is true (D.L. 9.69,65; cf. Sextus, PH 1.28-29; AM [Adversus Mathematicos] 11.1). As Aristocles puts it, "if we are so constituted that we know nothing, then there is no need to continue enquiry into other things.... Pyrrho of Elis was ... a powerful spokesman of such a position" (Eusebius, 14.18.1-2, Long & Sedley).

Sextus describes Pyrrhonism's ties to equanimity (ataraxia) with an anecdote which probably relates events which occurred during Pyrrho's time with Alexander's court. It tells how Apelles, Alexander's court painter, was frustrated by his inability to paint the froth on a horse's mouth and in exasperation threw a sponge at his painting, accidentally producing the effect he wanted. "So, too, the Skeptics were hoping to achieve ataraxia by resolving the anomaly of phenomena and noumena, and, being unable to do this, they suspended judgment. But then, by chance as it were, when they were suspending judgment the ataraxia followed, as a shadow follows the body." (PH 1.29, Mates)

Apparently, equanimity accompanies skepticism "like a shadow" for two reasons. First, because it eliminates the anxiety that accompanied the study of philosophy in the hope of arriving at an apprehension of the truth about reality and what is good and bad in human life. Second, it promotes indifference to the misfortunes and calamities that disturb our peace of mind, for the skeptic concludes that misfortunes and calamities can't be known to be bad. In the context of his actual life, Pyrrho probably maintained his attitude of calm composure by using the method of antithesis outlined in the following fragment of Democritus:

[In order to achieve cheerfulness]... one must keep one's mind on what is attainable, and be content with what one has, paying little heed to things envied and admired, and not dwelling on them in one's mind. Rather must you consider the lives of those in distress, reflecting on their intense sufferings, in order that your own possessions and condition may seem great and enviable, and you may, by ceasing to desire more, cease to suffer in your soul... One must... [compare] one's own life with that of those in worse cases, and must consider oneself fortunate, reflecting on their sufferings, on being so much better off than they. If you keep to this way of thinking, you will live more serenely (fr. 191, cf. fr. 3; Kirk, Raven and Schofield).
The exercises here proposed allow one to be content by continually opposing one's misfortunes with comparisons that make one seem well off. The relativity of value judgments -- a natural component of skepticism -- can in this way provide a psychological basis for peace of mind. As the old saw goes, "I was upset about my lack of shoes until I met a man with no feet."

Pyrrho's own use of such tactics is implied by the report that he was fond of Homer's lines (Il. 21.106-7): "Ay friend, die thou; why thus thy fate deplore? Patroclus, thy better, is no more" -- lines that combat upset with one's own fate with the thought that one does not deserve anything better, since the great warrior Patroclus has suffered the same. Oppositions of this sort are probably implied when it is said that Pyrrho "talked to himself" when he trained himself to be good (D.L. 9.64, cf. 69). The same method and ideals are reflected in an incident in which his teacher Anaxarchus cures Alexander's despondency after he has killed a friend (Plutarch, Alex., 52), and in Anaxarchus' own fame as "the happy one," which is in part founded on (or perhaps the basis for) the story that he was unflappable even when he sufferred a horrible death at the hands of the tyrant Nicocreon (D.L. 9.59-60).


Pyrrho's philosophy raises a number of issues which reverbate throughout the history of skepticism. Questions about the consistency of the skeptical perspective are particularly significant. As Aristocles says, "in admonishing us to have no opinion, they [the skeptics] at the same time bid us to form an opinion, and in saying that men ought to make no statement they make a statement themselves: and though they require you to agree with no one, they command you to believe themselves..." (Eus. Prep. Ev. 14.18, Gifford).

Other commentators ask how Pyrrho survived the pitfalls of day to day life -- much less achieved supreme contentment -- if he refused to believe the truth of his sense impressions. According to one ancient report, this was a practical as well as a theoretical issue, for Pyrrho accepted skepticism "in his actual way of life, avoiding nothing and taking no precautions, facing everything as it came, wagons, precipices, dogs, and entrusting nothing whatsoever to his sensations. But he was looked after... by his disciples, who accompanied him" (D.L. 9.62, Long & Sedley).

Though the consistency of skepticism is open to debate, not much is to be made of this account of Pyrrho's actions, which can be grouped with many other unbelievable stories which Diogenes Laertius reports -- that Pythagoras descended into Hades, that Apollo appeared to Plato's father, that Zeno of Elea (and, again, Aristarchus) bit off his tongue and spat it at a tyrant who was persecuting him, and so on. Laertius has a penchant for such stories and is happy to stretch himself to include them -- in this case he does so by citing as his authority "those around" Antigonus of Carystus (3rd c. B.C. author of Lives of Philosophers), making this account of Pyrrho little more than a rumor.

As Hallie says, we can usefully contrast the claim that Pyrrho rejected the senses with Posidonius' account (1st c. B.C.) of his actions when he was caught in a wild storm at sea (D.L. 9.68). Confronted with other passengers wailing and cringing with horror, Pyrrho is said to have remained calm and pointed to a small pig which was calmly eating on the deck, saying that its attitude demonstrated the unperturbed state of the wise man. Even though Timon included "sensations" as well as "opinions" within the scope of Pyrrho's skepticism, this suggests that it is human fears and frailties, not sense impressions, which Pyrrho was concerned to expunge by skeptical inquiry.

It can still be asked how Pyrrho could consistently embrace his senses and his skeptical conclusions. Timon answers that the Pyrrhonian guides himself by "appearances" (phainomena -- what "appears to be the case"). This suggests that Pyrrho rejected claims to truth and viewed his skepticism and his day to day beliefs as a mere acceptance of appearances that stops short of claims to truth. As Diogenes Laertius puts it:

...the dogmatists say that they [the skeptics] abolish life, in the sense that they throw out everything that goes to make up a life. But the skeptics say that these charges are false. For they do not abolish, say, sight, but only hold that we are ignorant of its explanation.... We do sense that fire burns, but we suspend judgement as to whether it is fire's nature to burn.... "We only object," they say, "to the non-evident things added on to the phenomena [the appearances].... For this reason, Timon in his Pytho says that he has not diverged from what is customary. And in his Likenesses he says, "But the apparent utterly dominates wherever it goes." And in his work On the Senses he says, "That honey is sweet I do not posit; that it appears so I concede." (D.L. 9.104-5, Inwood & Gerson)
Such claims suggest that we should interpret early Pyrrhonian claims -- and even Pyrrho's claim that things "are" indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable -- as claims about what appears to be the case. Whether such moves can, in the end, save the skeptic from the charge of inconsistency is a matter of much debate (for two sides of this debate, see Frede and Burnyeat).

Arcesilaus in the Academy

Pyrrho's impact on his immediate contemporaries seems quite limited. Timon is his only student of repute and ancient skepticism's next phase is not Pyrrhonian but Academic. No doubt the Academy became a school of skepticism by exploiting the skeptical aspects of Plato's philosophical writings -- Socrates' heroic skepticism in the early dialogues; the questioning of the forms in the Parmenides; Plato's pessimism about "ordinary" knowledge; and the indeterminate nature of his dialogues which are intrinsically open to many interpretations. Cicero, who defends a late version of Academic skepticism, says Plato is a skeptic because he is always arguing pro and contra, states nothing positively, inquires into everything, and makes no certain statements (Ac 1.46).

The first of the Academic skeptics is Arcesilaus (316/315-242/241 B.C.), the head of what Diogenes Laertius calls the "Middle" Academy. He was influenced by Plato, Pyrrho and Diodorus Cronus (a dialectician of impressive skill). Ariston (3rd c. Stoic philosopher) described him as "Plato in front, Pyrrho behind, Diodorus in the middle" (D.L. 4.33). According to Sextus, his skepticism is "virtually identical" with Pyrrhonism (PH 1.232). While Arcesilaus was no ascetic (see, e.g., D.L. 4.37-42), he still held that skepticism aims at happiness (AM 7.158) and some of the anecdotes we find in Plutarch suggest that he, like Pyrrho, believed we should deal with misfortune and unhappiness by finding opposing ways of looking at trying situations (see "On Controlling Anger," 461E and "On Tranquillity of Mind," 470A-B).

Arcesilaus' arguments focus primarily on Stoic epistemology. According to Couissin, he has no views of his own on the epistemological topics he disputes with the Stoics, and offers his arguments merely as a reductio ad absurdum of the Stoic point of view. It is difficult (perhaps impossible) to judge whether this is so in the context of scanty evidence almost 2000 years later, especially as it is never easy to tell how a philosopher intends a particular argument or position (Caton has even argued that Descartes is not committed to the cogito in the Meditations).

However one interprets it, the crux of Arcesilaus' attack on Stoic epistemology is his attack on the "cataleptic" impression (the kataleptike phantasia). According to the Stoics, such an impression is clear and distinct and -- in virtue of its clearness and distinctness -- reveals certain truth. As such, it becomes the criterion or foundational guarantee of truth. According to Arcesilaus, there is no such impression (and no impression can be a guarantee of truth), for any allegedly cataleptic impression can be paired with an impression which is equally clear and distinct but nonetheless mistaken -- because it is experienced in dreaming, hallucinating, etc. (Ac. 2.77; AM 7.252).

According to Sextus, Arcesilaus combines his skeptical arguments with a commitment to "the reasonable" (the eulogon) which he propounds as a practical criterion in day to day affairs.

... since it was necessary ... to inquire into the conduct of life which naturally cannot be directed without a criterion, upon which happiness too, that is, the goal of life depends for its reliability, Arcesilaus says that he who suspends judgment about everything regulates choices and avoidances and, generally, actions by reasonableness, and, proceeding according to this criterion, will act correctly. For happiness arises because of prudence, and prudence resides in correct actions, and a correct action is that which, having been done, has a reasonable defence. Therefore, he who adheres to reasonableness will act correctly and will be happy. (AM 7.158, Inwood & Gerson)
Those who, like Couissin, see Arcesilaus as a purely negative dialectician do not believe that he actually endorsed such views, at any rate not on the basis of an independent examination of the issues (as against what would reasonably follow from Stoic assumptions). Sextus, however, does not frame his report of Arcesilaus' views in this way, and seems to claim that the use of the "reasonable" as a criterion of choice was Arcesilaus' own philosophical position, which he proposed as an alternative to a reliance on the Stoics' "cataleptic impression." In any case, some such commitment makes good philosophical sense (see Hankinson, 86-91), especially in a historical context in which philosophy is expected to provide a practical guide to life.

One might, of course, still debate whether Arcesilaus' skepticism was consistent with an acceptance of the "reasonable" or, much more fundamentally, the actions which daily life requires (for one might argue that eating, drinking, moving, etc. require beliefs that skepticism undermines). That this was a heated issue already in ancient times is evident in Plutarch's Against Colotes (2nd c. A.D.), which takes Colotes (3rd c. B.C.) to task for his attack on Arcesilaus and other philosophers in a book entitled On the fact that the doctrines of the other philosophers make it impossible even to live. Colotes' book also attacked Democritus, Aristotle, Parmenides, and Socrates -- indeed, virtually everyone but his mentor, Epicurus -- so he was not concerned especially with Arcesilaus. But Plutarch includes a notable defense of Arcesilaus in his response. It argues that the soul has three movements: sensation, impulse, and assent, and that Arcesilaus allows us to accept sensation and impulse so long as we stop short of assent and opinion (Mor. 1122C-D). According to an angry Plutarch, it follows that Arcesilaus' views in this way provide a basis for action and get from Colotes the kind of unappreciative attention that a performance on the lyre gets from an ass (Mor. 1122B).

Carneades in the Academy

After Arcesilaus, the leadership of the Academy passed to Lacydes, to Telecles and Evander, and then to Hegesinus. Little is known about their views, but it seems that they preserved Arcesilaus' skepticism. The next phase in the history of ancient skepticism begins with Carneades (214/213-129/128 B.C.), who Diogenes Laertius describes as the head of the "New" Academy. Though he wrote nothing, he appears to have been a remarkably successful philosopher. So much so that Numenius (2nd c. A.D. Platonist) says, in a fragment in Eusebius (a 3rd-4th c. A.D. Christian bishop), that he was victorious on every issue. According to Diogenes Laertius, he became so famous attacking Stoic arguments that he said, "if Chrysippus had not existed neither would I," mimicking the Stoic maxim, "if Chrysippus had not existed, neither would the Stoa" (D.L. 4.62, cf. 7.183).

One finds an account of two of Carneades' central arguments against the "criterion" of knowledge (including especially the Stoic "cataleptic impression") in Sextus' work, "Against the Logicians" (AM7.159-165). According to Sextus' account, they were addressed against all of Carneades' (dogmatic) predecessors. The first maintained that there can be no criterion of certain truth because reason, the senses, and any other supposed criterion can play us false. The second argued that the impressions (or "presentations") that inform our judgments are not purely objective, but reflect also their own subjective nature -- as light shows both itself and the things it illuminates. It appears that the subjectivity of impressions which this second argument emphasizes was underscored by an appeal to the by now standard argument that any impression which appears true can be paired with (and opposed by) an indistinguishably similar impression which is false.

Though Carneades' cleverness in argument (rather than the moral austerity we associate with Pyrrho) is the most notable feature of extant evidence about him, Cicero implies that he used antithesis to promote equanimity when he says that Carneades criticized Chrysippus for approving of a passage in which Euripides recounts the pain of life. According to Carneades, Chrysippus was promoting depression whereas the passage should instead be used to bring comfort to the ill-disposed by reciting the misfortunes of others (Tusc. Disp. 3.59-60). A similar concern with equanimity is evident in Carneades' claim that we should oppose the expected with the unexpected -- health with the possibility of sickness, safety with the possibility of accident, etc. -- because the unexpected causes us grief when it catches us off guard (Plutarch, Tranq. 474F-75A). In a famous speech Carneades demonstrated how to use opposing arguments as a means of promoting peace of mind by arguing, for the sake of Clitomachus in the wake of the destruction of his native Carthage, that the wise man is not distressed even at the loss of his native city (Cicero, Tusc. Disp. 3.54).

Despite his arguments against all criteria of certain truth, Eusebius says that Carneades did not suspend judgment on all matters (Prep. Ev. 14.7.15), but distinguished between things that are "non-evident" (non-apparent) and those that are "non-apprehensible." According to this account, he held that everything is non-apprehensible but that some things are not non-evident. It is tempting to compare this alleged commitment to "evident" things with the Pyrrhonian commitment to appearances, but this is difficult given that Carneades (unlike the Pyrrhonians) is said to rank different kinds of impressions as more and less persuasive.

In "Against the Logicians," Sextus, in conjunction with his report of Carneades' attacks on the Stoic theory of cataleptic impressions, says that Carneades adopted the pithanon (the "plausible") as a practical criterion and distinguished between impressions which are: (i) implausible; (ii) plausible (i.e. appear true "to an intense degree"); (iii) irreversible (i.e. plausible and confirmed by other impressions); and (iv) tested (i.e. irreversible and tested by the scrutiny of surrounding circumstances). One might argue that this is an improvement on Stoic epistemology, insofar as it suggests that they should propose as their criterion, not the merely "clear and distinct" impressions, but those that are irreversible, and tested as well. According to Sextus' account of Carneades' views, he added some further sophistication to his criterion of choice by holding that different levels of plausibility are appropriate in different kinds of circumstances. While he proposed plausible impressions as a guide in matters of no importance, for example, he is said to hold that weighty matters call for impressions which are irreversible and tested (AM 7.184).

Sextus illustrates Carneadean plausibility with an illuminating example:

On seeing a coil of rope in an unlighted room a man jumps over it, conceiving it for the moment to be a snake [i.e. judging this to be plausible], but turning back afterwards he inquires into the truth, and on finding it motionless he is already inclined to think that it is not a snake [for this impression seems reversible], but as he reckons, all the same, that snakes too are motionless at times when numbed by winter's frost, he prods at the coiled mass with a stick, and then, after thus testing the impression received, he assents to the fact that it is false to suppose that the body presented to him is a snake. (AM 7.187-88, Bury)

Judging by Sextus and some of our other ancient sources, Carneades tried to make the pithanon compatible with his skepticism by emphasizing that plausibility is inherently subjective and a criterion of choice but not a measure of objective probability or truth. Clitomachus thus writes that "The Academic school holds that there are dissimilarities between things of such a nature that some of them seem plausible and others the contrary; but this is not an adequate ground for saying that some things can be apprehended [or grasped as true] and others cannot, because many false objects are plausible..." (Cicero Ac. 2.103, Rackham, tr. altered; cf. 104 and AM 7.169). This makes Carneadean assent to something's plausibility consciously subjective and, in view of this, more constrained than the assent which seems to be implied by claims to truth.

Though Carneades may in this way have avoided claims to truth, his account of plausible and implausible impressions still drives an important wedge between his views and those of the Pyrrhonians, for the Pyrrhonians attempt to accept appearances with a minimum (one might say ascetic) inclination that seems incompatible with the conviction that some of the things assented to are highly plausible. As Sextus puts it, "[A]lthough both the [later] Academics and the Skeptics say that they are persuaded of certain things, here too the difference of the philosophies is very evident. For ‘to be persuaded’ has different senses: on the one hand, it means not to resist but simply to follow without much proclivity or strong pro feeling, as the child is said to be obedient to his teacher; but sometimes it means assent to something by choice and with a kind of sympathy due to strong desire, as when a profligate man is persuaded by one who approves of living extravagantly. Since, therefore, the followers of Carneades and Clitomachus say both that they are strongly persuaded and that things are strongly persuasive [i.e. plausible, pithanon], whereas we say that we simply make a concession without any strong feeling, we would differ from them in this respect, too." (PH 1.230, Mates). This difference highlights the much more significant role that ascetic indifference plays in Pyrrhonian -- as opposed to Carneadean -- skepticism.

Carneades as Dialectician

Some commentators on ancient skepticism argue that Carneades did not endorse the positive philosophy implied in the suggestion that we should follow the "plausible" impression, which Sextus seems to ascribe to him. According to this reading, Carneades proposed the plausible merely "for the sake of argument" -- to show that alternatives to dogmatic epistemology as a basis for living an active life are in principle possible (Striker's views in this regard are notable). On this interpretation, Carneades was a dialectician, and a skeptic only in the sense that he never committed himself to any of the premisses from which he argued, or to any of the conclusions he drew from them. It follows that he was not a full fledged skeptic, in the sense of one who believed that no certain knowledge was possible, or who (given that) advocated a skeptical way of life in dependence on mere "belief" in "plausible" ("irreversible," or "tested") impressions. On this view his achievement was not a skeptical philosophy but a dialectical ability to argue for (and primarily against) any point of view.

The issue is a thorny one, as any philosopher is likely to act as a dialectician at some time or other, and dialectical argument is an integral part of ordinary skepticism, which continually propounds particular points of view "for the sake of argument." Sextus is a case in point, for he spends very little time expounding his own philosophy and instead propounds a huge catalogue of arguments with conclusions to which he is not, in the final analysis, committed. If we had lost only a few pages of his extant works, we could easily have been left with texts which were completely dialectical.

In this context, it may be useful to consider Cicero, Academica 2.78, where Philo (of Larissa, Cicero's Academic teacher) and Metrodorus (a pupil of Carneades') are said to attribute to Carneades a skepticism which holds that the wise man cannot apprehend anything (grasp it as true) but may accept an opinion nonetheless. Cicero says he prefers the view of Clitomachus, who holds that Carneades "did not so much accept this view as advance it in argument." This clearly suggests that Carneades offered such a view only for dialectical purposes (as an account of what, given premisses they would accept, one should say about the "wise man" of the Stoics and other philosophers), but it provides limited evidence for the dialectical interpretation, for it does not show that this is Carneades' only mode of argument (cf. Hankinson, 94).

The most important textual evidence in favor of the dialectical interpretation is found at Academica 2.139, where Cicero says that Clitomachus used to declare that he had never been able to understand what Carneades did accept (see Striker, 55; Hankinson, 94; Inwood & Gerson, 165; Long & Sedley, Vol 1, 455). This is not the claim that Carneades was a dialectician, however, and it is compatible with the possibility that Clitomachus believed that Carneades accepted some claims, but he was not sure which. More importantly perhaps, Cicero's report is embedded in a discussion of the good, in which Carneades is said to have defended Calliphon's view that the good is pleasure with such zeal "that he was thought actually to accept it (although Clitomachus used to declare that he had never been able to understand what Carneades did accept)" (tr. Rackham). Taken in this context, the parenthetical comment about Clitomachus' view of Carneades can be interpreted as the claim that Clitomachus did not understand what Carneades held in this regard. It does not, therefore, provide definitive evidence for the claim that Carneades was a dialectician and did not have definite views of his own on disputed questions of philosophy.

The dialectical interpretation of Carneades does have the advantage that it saves Carneades from inconsistency (for if he has no positive philosophical views, he need not render anything he says in one argument consistent with what he may say in another), though this advantage gained in this regard is earned by turning Carneades' philosophy into a purely negative philosophy which provides no basis for action. One might therefore try to excuse Carneades from inconsistency without abandoning the claim that he is a skeptic (in the sense that he believes certain knowledge impossible), by emphasizing (as Sextus suggests) the qualified and subjective nature of the assent that he endorsed. So understood, his commitment to persuasiveness ("plausibility") and the assent that this implies is, in virtue of its subjectivity, an attempt to formulate a conception of belief which is compatible with a rejection of claims to objective truth.

The Arguments for Later Pyrrhonism

Carneades' successor as head of the Academy was Clitomachus (d. 110/9 B.C.), the author of exegetical writings (now lost) reporting and explaining Carneades' arguments and his skepticism -- writings referred to in Cicero's Academica. He was succeeded by Philo of Larissa (d. 84/3 B.C.). The latter taught, on the basis of Carneades' notion of "plausible" impressions, an epistemology which allowed one to adopt whatever position on a disputed philosophical question seemed to oneself most persuasive, after thorough examination of arguments on all sides -- provided that one carefully refrained from claiming to have established the truth on the matter in question with certainty. As we can see from his pupil Cicero's philosophical writings, this meant in practice the adoption (in this tentative spirit) of many Stoic positions.

The next important ancient skeptic was Aenesidemus, who defected from Philo's Academy and revived Pyrrhonism in the early years of the first century B.C. "The Academics," he said, "especially the ones now, sometimes agree with Stoic opinions and, to tell the truth, appear to be just Stoics in conflict with Stoics" (Photius, Bibl. 212, Inwood & Gerson). In response, his eight books of Pyrrhonian Arguments propounded the view that "the Pyrrhonist determines nothing, not even this, that he determines nothing" (ibid.). It is perhaps ironic that he himself is reported to have given up on Pyrrhonism, and to have finished his career as a Heracleitean, apparently on the grounds that skeptical antithesis should be seen as a road leading to the realization that reality is full of opposites (PH 1.210, compare AM 7.349, 9.336-67, 10.216, and Tertullian, De Anima 9.5, 14.5).

Though Aenesidemus' books on Pyrrhonism do not survive, they are summarized by Photius (9th c. A.D.), whose account suggests that they systematized Pyrrhonism by establishing standard argumentative strategies and collecting an array of arguments, puzzles and conundrums borrowed from the whole of Greek philosophy.

We know of later Pyrrhonism primarily through three surviving works of Sextus Empiricus (ca. 200 A.D.): The Outlines of Pyrrhonism; a second work Against the Dogmatists, consisting of "Against the Logicians" (2 books), "Against the Physicists" (2 books), and one book "Against the Ethicists;" and a third work called Against the Learned (Adversus Mathematicos), combining the latter five books with six further ones attacking the epistemological pretensions of mathematicians, grammarians, etc. The relations between these books are complex and not yet well explored (in Sextus 1997, Bett argues for a reading of Against the Ethicists which would make it propound a very different skepticism than the Outlines of Pyrrhonism).

Aenesidemus' most important arguments are the ten modes (or "tropes") which Sextus attributes to "the older skeptics" at PH 1.35-163. They create antitheses and promote epoche by contrasting:

(i) the opposing perceptions and views of the world which characterize different species: "For how could one say, with regard to touch [for example], that animals are similarly affected whether their surfaces consist of shell, flesh, needles, feathers or scales? And, as regards hearing, how could one say that perceptions are alike in animals with a very narrow auditory canal and in those with a very wide one, or in those with hairy ears and those with ears that are hairless... [P]erfume seems very pleasant to human beings but intolerable to dung beetles and bees, and the application of olive oil is beneficial to human beings but kills wasps and bees." (PH 1.50, 55, Mates)

(ii) the opposing perceptions and views of the world which characterize different individuals: "...the greatest indication of the vast and limitless difference in the intellect of human beings is the inconsistency of the various statements of the Dogmatists concerning what may be appropriately chosen, what avoided, and so on." (PH 1.85-86, Mates)

(iii) the opposing perceptions and views of the world which characterize different sense organs: "Pictures seem to the sense of sight to have concavities and convexities," for example, "but not to the touch," and "Let us imagine someone who from birth has ...lacked hearing and sight. He will start out believing in the existence of nothing visible or audible, but only of the three kinds of quality he can register. It is therefore a possibility that we too, having only our five senses, only register from the qualities belonging to the apple those which we are capable of registering. But it may be that there objectively exist other qualities" (PH 1.92, 96-7, Mates).

(iv) the opposing perceptions and views of the world which characterize different circumstances: "Thus, things affect us in dissimilar ways depending on whether we are in a natural or unnatural condition, as when people who are delirious or possessed by a god seem to hear spirits but we do not.... And the same water that seems to us to be lukewarm seems boiling hot when poured on an inflamed place.... Further, if someone says that an intermingling of certain humors produces, in persons who are in an unnatural condition, odd phantasiai [impressions] of the external objects, it must be replied that since healthy people, too, have intermingled humors, it is possible that the external objects are in nature such as they appear to those persons who are said to be in an unnatural state, but that these humors are making the external objects appear to the healthy in a natural people other than they are. (PH 1.101-2, Mates).

(v) the opposing perceptions and views of the world that characterize different positions and distances and places: for example, "lamplight appears dim in sunlight but bright in the dark. The same oar appears bent in water but straight when out of it" (PH 1.119, Mates).

(vi) the opposing perceptions and views of the world that characterize mixtures: "[W]e deduce that since no object strikes us entirely by itself, but along with something, it may perhaps be possible to say what the mixture compounded out of the external object and the thing perceived with it is like, but we would not be able to say what the external object is like by itself... The same sound appears one way when accompanied by a rarefied atmosphere, another way when accompanied by a dense atmosphere" (PH 1.124, 125, Mates).

(vii) the opposing perceptions and views of the world due to different quantities and structures: "[I]ndividual filings of a piece of silver appear black, but when united with the whole they affect us as white... And wine, when drunk in moderation, strengthens us, but when taken in excess, disables the body..." (PH 1.129, 131, Mates).

(viii) the opposing views possible because of the relativity of all things: "...since all things are relative, we will suspend judgment about what things exist absolutely and in nature... This has two senses. One is in relation to the judging subject [different subjects perceiving differently]... The other in relation to the conceptions perceived with it..." (PH 1.135, Mates).

(ix) the opposing perceptions and views of the world due to constancy or rarity of occurrence: "The sun is certainly a much more marvelous thing than a comet. But since we see the sun all the time but the comet only infrequently, we marvel at the comet so much as even to suppose it a divine portent, but we do nothing like that for the sun. If, however, we thought of the sun as appearing infrequently and setting infrequently, and as illuminating everything all at once and then suddenly being eclipsed, we sould find much to marvel at in the matter." (PH 1.141, Mates). And

(x) the opposing perceptions and views of what is right and wrong which characterize different ways of life, laws, myths and "dogmatic suppositions": "among the Persians sodomy is customary but among the Romans it is prohibited by law; and with us adultery is prohibited, but among the Massagetae it is by custom treated as a matter of indifference, as Eudoxus of Cnidos reports... and with us it is forbidden to have intercourse with one's mother, whereas with the Persians this sort of marriage is very much the custom. And among the Egyptians men marry their sisters, which for us is prohibited by law. (PH 1.152, Mates).

Later Pyrrhonian modes more clearly isolate the basic epistemological issues which are raised by the traditional ten modes. The five modes of Agrippa (date unknown; later than Aenesidemus), discussed at PH 1.164-77 (which are analyzed in detail by Barnes) promote the suspension of judgment by invoking:

-- disagreement, for among philosophers and ordinary people there is interminable disagreement;

-- regress ad infinitum, for the skeptic asks for a proof of a claim, a proof of the reliability of this proof, and so on ad infinitum;

-- relativity, for things are relative to both one's subjective nature and the concepts one employs in judging them;

-- hypothesis, for the skeptic does not allow us to take as our starting point something which is taken for granted;

-- circular reasoning, for the skeptic rejects proofs that are circular, as when sense impressions are used to establish the veracity of the senses.

The standard modes are reduced even further in a basic set of two modes propounded in the following section of the Outlines of Pyrrhonism (1.178-79). There it is argued that everything which is apprehended (as true) must be apprehended through itself or some other thing. But according to the Pyrrhonians, the first alternative is undermined by the "controversy among philosophers" and the second by a demand for justification which entails a regress ad infinitum which can be stopped only by claiming that something is apprehended as true in virtue of itself (a possibility undermined by the first mode).

The various sets of Pyrrhonian modes systematize ancient arguments against dogmatic philosophical positions, but we should not exaggerate the role they played in ancient skepticism. Judging by Sextus, they are usually backed -- and very frequently supplanted -- by an enormous catalogue of other, specific arguments which were used to argue for epoche on whatever topic happens to be at hand (space, time, the good, the gods, fate, the meaningfulness of standard conceptions of human nature, and so on and so forth). No encyclopedia article can fully convey the spirit of the seemingly endless assortment of claims and counter claims that Sextus is ready to marshal on any topic.

The Practical Criterion

In the midst of Sextus' attack on other philosophers, it is easy to forget that he, like Pyrrho, proposed skepticism as a way of life (an agoge). Its practical merits are said to include its alleged ability to undermine useless and unfounded speculation which is claimed to characterize dogmatist philosophy. Like Hume, the later Pyrrhonians in this way attempt to supplant philosophical speculation with mundane matters of practical concern. The spirit of this rejection is well captured at PH 2.241-44, where Sextus condemns the convoluted arguments and conundrums of ancient dialectic:
As regards sophisms the exposure of which is useful, the dialectician will not have a word to say, but will propound such arguments as these -- "If it is not so that you both have fair horns and have horns, you have horns; but it is not so that you have fair horns and have horns, therefore you have horns." "If a thing moves, it moves either in the spot where it is or where it is not; but it neither moves in the spot where it is (for it is at rest) nor in that where it is not (for how could a thing be active in a spot where it does not so much as exist?); therefore nothing moves." "Either the existent becomes or the non-existent; now the existent does not become (for it exists); nor yet does the non-existent (for the becoming is passive but the non-existent is not passive); therefore nothing becomes." "Snow is frozen water; but water is black; therefore snow is black."

And when he has made a collection of such trash he draws his eyebrows together, and expounds Dialectic and endeavours very solemnly to establish for us by syllogistic proofs that a thing becomes, a thing moves, snow is white, and we do not have horns, although it is probably sufficient to confront the trash with the plain facts, smashing up their positive affirmation by means of equally weighty contradictory evidence derived from the appearances. (PH 2.241-44, Bury, revised, cf. Timon's attitude reported in D.L. 9.111, 2.107)

Appealing to a precedent which was set by early Pyrrhonism, later Pyrrhonians propose that we replace philosophical attempts to establish what is true with an acceptance of appearances which provides a basis for ordinary actions and skeptical assertions. As Diogenes Laertius writes:

Aenesidemus too in the first book of his Pyrrhonian Arguments says that Pyrrho determines nothing dogmatically because of the existence of contradictory arguments, but rather follows appearances. He says the same thing in Against Wisdom and On Investigation. And Zeuxis, an associate of Aenesidemus, in On Twofold Arguments and Antiochus of Laodicea and Apellas in his Agrippa posit the phenomena alone. Therefore, according to the skeptics, the appearance is a criterion, as Aenesidemus too says. (D.L. 9.106, Inwood & Gerson)
According to Sextus, "when we question whether the external object is such as it appears, we grant that it does appear, and we are not raising a question about the appearance but rather about what is said about the appearance; this is different from raising a question about the appearance itself. For example, the honey appears to us to be sweet. This we grant, for we sense the sweetness... And even when we do present arguments in oppostion to the appearances, we do not put these forward with the intention of denying the appearances but by way of pointing out the precipitancy of the Dogmatists..." (PH 1.19, Mates).

The later Pyrrhonian commitment to appearances is consolidated in a "Practical Criterion" which was used to establish a "standard of action" which allows the Pyrrhonian to "perform some actions and abstain from others" while not adopting any beliefs in support of so choosing and acting.

Holding to the appearances, then, we live without beliefs but in accord with the ordinary regimen of life, since we cannot be wholly inactive. And this regimen of life seems to be fourfold: one part has to do with the guidance of nature (physis), another with the compulsion of the pathe [feelings, affections of the soul], another with the handing down of laws and customs, and a fourth with instruction in arts and crafts (techne). Nature's guidance is that by which we are naturally capable of sensation and thought; compulsion of the pathe is that by which hunger drives us to food and thirst makes us drink; the handing down of customs and laws is that by which we accept that piety in the conduct of life is good and impiety bad; and instruction in arts and crafts is that by which we are not inactive in whichever of these we acquire. (PH 1.23-4, Mates)

Like the early Pyrrhonians, the later Pyrrhonians claimed that skeptical arguments and the Pyrrhonian acceptance of appearances could provide the basis for a happy life characterized by peace of mind. As Diogenes Laertius puts it, "The skeptics say the goal is suspension of judgement, upon which freedom from anxiety follows like a shadow, as Timon and Aenesidemus and their followers put it." (D.L. 9.107, Inwood & Gerson, cf. PH 1.29). According to Sextus, the telos of skepticism is tranquillity of mind (ataraxia) and "moderate" feeling "in respect of things unavoidable." (PH 1.26)

We do not... take Sceptics to be undisturbed in every way -- we say that they are disturbed by things which are forced upon them; for we agree that at times they shiver and are thirsty and have other feelings of this kind. But in these cases ordinary people are afflicted by two sets of circumstances: by the feelings themselves, and no less by believing that these circumstances are bad by nature. Sceptics, who shed the additional opinion that each of these things is bad in its nature, come off more moderately even in these cases. (PH 1.29-30, Annas & Barnes)

Mates has criticized this aspect of Pyrrhonism, writing that "It is hard to find much plausibility in the general claim that the person who, on a given occasion, thinks ‘this appears to me to be very, very bad’ will be any less upset than if he thought ‘this is very, very bad’" (63). One might answer that the Pyrrhonian acceptance of appearances is more constrained than this suggests, for it takes place within the context of equally convincing arguments for and against the view that things are as they appear (the equal force of opposing arguments -- isostheneia -- thus plays a central role in Pyrrhonian thinking). In this way the Pyrrhonians purposely try to eliminate thoughts like "This appears very, very bad," trying to substitute in their place thoughts like "This appears bad, but I have equally convincing reasons for thinking it may not be so" (this is clearly manifest in Sextus' rejection of Carneadean plausibility). It is hard to say whether this suffices but the qualifications which Pyrrhonism thus introduces do in this way provide a more substantial psychological basis for the detached and distant "following" of appearances which is supposed to nurture Pyrrhonian equanimity.

Given the practical goals of Pyrrhonism, the psychological force of Pyrrhonian arguments is in some ways as important as their logical force, for it functioned as a way to constrain the extent of the Pyrrhonian's conviction when he followed his appearances. This highlights an important difference between ancient and modern skeptical arguments. For though the former were employed as logical devices that establish epistemological conclusions, they were also used as psychological tools which were designed to break down attachment to belief and in this way foster ataraxia. In explaining why the skeptic's collection of arguments includes some which are weak, Sextus therefore says that the skeptic uses arguments of different strengths "just as doctors have remedies of different strengths for bodily ailments and for those suffering excessively employs the strong ones and for those suffering mildly the mild ones" (PH 3.280, Inwood & Gerson).

The Logic of Ancient Skepticism

How radical is ancient skepticism?

Though Sextus makes much of the skeptic's open-minded attitude to the possibility of apprehending truth, it is clear that the arguments that he and other skeptics employed can be used to raise questions about any claim to have established certain truth. At one point Sextus says that the skeptic will not, for example, assent even if he can find no fault with a position. For "[W]hen someone propounds to us a theory which we are unable to refute, we say to him in reply ‘Just as, before the birth of the founder of the School to which you belong, the theory it holds was not as yet apparent as a sound theory... so likewise it is possible that the opposite theory to that which you now propound is... not yet apparent to us, so that we ought not as yet yield assent to this theory which at the moment seems to be valid.’" (PH 1.33-34, Bury)

The extent of the ancient skeptic's concerns is also evident in the modes of skepticism (and especially the later modes), which are universally applicable and can in principle be used to question all of our beliefs. Even the skeptics' constant appeals to other ancient philosophies allowed for far more radical doubt than we normally engage, for ancient philosophy contained many extreme points of view. An example is Gorgias' argument for the conclusions that nothing exists, that if it did we could not know so, and if we knew so we could not communicate it. In his work, Sextus takes a special interest in this argument (and preserves one version of our most important fragment) precisely because it raises radical doubts about all things. In a similar vein, we find him exploiting for skeptical ends the opinions of obscure thinkers like Xeniades of Corinth -- who, he says, maintained that every impression and opinion is false (AM 7.53, cf. 48: a disconcerting view but arguably no more so than the Protagorean view that every opinion is true).

Mates has underscored the radical nature of the questions that the ancient skeptics, emphasizing that Sextus will not even grant that we have coherent concepts of the external world, soul, body, sense impressions, etc. As he puts it in discussing the Sextus' attitude to the external world, "His own deep skepticism leaves him in a state of epoche, not only as to whether there are any such things as ‘external objects,’ but even as to whether these terms of the Dogmatists have any intelligible meaning at all." (55)

How relevant is ancient skepticism?

The fact that ancient skepticism raises radical questions about all opinions and beliefs does not prove that it is relevant to modern and contemporary philosophy. A positive answer to the question whether the questions raised by the skeptics remain relevant must instead be founded on a recognition that they raise doubts that are still taken seriously in mainstream philosophical inquiry.

In this regard it can be said that ancient skepticism contains many arguments which remain of central importance, even though these arguments are frequently obscured by foreign philosophical terminology and ancient ways of speaking. In view of this, many commentators have explored and demonstrated the significance of ancient skepticism in the context of modern philosophy (see, e.g., Popkin, Schmitt, Jardine, Groarke, Fosl). Though the ancient skeptics do not as clearly anticipate modern and contemporary responses to skeptical concerns (skepticism's apparent tie to liberal political concerns, for example), it can be said that they achieved a very clear understanding of the basic epistemological issues raised by the attempt to build a rational basis for belief. The problem of the criterion and the later modes in particular ask pointed questions about our ability to establish a basis for justified belief which still resonate with us today.

One answer to skepticism which appears unique to contemporary philosophy is the suggestion that it can in some way be linguistically dissolved. Wittgenstein, Putnam and many others thus argue that skeptical claims in some way violate the norms that govern meaningful language and in view of this can be rejected as nonsensical. In ancient times, Aristocles wrote that skepticism is inconsistent with the assumption that the skeptic understands language (Eus., Prep. Ev. 14.18) but there is no close analogue of this linguistic answer to skepticism within ancient thought. How serious an omission this is depends on whether one believes that attempts to undermine skepticism in this way are plausible or successful (for a negative assessment, see Mates, 68-85).

Is ancient skepticism consistent?

Arguably the most significant question which needs to be asked about skepticism is a recurring feature of the skeptical/anti-skeptical debate. It is the question whether ancient skepticism is consistent. Or is it untenable because inconsistent? More specifically, we might ask how the skeptic's suspension of judgment allows him to come to the conclusion that we have no certain knowledge, or that certain knowledge is unattainable. Judging by the extant evidence we have, the skeptics themselves answered that their views are consistent because they accept skepticism in some "undogmatic" way which does not contradict their rejection of claims to truth (see Frede) -- by endorsing appearances, the eulogon, the pithanon, the Pyrrhonian practical criterion, and so on.

This is not the place for a detailed discussion of such issues, but one cautionary comment is in order. It is in this regard important to remember that the ancient skeptical attack on truth assumes a particular conception of truth. Burnyeat in particular emphasizes that this ancient conception is thoroughly "realist." It suggests that a claim is true if it corresponds to a real objective world that is not subjective, but exists, as we might now put it, from "a god's eye point of view." As Burnyeat writes:

In the controversy between the skeptic and the dogmatists over whether any truth exists at all, the issue is whether any proposition of a class of propositions can be accepted as true of a real objective world as distinct from mere appearance. For "true" in these discussions means "true of a real objective world"; the true, if there is such a thing is what conforms with the real, an association traditional to the word alethes since the earliest period of Greek philosophy (cf. AM XI 221).

Now clearly, if truth is restricted to matters pertaining to real existence, as contrasted with appearance, the same will apply [to related skeptical conceptions]... The notions involved, consistency and conflict, undecidability, isostheneia, epoche, ataraxia, since they are defined in terms of truth, will all relate, via truth to real existence rather than appearance. (Burnyeat, "Can the Sceptic Live His Scepticism," p. 121)

Burnyeat's point should play a central role in contemporary attempts to assess ancient skepticism, for it makes such skepticism an attack on realist truth which has affinities to modern and contemporary anti-realism. In the context of questions about consistency, it provides a possible answer to the charge that the skeptics were inconsistent. For in attempting to understand the skeptics, we must recognize that belief, at least in contemporary philosophical parlance, need not mean "accepting something as true" in the realist sense. It follows that the ancient skeptic's decision to suspend judgment on claims to (realist) truth in principle leaves room for anti-realist forms of belief and assent which are now commonplace in epistemological discussion. Rather than eschew all belief (i.e. belief in our sense), this suggests that the ancient skeptic rejects a particular kind of belief to which contemporary epistemology offers a variety of alternatives (founded on coherence accounts of truth, etc.). Unlike the contemporary anti-realist, the ancient skeptic retained a realist conception of "truth" and "belief" and therefore expressed his position as the rejection of belief and the adoption of a weaker following of appearances, subjective impressions, and so on. This difference notwithstanding, the move away from realist conceptions of belief is similar in both cases.

The extent to which the analogy between ancient skepticism and contemporary anti-realism can be carried is open to debate, but it is an important comparison, for it suggests both that skepticism is not fatally inconsistent (for it rejects realist truth and endorses an anti-realist conception of belief) and that the positive account of belief that it proposes is, like many of its arguments against claims to truth, relevant to modern and contemporary philosophical concerns.


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Copyright © 1997, 1998 by
Leo Groarke
Wilfrid Laurier University

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First published: November 4, 1997
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