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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Set Theory


Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory

Axioms of ZF

Extensionality:
xy[z(zx zy) x=y]
This axiom asserts that when sets x and y have the same members, they are the same set.

The next axiom asserts the existence of the empty set:

Null Set:
xy(y x)
Since it is provable from this axiom and the previous axiom that there is a unique such set, we may introduce the notation ‘Ø’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts that if given any set x and y, there exists a pair set of x and y, i.e., a set which has only x and y as members:

Pairs:
xyzw(wz w=x w=y)
Since it is provable that there is a unique pair set for each given x and y, we introduce the notation ‘{x,y}’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts that for any given set x, there is a set y which has as members all of the members of all of the members of x:

Unions:
xyz[zy w(wx & zw)]
Since it is provable that there is a unique ‘union’ of any set x, we introduce the notation ‘x’ to denote it.

The next axiom asserts that for any set x, there is a set y which contains as members all those sets whose members are also elements of x, i.e., y contains all of the subsets of x:

Power Set:
xyz[zy w(wz wx)]
Since every set provably has a unique `power set', we introduce the notation ‘(x)’ to denote it. Note also that we may define the notion x is a subset of y (‘x y’) as: z(zx  zy). Then we may simplify the statement of the Power Set Axiom as follows:
xyz[zy zx)

The next axiom asserts the existence of an infinite set, i.e., a set with an infinite number of members:

Infinity:
xx  &  y(yx {y,{y}}x)]
We may think of this as follows. Let us define the union of x and y (‘xy’) as the union of the pair set of x and y, i.e., as {x,y}. Then the Axiom of Infinity asserts that there is a set x which contains Ø as a member and which is such that, anytime y is a member of x, then y{y} is a member of x. Consequently, this axiom guarantees the existence of a set of the following form:
{Ø,   {Ø},   {Ø, {Ø}},   {Ø, {Ø}, {Ø, {Ø}}},   … }
Notice that the second element, {Ø}, is in this set because (1) the fact that Ø is in the set implies that Ø {Ø} is in the set and (2) Ø {Ø} just is {Ø}. Similarly, the third element, {Ø, {Ø}}, is in this set because (1) the fact that {Ø} is in the set implies that {Ø} {{Ø}} is in the set and (2) {Ø} {{Ø}} just is {Ø, {Ø}}. And so forth.

The next axiom asserts that every set is ‘well-founded’:

Regularity:
x[xØ y(yx & z(zx zy))]
A member y of a set x with this property is called a ‘minimal’ element. This axiom rules out the existence of circular chains of sets (e.g., such as xy & yz & and zx) as well as infinitely descending chains of sets (such as … x3  x2  x1  x0).

The final axiom of ZF is the Replacement Schema. Suppose that (x,y,) is a formula with x and y free, and which may or may not have free variables z1,…,zk. Furthermore, let x,y, [s,r,] be the result of substituting s and r for x and y, respectively, in (x,y,). The every instance of the following schema is an axiom:

Replacement Schema:
z1zk[x!y(x,y,) uvr(rv s(su & x,y,[s,r,]))]
In other words, if we know that is a functional formula (which relates each set x to a unique set y), then if we are given a set u, we can form a new set v as follows: collect all of the sets to which the members of u are uniquely related by .

Note that the Replacement Schema can take you ‘out of’ the set u when forming the set v. The elements of v need not be elements of u. By contrast, the well-known Separation Schema of Zermelo yields new sets consisting only of those elements of a given set u which satisfy a certain condition . That is, suppose that (x,) has x free and may or may not have z1,…,zk free. Then the Separation Schema asserts:

Separation Schema z1zk[uvr(rv ru & x,[r,])]
In other words, if given a formula and a set u, there exists a set v which has as members precisely the members of u which satisfy the formula .

Copyright © 2002 by
Thomas Jech
jech@math.cas.cz

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First published: July 10, 2002
Content last modified: July 10, 2002