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Notes to Russell's Paradox

1. Exactly when the discovery of the paradox took place is not completely clear. Russell initially states that he came across the paradox "in June 1901" (see Russell 1944, p. 13). Later he reports that the discovery took place "in the spring of 1901" (see Russell 1959, p. 58). Later still he reports that he came across the paradox, not in June, but in May of that year (see Russell 1967/1968/1969, volume 3 (1969), p. 221).

2. See Frege 1903, p. 127.

3. It is worth noting that even prior to Russell's discovery this principle had not been universally accepted. Georg Cantor, for example, rejected it in favour of what was, in effect, a distinction between sets and classes, recognizing that some properties (such as the property of being an ordinal) produced collections that were too big to be sets, and that an assumption to the contrary would result in an inconsistent theory. (For further details see Menzel 1984, Moore 1982, and Hallett 1984.)

4. One exception is paraconsistent set theory. Paraconsistent set theory retains an unrestricted comprehension axiom but abandons classical logic, substituting a paraconsistent logic in its place. See the entries on paraconsistent logic and inconsistent mathematics in this Encyclopedia.

A. D. Irvine

*First published: June 29, 2002*

*Content last modified: June 29, 2002*