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Russell's Paradox

Russell's paradox is the most famous of the logical or set-theoretical paradoxes. The paradox arises within naive set theory by considering the set of all sets that are not members of themselves. Such a set appears to be a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself, hence the paradox.

Some sets, such as the set of all teacups, are not members of themselves. Other sets, such as the set of all non-teacups, are members of themselves. Call the set of all sets that are not members of themselves S. If S is a member of itself, then by definition it must not be a member of itself. Similarly, if S is not a member of itself, then by definition it must be a member of itself. Discovered by Bertrand Russell in 1901, the paradox has prompted much work in logic, set theory and the philosophy and foundations of mathematics.

History of the paradox

Russell appears to have discovered his paradox in May of 1901[1] while working on his Principles of Mathematics (1903). Cesare Burali-Forti, an assistant to Giuseppe Peano, had discovered a similar antinomy in 1897 when he noticed that since the set of ordinals is well-ordered, it, too, must have an ordinal. However, this ordinal must be both an element of the set of all ordinals and yet greater than every such element.

Russell wrote to Gottlob Frege with news of his paradox on June 16, 1902. The paradox was of significance to Frege's logical work since, in effect, it showed that the axioms Frege was using to formalize his logic were inconsistent. Specifically, Frege's Rule V, which states that two sets are equal if and only if their corresponding functions coincide in values for all possible arguments, requires that an expression such as f(x) be considered both a function of the argument f and a function of the argument x. In effect, it was this ambiguity that allowed Russell to construct S in such a way that it could both be and not be a member of itself.

Russell's letter arrived just as the second volume of Frege's Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, 1893, 1903) was in press. Immediately appreciating the difficulty that the paradox posed, Frege hastily added an appendix to the Grundgesetze to discuss Russell's discovery. In this appendix Frege observes that the consequences of Russell's paradox are not immediately clear. For example, "Is it always permissible to speak of the extension of a concept, of a class? And if not, how do we recognize the exceptional cases? Can we always infer from the extension of one concept's coinciding with that of a second, that every object which falls under the first concept also falls under the second? These are questions," Frege notes, that have been "raised by Mr Russell's communication."[2]

Because of these kinds of worries, Frege eventually felt forced to abandon many of his views. Russell himself was also concerned about the paradox and so, like Frege, he hastily composed an appendix for his soon to be released Principles of Mathematics. Entitled "Appendix B: The Doctrine of Types", the appendix represents Russell's first attempt at developing a workable theory of types.

Significance of the paradox

The significance of Russell's paradox can be seen once it is realized that, using classical logic, all sentences follow from a contradiction. (For example, assuming both P and ~P, we can prove any arbitrary Q as follows: from P we can obtain P or Q by the rule of Addition, and then from P or Q and ~P we can obtain Q by the rule of Disjunctive Syllogism.) In the eyes of many, it therefore appeared that no mathematical proof could be trusted once it was discovered that the set theory underlying all of mathematics was contradictory.

Russell's paradox stems from the idea that any coherent condition may be used to determine a set. Attempts at resolving the paradox therefore typically have concentrated on various means of restricting the principles governing the existence of sets. Naive set theory contained the so-called unrestricted comprehension (or abstraction) axiom. This is an axiom to the effect that any predicate expression, P(x), containing x as a free variable will determine a set. The set's members will be exactly those objects that satisfy P(x), namely every x that is P.[3] It is now generally agreed that such an axiom must be either abandoned or modified.[4]

Russell's response to the paradox is contained in his so-called theory of types. His basic idea is that we can avoid reference to S (the set of all sets that are not members of themselves) by arranging all sentences into a hierarchy. This hierarchy will consist of sentences (at the lowest level) about individuals, sentences (at the next lowest level) about sets of individuals, sentences (at the next lowest level) about sets of sets of individuals, etc. It is then possible to refer to all objects for which a given condition (or predicate) holds only if they are all at the same level or of the same "type".

This solution depends upon the assumption, often called the vicious circle principle, that the meaning of a propositional function cannot be specified until one specifies the exact range of objects which are candidates for satisfying it. From this it follows that these objects cannot meaningfully include anything that is defined in terms of the function itself. The result is that propositional functions, and their corresponding propositions, will need to be arranged in a hierarchy of the kind Russell proposes.

Although Russell first introduced the idea of a theory of types in his Principles of Mathematics, type-theory found its mature expression five years later in his 1908 article "Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types" and in the monumental work he co-authored with Alfred North Whitehead, Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). In its details, Russell's type theory thus came to admit of two versions, the "simple theory" and the "ramified theory". Both versions have been criticized for being too ad hoc to eliminate the paradox successfully.

Other responses to the paradox include those of David Hilbert and the formalists (whose basic idea was to allow the use of only finite, well-defined and constructible objects, together with rules of inference that were deemed to be absolutely certain), and of Luitzen Brouwer and the intuitionists (whose basic idea was that one cannot assert the existence of a mathematical object unless one can also indicate how to go about constructing it).

Yet a fourth response to the paradox was Ernst Zermelo's 1908 axiomatization of set theory. Zermelo's axioms were designed to resolve Russell's paradox by restricting the naive comprehension principle. ZF, the axiomatization generally used today, is a modification of Zermelo's theory developed primarily by Abraham Fraenkel.

These four responses to the paradox have helped logicians develop an explicit awareness of the nature of formal systems and of the kinds of metalogical results that are today commonly associated with them.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Cantor, Georg | Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | logic: paraconsistent | mathematics: inconsistent | Peano, Giuseppe | Principia Mathematica | Russell, Bertrand | type theory | Whitehead, Alfred North


My thanks goes to Chris Menzel for his helpful feedback on an earlier version of this entry.

Copyright © 1995, 2002 by
A. D. Irvine

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First published: December 7, 1995
Content last modified: June 29, 2002