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This is equivalent to saying that if we do not have the distinction between what is "given" and what is "added by the mind," or that between the "contingent" (because influenced by what is given) and the necessary (because entirely "within" the mind and under its control), then we will not know what would count as a "rational reconstruction" of our knowledge. We will not know what epistemology's goal or method could be. (PMN 168-9)Epistemology, in Rorty's account, is wedded to a picture of mind's structure working on empirical content to produce in itself items--thoughts, representations--which, when things go well, correctly mirror reality. To loosen the grip of this picture on our thinking is to challenge the idea that epistemology--whether traditional Cartesian or 20th century linguistic--is the essence of philosophy. To this end, Rorty combines a reading of Quine's attack on a version of the structure-content distinction in "Two Dogmas of Empiricism" (1952), with a reading of Sellars' attack on the idea of givenness in "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind" (1956/1997). On Rorty's reading, though neither Sellars nor Quine is able fully to take in the liberating influence of the other, they are really attacking the same distinction, or set of distinctions. While Quine casts doubt on the notion of structure or meaning which linguistically-turned epistemology had instated in place of mental entities, Sellars, questioning the very idea of givenness, came at the distinction from the other side:
...Sellars and Quine invoke the same argument, one which bears equally against the given-versus-nongiven and the necessary-versus-contingent distinctions. The crucial premise of this argument is that we understand knowledge when we understand the social justification of belief, and thus have no need to view it as accuracy of representation. (PMN 170)The upshot of Quine's and Sellars' criticisms of the myths and dogmas of epistemology is, Rorty suggests, that "we see knowledge as a matter of conversation and of social practice, rather than as an attempt to mirror nature." (PMN 171) Rorty provides this view with a label: "Explaining rationality and epistemic authority by reference to what society lets us say, rather than the latter by the former, is the essence of what I shall call epistemological behaviorism, an attitude common to Dewey and Wittgenstein." (PMN 174)
Epistemological behaviorism leaves no room for the kind of practice-transcending legitimation that Rorty identifies as the defining aspiration of modern epistemology. Assuming that epistemic practices do, or at least can, diverge, it is not surprising that Rorty's commitment to epistemological behaviorism should lead to charges of relativism or subjectivism. Indeed, many who share Rorty's historicist scepticism toward the transcending ambitions of epistemology--friendly critics like Hilary Putnam, John McDowell and Daniel Dennett--balk at the idea that there are no constraints on knowledge save conversational ones. Yet this is a central part of Rorty's position, repeated and elaborated as recently as in TP. Indeed, he invokes it there precisely in order to deflect this sort of criticism. In "Hilary Putnam and the Relativist Menace," Rorty says:
In short, my strategy for escaping the self-referential difficulties into which "the Relativist" keeps getting himself is to move everything over from epistemology and metaphysics into cultural politics, from claims to knowledge and appeals to self-evidence to suggestions about what we should try. (TP 57)That epistemological behaviorism differs from traditional forms of relativism and subjectivism is easier to see in light of Rorty's criticism of the notion of representation, and the cluster of philosophical images which surround it.
The provocative and counterintuitive force of Rorty's treatment of rationality and science in terms of conversational ethics is undeniable. It is important to realize, though, that Rorty is not denying that there is any bona fide use of notions like truth, knowledge, or objectivity. Rather his point is that our ordinary uses of these notions always trade for their content and point on particular features of their varying contexts of application. His further point is that when we abstract away from these different contexts and practices, in search of general notions, we are left with pure abstract hypostatizations incapable of providing us with any guide to action at all. The upshot, Rorty holds, is that we simply do not have a concept of objective reality which can be invoked either to explain the success of some set of norms of warrant, or to justify some set of standards over against others. This is perhaps clearest in Rorty's treatment of the concept of truth. With regard to truth, Rorty's rhetoric and philosophical strategy has indeed shifted over the last three decades. As late as in 1982 (in CP) he still attempts to articulate his view of truth by drawing on William James's famous definition in terms of what is good in the way of belief. Soon after this, however, Rorty comes to doubt the point of any theory of truth, and, following Davidson's lead explicitly rejects all attempts to explicate the notion of truth in terms of other concepts. Rorty's mature view of of the point and significance of the concept of truth is first elaborated in "Davidson, Pragmatism and Truth," in ORT. Recent expressions are found in the first of the two Spinoza Lectures given at the University of Amsterdam in 1997, "Is it Desirable to Love truth?", in the paper, "Is Truth a Goal of Inquiry? Donald Davidson versus Crispin Wright" (TP), as well as in the introductions to, respectively, TP and PSH. In these writings Rorty argues that while "truth" has various important uses, it does not itself name a goal towards which we can strive, over and above warrant or justification. His argument is not that truth is reducible to warrant, but that the concept has no deep or substantive criterial content at all. That is, there are only semantic explanations to be offered for why it is the case that a given sentence is true just when its truth conditions are satisfied. So aiming for truth, as opposed to warrant, does not point to a possible line of action, just as we have no measure of our approximation to truth other than increasing warrant. Indeed, for Rorty, this is part of what makes the concept so useful, in a manner not coincidentally analogous with goodness; it ensures that no sentence can ever be analytically certified as true by virtue of its possession of some other property. Rorty's attitude to the concept of truth has been much criticized, often on the ground that the very notion of warrant, indeed the concept of belief in general, presupposes the notion of truth. However, it may be that we can do justice to these connections without supposing that the notion of truth thus involved backs up the notions of belief and warrant with any substantive normative content of its own. Indeed, that neither the concept of truth, nor those of objectivity and of reality, can be invoked to explain or legitimate our inferential practices and our standards of warrant, is the essence of Rorty's conversationalism, or epistemological behaviorism.
is to be the kind of antiessentialist who, like Dewey, sees no breaks in the hierarchy of increasingly complex adjustments to novel stimulation--the hierarchy which has amoeba adjusting themselves to changed water temperature at the bottom, bees dancing and chess players check-mating in the middle, and people fomenting scientific, artistic, and political revolutions at the top. (ORT 109)In Rorty's view, both Dewey's pragmatism and Darwinism encourage us to see vocabularies as tools, to be assessed in terms of the particular purposes they may serve. Our vocabularies, Rorty suggests, "have no more of a representational relation to an intrinsic nature of things than does the anteater's snout or the bowerbird's skill at weaving." (TP 48)
Pragmatic evaluation of various linguistically infused practices requires a degree of specificity. From Rorty's perspective, to suggest that we might evaluate vocabularies with respect to their ability to uncover the truth, would be like claiming to evaluate tools for their ability to help us get what we want--full stop. Is the hammer or the saw or the scissors better--in general? Questions about usefulness can only be answered, Rorty points out, once we give substance to our purposes.
Rorty's pragmatist appropriation of Darwin also defuses the significance of reduction. He rejects as representationalist the sort of naturalism that implies a program of nomological or conceptual reduction to terms at home in a basic science. Rorty's naturalism echoes Nietzsche's perspectivism; a descriptive vocabulary is useful insofar as the patterns it highlights are usefully attended to by creatures with needs and interests like ours. Darwinian naturalism, for Rorty, implies that there is no one privileged vocabulary whose purpose is to serve as a critical touchstone for our various descriptive practices.
For Rorty, then, any vocabulary, even that of evolutionary explanation, is a tool for a purpose, and therefore subject to teleological assessment. Typically, Rorty justifies his own commitment to Darwinian naturalism by suggesting that this vocabulary is suited to further the secularization and democratization of society that Rorty thinks we should aim for. Accordingly, there is a close tie between Rorty's construal of the naturalism he endorses and his most basic political convictions.
Rorty's romantic version of liberalism is expressed also in the distinction he draws between the private and the public. (CIS) This distinction is often misinterpreted to imply that certain domains of interaction or behaviour should be exempted from evaluation in moral or political or social terms. The distinction Rorty draws, however, has little to do with traditional attempts to draw lines of demarcation of this sort between a private and a public domain--to determine which aspects of our lives we do and which we don't have to answer for publically. Rorty's distinction, rather, goes to the purposes of theoretical vocabularies. We should, Rorty urges, be "content to treat the demands of self-creation and of human solidarity as equally valid, yet forever incommensurable." (CIS xv) Rorty's view is that we should treat vocabularies for deliberation about public goods and social and political arrangements, on the one hand, and vocabularies developed or created in pursuit of personal fulfilment, self-creation, and self-realization, on the other, as distinct tools.
...one consequence of antirepresentationalism is the recognition that no description of how things are from a God's-eye point of view, no skyhook provided by some contemporary or yet-to-be-developed science, is going to free us from the contingency of having been acculturated as we were. Our acculturation is what makes certain options live, or momentous, or forced, while leaving others dead, or trivial, or optional. (ORT 13)So the liberal ironist accepts that bourgeois liberalism has no universality other than the transient and unstable one which time, luck, and discursive effort might win for it. This view looks to many readers like a version of cultural relativism. True, Rorty does not say that what is true, what is good, and what is right is relative to some particular ethnos, and so in that sense he is no relativist. But the worry about relativism, that it leaves us with no rational way to adjudicate conflict, seems to apply equally to Rorty's ethnocentric view. Rorty's answer is to say that in one sense of "rational" that is true, but that in another sense it is not, and to recommend that we drop the former. Rorty's position is that we have no notion of rational warrant that exceeds, or transcends, or grounds, the norms that liberal intellectuals take to define thorough, open-minded, reflective discussion. It is chimerical, Rorty holds, to think that the force or attractiveness of these norms can be enhanced by argument that does not presuppose them. It is pointless, equally, to look for ways of convicting those who pay them no heed of irrationality. Persuasion across such fundamental differences is achieved, if at all, by concrete comparisons of particular alternatives, by elaborate description and redescription of the kinds of life to which different practices conduce.
However, critics are concerned not only with what they see as a misguided view of belief, truth, and knowledge, whether relativist, subjectivist, or idealist in nature. An important reason for the high temperature of much of the debate that Rorty has inspired is that he appears to some to rejects the very values that are the basis for any articulation of a philosophical view of truth and knowledge at all. Rorty is critical of the role of argument in intellectual progress, and dismissive of the very idea of theories of truth, knowledge, rationality, and the like. Philosophers such as Hilary Putnam and Susan Haack have increasingly focussed on this aspect of Rorty's views. Haack, in particular, frames criticism of Rorty along these lines in moral terms; to her mind, Rorty's efforts to abandon the basic concepts of traditional epistemology are symptoms of a vulgar cynicism, which contributes to the decline of reason and intellectual integrity that Haack and others find to be characteristic of much contemporary thought. The charge of intellectual irresponsibility is sometimes raised, or at last implied, in connection with Rorty's use of historical figures. Rorty's reading of Descartes and of Kant i PMN have often been challenged, as has his more constructive uses of Hegel, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein. The kind of appropriation of other writers and thinkers that Rorty performs will at times seem to do violence to the views and intentions of the protagonists. Rorty, however, is quite clear about the rhetorical point and scholarly limits of these kinds of redescriptions, as he explains in "The Historiography of Philosophy: Four Genres."
Rorty's least favourite pragmatist is Peirce, whom he regards as subject to both scheme-content dualism and to a degree of scientism. So it is not surprising that Haack, whose own pragmatism draws inspiration from Peirce, finds Rorty's recasting of pragmatism literally unworthy of the name. Rorty's key break with the pragmatists is a fundamental one; to Haack's mind, by situating himself in opposition to the epistemological orientation of modern philosophy, Rorty ends up dismissing the very project that gave direction to the works of the American pragmatists. While classical pragmatism is an attempt to understand and work out a novel legitimating framework for scientific enquiry, Haack maintains, Rorty's "pragmatism" (Haack consistently uses quotes) is simply an abandonment of the very attempt to learn more about the nature and adequacy conditions of enquiry. Instead of aiding us in our aspiration to be govern ourselves through rational thought, Rorty weakens our intellectual resilience and leaves us even more vulnerable to rhetorical seduction. To Haack and her sympathisers, Rorty's pragmatism is dangerous, performing an end-run on reason, and therefore on philosophy.
In the mid nineteen sixties, Rorty gained attention for his articulation of eliminative materialism (cf., "Mind-Body Identity, Privacy and Categories," 1965). Around that time, he also edited, and wrote a lengthy introduction to, a volume entitled The Linguistic Turn (1967, reissued with a new introduction in 1992). Though the introduction to the 1967 volume and the early papers in philosophy of mind show Rorty adopting frameworks for philosophical problems he has since dispensed with, these writings at the same time clearly bear the mark of the fundamental metaphilosophical attitude which becomes explicit in the next decade. In the "Preface" to PMN, referring to Hartshorne, McKeon, Carnap, Robert Brumbaugh, Carl Hempel, and Paul Weiss, Rorty says,
I was very fortunate in having these men as my teachers, but, for better or worse, I treated them all as saying the same thing: that a "philosophical problem" was a product of the unconscious adoption of a set of assumptions built into the vocabulary in which the problem was stated--assumptions which were to be questioned before the problem itself was taken seriously. (PMN xiii)This way of stating the lesson, however, appears to leave open the possibility that certain philosophical problems eventually may legitimately be taken seriously--that is, at face value in the sense that they require constructive solutions--provided the assumptions which sustain their formulation stand up to proper critical scrutiny. Taken this way, the attitude Rorty here expresses would be more or less the same as that of all those philosophers who have diagnosed their predecessors' work as mixtures of pseudo-questions and genuine problems dimly glimpsed, problems which now, with the proper frame of questioning fully clarified, may be productively addressed. But the full force of the lesson Rorty learned emerges only with the view that this notion of proper critical scrutiny is illusory. For Rorty, to legitimate the assumptions on which a philosophical problem is based, would be to establish that the terms we require to pose it are mandatory, that the vocabulary in which we encounter it is in principle inescapable. But Rorty's construal of the linguistic turn, as well as his proposals for eliminating the vocabulary of the mental, are really at odds with the idea that we might hope to construct a definitive vocabulary for philosophy. Even in his early days, Rorty's approach to philosophy is shaped by the historicist conviction that no vocabularies are inescapable in principle. This means that progress in philosophy is gained less from constructive solutions to problems than through therapeutic dissolution of their causes, that is, through the invention of new vocabularies by the launch of new and fruitful metaphors. (PMN "Introduction"; ORT "Unfamiliar Noises: Hesse and Davidson on Metaphor")
To hold that no vocabulary is final is also to hold that no vocabulary can be free of unthematized yet optional assumptions. Hence any effort to circumvent a philosophical problem by making such assumptions visible is subject to its own circumvention. Accordingly, the fact that Rorty often distances himself from the terms in which he earlier framed arguments and made diagnoses is in itself no reason to impose on him, as some have done, a temporal dichotomy. It may be that Rorty's early work, inspired by a less critical, less dialectical reading of Quine and Sellars than that offered in PMN, is more constructive than therapeutic in tone and jargon, and therefore from Rorty's later perspective in an important sense misguided. However, what ties together all Rorty's work, over time and across themes, is his complete lack of faith in the idea that there is an ideal vocabulary, one which contains all genuine discursive options. Rorty designates this faith Platonism (an important theme in CIS). That there are no inescapable forms of description is a thought which permeates Rorty's work from the 1960s right through his later therapeutic articulations of pragmatism. These characterizations of pragmatism in terms of anti-foundationalism (PMN), of anti-representationalism (ORT), of anti-essentialism (TP) are explicitly parasitic on constructive efforts in epistemology and metaphysics, and are intended to high-light the various ways that these efforts remain under the spell of a Platonic faith in ideal concepts and mandatory forms of descriptions.
Rorty's use of Quine and Sellars to make his fundamental points against the idea of philosophy as a knowledge legitimation project, as well as his articulation of his critique in terms of typically "analytical" philosophical problems, has contributed to an impression of PMN as an internal indictment of analytic philosophy as such. Many--some gleeful, some chagrined--have read PMN as a purported demonstration of the bankruptcy of one of the two contemporary main streams of Western philosophy. Such readers draw support for this view also from the fact that much of Rorty's writings since PMN has been concerned to show the virtues in thinkers like Heidegger and Derrida. (EHO) Twenty years later, however, it seems better not to superimpose the analytic-continental divide onto the message of PMN, or on Rorty. In PMN, his central point is that philosophy needs to break free from the metaphor of mind as a medium of appearances, appearances that philosophy must help us sort into the mere and the reality-corresponding ones. Rorty made this point in a vocabulary that was developed by Anglo-American (whether by birth, naturalization, or late adoption) philosophers in the course of the preceding half-century. It is not necessary, and probably misleading, to see Rorty's criticism of epistemology and the assumptions that make it appear worthwhile as a criticism of a particular philosophical style of philosophy or set of methodological habits. Reading PMN in conjunction with the essays in CP (see particularly essay 4, "Professionalized Philosophy and Transcendentalist Culture", essay 12, "Philosophy in America Today", and also "Introduction"), one quickly sees that the target of PMN cannot be a putative school or branch of the subject called "Analytic Philosophy". Because Rorty thinks philosophy has no essence, has no defining historical task, fails to mark out a special domain of knowledge, and is not, in short, a natural kind (CP 226), he leaves no ground from which to level that sort of critique. Nor is it his intention to do so. Around the time of the publication of PMN, Rorty's view of the matter was that "analytic philosophy" now has only a stylistic and sociological unity (CP 217). He then qualifies this point as follows: "In saying....[this], I am not suggesting that analytic philosophy is a bad thing, or is in bad shape. The analytic style is, I think, a good style. The esprit de corps among analytic philosophers is healthy and useful." (CP 217) However, while Rorty apparently bears no prejudice against analytic philosophy in particular, the very reason for his tolerance--his antiessentialist, historicist view of philosophy and its problems--has for many critics been a point of objection. After his faint praise, Rorty goes on:
All I am saying is that analytic philosophy has become, whether it likes it or not, the same sort of discipline as we find in the other "humanities" departments--departments where pretensions to "rigor" and to "scientific" status are less evident. The normal form of life in the humanities is the same as that in the arts and in belles-lettres; a genius does something new and interesting and persuasive, and his or her admirers begin to form a school or movement. (CP 217-218)This is perfectly consonant with the attitude to the notion of philosophical method Rorty expresses 20 years later: "So-called methods are simply descriptions of the activities engaged in by the enthusiastic imitators of one or another original mind--what Kuhn would call the "research programs" to which their works gave rise." (TP 10) Rorty's metaphilosophical critique, then, is directed not at particular techniques or styles or vocabularies, but toward the idea that philosophical problems are anything other than transient tensions in the dynamics of evolving, contingent vocabularies. If his critique has bite specifically against analytic philosophy, this may be because of a lingering faith in philosophical problems as lasting intellectual challenges that any honest thinker has to acknowledge, and which may be met by making progress in methodology. Rorty himself, however, nowhere says that this faith is part of the essence of analytical philosophy. On the contrary, it would seem that analytical philosophers, people like Sellars, Quine, and Davidson, have provided Rorty with indispensable critical tools in his attack on the epistemological legitimation-project which has been a central concern in philosophy since Descartes.
[PMN] Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1979. [CP] Consequences of Pragmatism. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982. [CIS] Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989. [ORT] Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991. [EHO] Essays on Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2. [EHO] Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991. [TP] Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998. [AC] Achieving Our Country: Leftist Thought in Twentieth Century America. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press,1998.
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First published: February 3, 2001
Content last modified: February 3, 2001